Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Feminist Perspectives on the Self

First published Mon Jun 28, 1999; substantive revision Wed Jan 7, 2004

The topic of the self has long been salient in feminist philosophy, for it is pivotal to questions about personhood, identity, the body, and agency that feminism must address. In some respects, Simone de Beauvoir's trenchant observation, “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—she is the Other,” sums up why the self is such an important issue for feminism. To be the Other is to be the non-subject, the non-person, the non-agent—in short, the mere body. In law, in customary practice, and in cultural stereotypes, women's selfhood has been systematically subordinated, diminished, and belittled, when it has not been outright denied. Since women have been cast as lesser forms of the masculine individual, the paradigm of the self that has gained ascendancy in U.S. popular culture and in Western philosophy is derived from the experience of the predominantly white and heterosexual, mostly economically advantaged men who have wielded social, economic, and political power and who have dominated the arts, literature, the media, and scholarship. Responding to this state of affairs, feminist philosophical work on the self has taken three main tacks: (1) critique of established views of the self, (2) reclamation of women's selfhood, and (3) reconceptualization of the self to incorporate women's experience. This entry will survey feminist perspectives on the self from all three of these angles.

1. Critique

Two views of the self have been prominent in contemporary Anglo-American moral and political philosophy—a Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus. Both of these conceptions see the individual as a free and rational chooser and actor—an autonomous agent. Nevertheless, they differ in their emphasis. The Kantian ethical subject uses reason to transcend cultural norms and to discover absolute moral truth, whereas homo economicus uses reason to rank desires in a coherent order and to figure out how to maximize desire satisfaction. Whether the self is identified with pure abstract reason or with the instrumental rationality of the marketplace, though, these conceptions of the self isolate the individual from personal relationships and larger social forces. For the Kantian ethical subject, emotional bonds and social conventions imperil objectivity and undermine commitment to duty. For homo economicus, it makes no difference what social forces shape one's desires provided they do not result from coercion or fraud, and one's ties to other people are to be factored into one's calculations and planning along with the rest of one's desires. Some feminist philosophers modify and defend these conceptions of the self. But their decontextualized individualism and their privileging of reason over other capacities trouble many feminist philosophers.

Twentieth century philosophy's regnant conceptions of the self minimize the personal and moral import of unchosen circumstances and interpersonal relationships. They eclipse family, friendship, passionate love, and community, and they downplay the difficulty of resolving conflicts that arise between these commitments and personal values and aspirations. Since dependency is dismissed as a defective form of selfhood, caregiving responsibilities vanish along with children, the disabled, and the frail elderly. Prevailing conceptions of the self ignore the multiple, sometimes fractious sources of social identity constituted by one's gender, sexual orientation, race, class, age, ethnicity, and so forth. Structural domination and subordination do not penetrate the “inner citadel” of selfhood. Likewise, these conceptions deny the complexity of the intrapsychic world of unconscious fantasies, fears, and desires, and they overlook the ways in which such materials intrude upon conscious life. The homogenized—you might say sterilized—rational subject is not prey to ambivalence, anxiety, obsession, prejudice, hatred, or violence. A disembodied mind, the body is peripheral—a source of desires for homo economicus to weigh and a distracting temptation for the Kantian ethical subject. Age, looks, sexuality, and physical competencies are extraneous to the self. As valuable as the capacities for rational analysis and free choice undoubtedly are, it is hard to believe that there is nothing more to the self.

Feminist philosophers have charged that these views are, at best, incomplete and, at worst, fundamentally misleading. Many feminist critiques take the question of who provides the paradigm for these conceptions as their point of departure. Who models this free, rational self? Although represented as genderless, sexless, raceless, ageless, and classless, feminists argue that the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus mask a white, healthy, youthfully middle-aged, middleclass, heterosexual MAN. He is pictured in two principle roles—as an impartial judge or legislator reflecting on principles and deliberating about policies and as a self-interested bargainer and contractor wheeling and dealing in the marketplace. It is no accident that politics and commerce are both domains from which women have historically been excluded. It is no accident either that the philosophers who originated these views of the self typically endorsed this exclusion. Deeming women emotional and unprincipled, these thinkers advocated confining women to the domestic sphere where their vices could be neutralized, even transformed into virtues, in the role of submissive wife and nurturant mother.

Feminist critics point out, furthermore, that this misogynist heritage cannot be remedied simply by condemning these traditional constraints and advocating equal rights for women, for these conceptions of the self are themselves gendered. In western culture, the mind and reason are coded masculine, whereas the body and emotion are coded feminine (Lloyd 1992). To identify the self with the rational mind is, then, to masculinize the self. If selfhood is not impossible for women, it is only because they resemble men in certain essential respects—they are not altogether devoid of rational will. Yet, feminine selves are necessarily deficient, for they only mimic and approximate the masculine ideal.

Problematic, as well, is the way in which these gendered conceptions of the self contribute to the valorization of the masculine and the stigmatization of the feminine. The masculine realm of rational selfhood is a realm of moral decency—principled respect for others and conscientious fidelity to duty—and of prudent good sense—adherence to shrewd, fulfilling, long-range life plans. However, femininity is associated with emotionally rooted concern for family and friends that spawns favoritism and compromises principles. Likewise, femininity is associated with immersion in unpredictable domestic exigencies that forever jeopardize the best-laid plans and often necessitate resorting to hasty retreats or charting new directions. By comparison, the masculinized self appears to be a sturdy fortress of integrity. How flattering! The self is essentially masculine, and the masculine self is essentially good and wise.

Feminists object that this philosophical consolidation of the preeminence of the masculine over the feminine rests on untenable assumptions about the transparency of the self, the immunity of the self to noxious social influences, and the reliability of reason as a corrective to distorted moral judgment. Today people grow up in social environments in which culturally normative prejudice persists, even in communities where overt forms of bigotry are strictly proscribed (Meyers 1994). Although official cultural norms uphold the values of equality and tolerance, cultures continue to transmit camouflaged messages of the inferiority of historically subordinated social groups through stereotypes and other imagery. These deeply ingrained schemas commonly structure attitudes, perception, and judgment despite the individual's conscious good will (Valian 1998). As a result, people often consider themselves objective and fair, and yet they systematically discriminate against “different” others while favoring members of their own social group (Piper 1990; Young 1990). Fortified by culture and ensconced in the unconscious, such prejudice cannot be dispelled through rational reflection alone (Meyers 1994). In effect, then, the Kantian moral subject countenances “innocent” wrongdoing and occluded reinforcement of the social stratification that privileges the minority of men whom this conception takes as paradigmatic.

These oversights necessitate reconceptualizing the self in two respects. To account for the residual potency of this form of prejudice, feminists urge, the self must be understood as socially situated and murkily heterogeneous. To account for the self's ability to discern and resist culturally normative prejudice, the moral subject must not be reduced to the capacity for reason.

Complementing this line of argument, a number of feminists argue that conceptualizing the self as a seamless whole has invidious social consequences. To realize this ideal, it is necessary to repress inner diversity and conflict and to police the boundaries of the purified self. Alien desires and impulses are consigned to the unconscious, but this unconscious material inevitably intrudes upon conscious life and influences people's attitudes and desires. In particular, the feared and despised Other within is projected onto “other” social groups, and hatred and contempt are redirected at these imagined enemies (Scheman 1993; Kristeva 1991). Misogyny and other forms of bigotry are thus borne of the demand that the self be unitary together with the impossibility of meeting this demand. Worse still, these irrational hatreds cannot be cured unless this demand is repudiated, but to repudiate this demand is to be resigned to a degraded, feminized self. Far from functioning as the guarantor of moral probity, the Kantian moral subject is the condition of the possibility of intractable animosity and injustice.

Another strand of feminist critique targets homo economicus's preoccupation with independence and planning. In an eery suspension of biological reality, selves are conceived as sufficient unto themselves. No one seems to be born and raised, for birth mothers and caregivers are driven offstage (Baier 1987; Code 1987; Held 1987; Benhabib 1987; Kittay 1999). The self appears to materialize on its own, endowed with a starter set of basic desires, ready to select additional desires and construct overarching goals, and skilled in performing instrumental rationality tasks. No one's powers ever seem to deteriorate either, for time is suspended along with biology. Since dependency is denied, no morally significant preconsensual or nonconsensual entanglements at the beginning or the end of life need be acknowledged. All affiliations are to be freely chosen, and all transactions are to be freely negotiated. The repudiation of feminine caregiving underwrites the illusion of independence, and the illusion of independence underwrites homo economicus's voluntarism.

To achieve maximal fulfillment, homo economicus must organize his chosen pursuits into a rational life plan. He must decide which desires are most urgent; he must ensure that his desires are co-satisfiable; and he must ascertain the most efficient way to satisfy this set of desires. Madcap spontaneity and seat-of-the-pants improvisation are registered as defeats for “The Man with the Plan.” Not only is this vision of a life governed by a self-chosen plan distinctly middleclass, it is gendered (Addelson 1994; Walker 1999). The mother coping with the vagaries of early childhood and the wife accommodating her man's plan are the antitheses of this conception of the self. Uncertain of where they are ultimately headed and seldom sure how to achieve the goals they embrace as they go along, these women violate norms of selfhood. Ironically, middleclass men who grow old also have difficulty measuring up to homo economicus's standards of control. Unable to count on continued health and vigor, unable to anticipate the onset of serious disease or disabling conditions, unable finally to outwit the grim reaper, affluent elderly men violate norms of selfhood along with women and the poor. The price of denying the relationality of the self and idolizing rational self-regulation is that full selfhood eludes all but a lucky, albeit transitory, male elite.

A further problem with this view from a feminist standpoint is that it fails to furnish an adequate account of internalized oppression and the process of overcoming it. It is common for women to comport themselves in a feminine fashion, to scale down their aspirations, and to embrace gender-compliant goals (Bartky 1990; Babbitt 1993). Feminists account for this phenomenon by explaining that women internalize patriarchal values and norms—that is, these pernicious values and norms become integrated in the cognitive, emotional, and conative structure of the self. Once embedded in a woman's psychic economy, internalized oppression conditions her desires. To maximize satisfaction of her desires, then, would be to collaborate in her own oppression. Paradoxically, the more completely she fulfills these desires, the worse off she becomes. Advantaged as he is, homo economicus can safely accept his desires as given and proceed without ado to orchestrate a plan to satisfy them. But women and members of other subordinated groups can ill-afford such complacency, and homo economicus's instrumental reason is too superficial a form of mastery to serve their interests (Babbitt 1993). They need a conception of the self that renders emancipatory transformation of one's values and projects intelligible.

Feminist critique exposes the partiality of the ostensibly universal Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus. These conceptions of the self are: 1) androcentric because they replicate masculine stereotypes and ideals; 2) sexist because they demean anything that smacks of the feminine; and 3) masculinist because they help to perpetuate male dominance. I leave the heterosexist, racist, ethnocentric, ableist, and classist dimensions of these conceptions to other encyclopedia articles.

2. Reclamation

Feminist critiques, we have seen, accuse regnant philosophical accounts of masculinizing the self. One corollary of this masculinized view of selfhood is that women are consigned to selflessness—that is, to invisibility, subservient passivity, and self-sacrificial altruism.

This nullification of women's selfhood was once explicitly codified in law. The legal doctrine of coverture held that a woman's personhood was absorbed into that of her husband when she married (McDonagh 1996). The wife's assuming her husband's surname symbolizes this revocation of her separate identity. In addition, coverture deprived the wife of her right to bodily integrity, for rape within marriage was not recognized as a crime, nor was it illegal for a husband to beat his wife. She lost her right to property, as well, for her husband was entitled to control her earnings, and she was barred from making contracts in her own name. Lacking the right to vote or to serve on juries, she was a second-class citizen whose enfranchised husband purportedly represented her politically.

Although coverture has been rescinded, vestiges of this denial of women's selfhood can be discerned in recent legal rulings, and the doctrine remains influential in culture. For example, pregnant women remain vulnerable to legally sanctioned violations of their right to bodily integrity. Courts have forced pregnant women to submit to invasive medical procedures for the sake of the fetuses they were carrying, although no court would compel any other woman or man to undergo comparable procedures for the sake of a living individual, including a family member (Bordo 1993). Selflessness remains the pregnant woman's legal status. Moreover, the stereotype of feminine selflessness still thrives in the popular imagination. Any self-confident, self-assertive woman is out of step with prevalent gender norms, and a mother who is not unstintingly devoted to her children is likely to be perceived as selfish and face severe social censure. Despite the fact that it is no longer legally mandatory for wives to give up their maiden names, many women adhere to this custom and perpetuate this traditional gesture of self-renunciation.

A tension within feminism complicates the project of reclaiming women's selfhood, however. The claim that women are systematically subordinated and that this subordination has a grievous impact on women's lives is central to feminism. Yet, this key insight seems to belie the claim that women's selfhood and agency have been overlooked. To be unjustly subordinated, it would seem, is to be diminished in one's selfhood and to have one's agency curtailed. Otherwise, what's the harm?

Some feminists have endorsed this very position. Arguing that moral virtues have no gender, Mary Wollstonecraft regards “feminine” virtues as perversions of true human virtues and laments women's conscription into a bogus ideal (Wollstonecraft 1792). Similarly but more vividly, Simone de Beauvoir labels women “mutilated” and “immanent” (Beauvoir 1952). Socialized to objectify themselves, women become narcissistic, small-minded, and dependent on others' approval. Excluded from careers, waiting to be chosen by their future husbands, taken over by natural forces during pregnancy, busy with tedious, repetitive housework, women never become transcendent agents. Indeed, they are content not to assume the burden of responsibility for their own freedom. Cast in the role of man's Other and at the mercy of feminine vices, women succumb to bad faith and surrender their agency.

This portrayal of women as abject victims has been challenged and modulated in contemporary feminist philosophy. I shall review four major reclamation strategies: 1) rethinking the activities of mothering, 2) developing an ethic of care, 3) exploring separatist practices, and 4) reconceiving autonomy.

The conventional view of pregnancy and birth classifies them as merely biological processes, and the conventional view of mothering classifies it as a merely instinctual activity. Feminists demonstrate that these assessments are sorely mistaken. Both pregnancy and birthgiving engage women's agentic powers. Not only does pregnancy raise the question of whether to have an abortion, but also a woman's decision to proceed with a pregnancy entails learning to care for herself in previously unnecessary ways (Held 1989). In the last few decades, medical technologies, such as sonography and fetal surgery, have raised new issues for pregnant women and sometimes confront them with wrenching choices that test their agentic resilience. Arguably, routine pregnancy and birthgiving mobilize specific agentic capacities, such as “active waiting” and coping with “chosen and predictable pain” (Ruddick 1994).

A related feminist innovation focuses on analyzing the discipline of mothering to grasp its aims, its forms of thought, its ideal form, and its characteristic values and disvalues (Ruddick 1989). Caring for a child imposes a set of demands—for preservation (survival), for growth (development into a healthy adult), and for acceptability (enculturation that ensures fitting into a community). Meeting these demands involves a range of activities that are governed by a distinctive set of values: protecting a fragile existence, acknowledging the limits of one's power and the unpredictability of events, cheerful determination to persist despite setbacks, responsive adaptability, sensitivity to the child's subjective viewpoint, and tolerance for inconclusive processes of disclosure. Although the practice of mothering places no premium on independence, self-interest, free choice, power, advance planning, or control, it clearly calls upon a wide range of interpersonal and reflective skills and enlists caregivers' agentic capacities. Dumb instinct hardly suffices for good childcare.

Like feminists who have reclaimed women's agency as mothers, feminists who have developed different versions of care ethics insist on taking women's experience seriously and use this experience as a basis for new approaches to morality and social policy. The aim of the psychological studies that first made the voice of care audible was to recognize and understand the capacities for moral judgment of women whose competency had been underrated. Previous research comparing boys' and girls' moral development had concluded that girls' development was stunted, but Carol Gilligan argues that this assessment misconstrued the data (Gilligan 1982). According to Gilligan, there are two paths of moral development. Many girls and women but almost no men follow the care trajectory (Gilligan 1987). Since earlier investigations first studied U.S. boys and men and used these interviews to generalize about people's moral development, researchers noticed only one path, namely, the justice trajectory. By repudiating the assumption that the masculine is the human norm and by studying girls and women, Gilligan discovered an alternative mode of moral cognition—the Care Perspective. Constituted by a distinctive set of framing concepts and a distinctive set of reflective skills, the morality of care is not translatable into the morality of justice that Gilligan's predecessors had taken to be the gauge of moral development. The Care Perspective, in Gilligan's view, is a different and equally good way to interpret moral situations and to decide how to act. Moreover, by noticing this alternative, we are able to recognize women's moral agency and defend women against the age-old charge that they are morally inferior to men.

Although some feminist philosophers criticize Gilligan's investigations on empirical or philosophical grounds (Moody-Adams 1991; Friedman 1993; Card 1996; Fraser and Nicholson 1990), her research prompted a number of feminist philosophers to develop moral theories marked by quite different emphases from those of traditional moral theories. The theme of human interconnectedness and the value of intersubjectivity are prominent in contemporary feminist moral philosophy. A climate of trust forms an indispensable background for all sorts of undertakings, but no voluntaristic ethic can account for trust (Baier 1986). The ability to empathize with other individuals and imaginatively reconstruct their unique subjective viewpoints is vital to moral insight and wise moral choice, but ethics that base moral judgment on a universal conception of the person marginalize this skill (Meyers 1994). By developing narratives of one's moral identity, one's relationships, and one's values and sharing those narratives with one's associates, one endows one's life with moral meaning and integrity, but rationalistic ethics overlook this process of self-disclosure and interpersonal mediation (Walker 1998). Taking responsibility for who one is and how one shall respond is a salient feature of informal personal relationships, yet justice oriented ethics focus exclusively on being held responsible for what one has done and the credit or blame one's actions may deserve (Card 1996). Appreciating the inevitability of dependency and the need for care demonstrates the poverty of conceiving justice exclusively in terms of rights not to be interfered with and the urgency of developing a theory of justice that includes provisions for care (Kittay 1999). In each instance, feminist moral theorists revalue that which is traditionally deemed feminine—feeling, intimacy, nurturance, and so forth. By highlighting these contexts and values, they reclaim the venues traditionally associated with women as morally significant sites, and they reclaim the moral agency of the individuals whose lives are centered in these sites.

A third approach to reclaiming women's agency spotlights several types of separatist practice—including friendship among women, lesbianism, support groups for rape victims and battered women, and women's consciousness raising and activist groups. Establishing and maintaining such affiliations presupposes self-willed defiance of norms of heterosexual fidelity and familial commitment. Thus, the very existence of these relationships testifies to women's awareness of their own needs and their capacity to act on them despite a repressive social context. Moreover, noting that unchosen relationships and communities of origin often prove oppressive to women and inimical to their agency, some feminists stress that it is important not to underestimate the role of chosen relationships and communities as sites of women's agency (Friedman 1993; Brison 1997; Hoagland 1988; Ferguson 1987; Frye 1983; MacKinnon 1982; Hartsock 1983). By cordoning off a social sphere of mutually attuned, mutually concerned women, separatism in all its forms turns down the racket of patriarchy. Separatist associations provide forums in which women can exchange personal confidences, secure in the knowledge that other participants will empathize with their dissatisfactions and frustrations as well as their joys and triumphs and that others will be receptive to their worries and complaints. Isolation often confounds women's subjectivity and agency, for in isolation their problems appear to be personal failings if not pathologies. Separatism overcomes isolation. It affords women the opportunity to develop language that makes sense of their anomalous experience and that restores their self-esteem together with the opportunity to reflect on the social meanings of their experience. Within separatist contexts, women find support for their resistance to social norms and their struggles to overcome personal privations or pressures.

Separatist practices relieve women of the burden of Otherness. Each woman is an equal among equals. Each woman's subjectivity and agency are affirmed. Thus, feminist philosophers seek not only to chronicle the ways in which women have created pockets of separatism within patriarchal systems but also to theorize the forms of subjectivity and agency that flourish in these sites.

Autonomy is a key issue for this theoretical project. Although some feminists dismiss autonomy as an androcentric relic of modernism (Jaggar 1983; Addelson 1994; Hekman 1995; Card 1996), others assert women's need for self-determination (de Lauretis 1986; King 1988; Lugones and Spelman 1983; Govier 1993). In light of the history of figuring women as driven by their reproductive biology and in need of rational male guidance and the history of women's enforced economic dependence on men or relegation to poorly paid, often despised forms of labor, feminists can hardly ignore the topic of self-determination. Thus, a number of feminist philosophers take up this challenge and present accounts of autonomy that do not devalue the interpersonal capacities and social contributions that are conventionally coded feminine (Nedelsky 1989; Meyers 1989 and 2000; Benhabib 1995 and 1999; Weir 1995). In feminist accounts, autonomy is not conflated with self-sufficiency and free will, but rather it is seen to be facilitated by supportive relationships and also to be a matter of degree.

Whereas standard philosophical accounts of autonomy confine their social critique to the observation that pluralistic societies that respect basic rights are more conducive to autonomy, feminist accounts point up how subordination constrains autonomy and how egalitarian communities augment it (Meyers 1989; Babbitt 1993; Benhabib 1995). Whereas standard philosophical accounts intellectualize autonomy and stress rational decision making, feminist accounts accent the role of feelings in autonomous lives (Nedelsky 1989; Meyers 1989; Weir 1995). Whereas standard philosophical accounts spotlight the autonomous individual's independence and immunity to others' influence, feminist accounts stress the autonomous individual's need for constructive feedback, advice, and encouragement (Meyers 1989; Brison 1997). Whereas standard philosophical accounts trace autonomy to endorsing and prioritizing a coherent set of desires and goals and to scheduling fulfillment of these objectives, feminist accounts view autonomy as an ongoing and improvisational process of exercising self-discovery, self-definition, and self-direction skills (Meyers 1989 and 2000). Whereas standard philosophical accounts see autonomy as an all-or-nothing achievement, feminist accounts note how autonomy skills piggyback on seemingly unrelated ancillary skills, how autonomy skills may be exercised in certain contexts yet deactivated in others, and how different degrees of skillfulness yield varying degrees of autonomy (Friedman 1993; Meyers 1989).

Feminist accounts of autonomy strike a balance between recognizing the injury that subordination does to women's sense of self and agency and respecting the measure of autonomy women gain despite this subjugation. Subordination endangers women's autonomy in a number of ways. Not only does internalized oppression mold women's desires and alienate them from themselves, but also those in subordinate positions are offered all sorts of incentives to minimize friction and ease their lot by placating those with power (Card 1996). Likewise, well-meaning friends are all too likely to counsel the course of least resistance, namely, compliance with convention regardless of one's personal values and aspirations. Another effect of systematic subordination is that women's autonomy skills may be poorly developed or poorly coordinated, and exercising these skills is rarely rewarded and generally discouraged (Meyers 1989). Deficient autonomy skills compound the threat internalized oppression poses.

Still, feminist accounts of autonomy enable us to understand why women do not completely lack autonomy and how women's autonomy can be augmented. The self-discovery, self-definition, and self-direction skills that secure autonomy are commonplace (Meyers 1989). Indeed, some of them,such as introspective attunement to feelings and receptiveness to others' feedback, are gender-compatible for and often promoted in women. Although others, such as rational planning and self-assertion, are coded masculine, many women in fact have considerable proficiency in these areas. All too often, however, they exercise these skills only in narrowly restricted, gender-appropriate contexts. For example, a homemaker may demonstrate remarkable instrumental reason skills in running her household, or a mother may exhibit effective self-assertion skills in dealing with a teacher who has mistreated her child. Yet, these women may come off as inept, helpless, and meek in other situations. Thus, augmenting women's autonomy is often a matter of emboldening women to extend the range of application of their existing autonomy skills and fostering the development of weak skills. It is evident, then, why separatist practices of various kinds are conducive to women's autonomy. By inviting women to marshall their autonomy skills and reinforcing women's determination to carry out their decisions, they function as autonomy workshops.

Still, from a feminist perspective, separatist practices are merely transitional and ameliorative. In addition, the patriarchal social structures that relentlessly undermine women's autonomy must be changed, and women's selfhood and agency must be legally and culturally affirmed. Thus, feminist philosophers defend a variety of social policy initiatives that expand the scope of women's choices and that respect women as self-directing individuals. Feminist philosophers have been in the forefront in arguing for egalitarian families, in legitimating economic opportunity for women, in opposing harassment of women in workplaces, in defending women's reproductive rights, and in condemning violence against women in all its forms. In each instance, greater justice for women strikes a blow against the masculinized self of traditional philosophy by securing greater social recognition for the female agentic self.

3. Reconceptualizations

3.1. The Nature of the Self

The primary task of a philosophy of the self is to clarify what makes something a self. Feminist philosophers are acutely aware that this is not a value-free task. To get an analysis of the nature of the self off the ground, one must decide which entities count as selves (or, at least, which entities are noncontroversially counted as selves within one's linguistic community). Since we regard selves as valuable—as members of our moral community and as worthy of respect—these judgments are in part judgments about which entities are valuable. Moreover, values enter into these judgments because we consider selves to be the sorts of things that can achieve (or fail to achieve) ideals of selfhood. Thus, philosophical accounts of the self have implications for conceptions of what it is to lead a good life. As we have seen, many feminist philosophers argue that it is a mistake to hold that rationality alone is essential to the self and that the ideal self is transparent, unified, coherent, and independent, for they discern misogynist subtexts in the atomistic individualism of the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus (see Section 1). It is incumbent on feminist philosophers, then, to develop more satisfactory accounts of the self—accounts that are compatible with respect for women. Thus, a number of feminist philosophers propose reconstructions of alternative theories of the nature of the self.

Three traditions have been especially influential in recent feminist thought—classic psychoanalysis, object relations theory, and poststructuralism. Feminist philosophers gravitate toward these approaches to understanding selfhood because they do not share the drawbacks that prompt feminist critique of the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus. None of these approaches regards the self as homogeneous or transparent; none supposes that a self should be coherent and speak in a single voice; none removes the self from its cultural or interpersonal setting; n one sidelines the body. In appropriating these views, feminists bring out their implications in regard to gender, incorporate feminist insights into these theories, and modify the theories to address feminist concerns.

Julia Kristeva transposes the classic Freudian conception of the self and the distinction between consciousness and the unconscious into an explicitly gendered discursive framework (Kristeva 1980). For Kristeva, the self is a subject of enunciation—a speaker who can use the pronoun ‘I’. But speakers are not unitary, nor are they fully in control of what they say because discourse is bifurcated. The symbolic dimension of language, which is characterized by referential signs and linear logic, corresponds to consciousness and control. The clear, dry prose of scientific research reports epitomizes symbolic discourse. The semiotic dimension of language, which is characterized by figurative language, cadences, and intonations, corresponds to the unruly, passion-fueled unconscious. The ambiguities and nonstandard usages of poetry epitomize semiotic discourse. These paradigms notwithstanding, Kristeva maintains that all discourse combines elements of both registers. Every intelligible utterance relies on semantic conventions, and every utterance has a tone, even if it is a dull monotone. This contention connects Kristeva's account to feminist concerns about gender and the self. Since the rational orderliness of the symbolic is culturally coded masculine while the affect-laden allure of the semiotic is culturally coded feminine, it follows that no discourse is purely masculine or purely feminine. The masculine symbolic and the feminine semiotic are equally indispensable to the speaking subject, whatever this individual's socially assigned gender may be. It is not possible, then, to be an unsulliedly masculine self or an unsulliedly feminine self. Every subject of enunciation—every self—amalgamates masculine and feminine discursive modalities.

Like the unconscious in classic psychoanalytic theory, the semiotic decenters the self. One may try to express one's thoughts in definite, straightforward language, yet because of the semiotic aspects of one's utterances, what one says carries no single meaning and is amenable to being interpreted in more than one way. In Kristeva's view, this is all to the good, for accessing the semiotic—that which is conveyed, often inadvertently, by the style of an utterance—kindles social critique. The semiotic gives expression to repressed, unconscious material. According to Kristeva, what society systematically represses provides clues to what is oppressive about society and how society needs to be changed. Thus, she discerns a vital ethical potential in the semiotic (Kristeva 1987). Since this ethical potential is explicitly linked to the feminine, moreover, Kristeva's account of the self displaces “masculine” adherence to principle as the prime mode of ethical agency and recognizes the urgent need for a “feminine” ethical approach. Viewing the self as a “questionable-subject-in-process”—a subject who is responsive to the encroachments of semiotic material into conscious life and who is therefore without a fixed or unitary identity—and valorizing the dissident potential of this decentered subjectivity, Kristeva seeks to neutralize the fear of the inchoate feminine that, in her view, underwrites misogyny. In one respect, Nancy Chodorow's appropriation of object relations theory parallels Kristeva's project of reclaiming and revaluing femininity, for Chodorow's account of the relational self reclaims and revalues feminine mothering capacities. But whereas Kristeva focuses on challenging the homogeneous self and the bright line between reason, on the one hand, and emotion and desire, on the other, Chodorow focuses on challenging the self-subsisting self with its sharp self-other boundaries. Chodorow's claim that the self is inextricable from interpersonal relationships calls into question the decontextualized individualism of the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus.

Chodorow sees the self as relational in several respects (Chodorow 1981). Every child is cared for by an adult or adults, and every individual is shaped for better or worse by this emotionally charged interaction. As a result of feelings of need and moments of frustration, the infant becomes differentiated from its primary caregiver and develops a sense of separate identity. Concomitantly, a distinctive personality emerges. By selectively internalizing and recombining elements of their experience with other people, children develop characteristic traits and dispositions. Moreover, Chodorow attributes the development of a key interpersonal capacity to nurturance. A caregiver who is experienced as warmly solicitous is internalized as a “good internal mother” (Chodorow 1980). Children gain a sense of their worthiness by internalizing the nurturance they receive and directing it toward themselves, and they learn to respect and respond to other people by internalizing their experience of nurturance and projecting it toward others. Whereas Kristeva understands the self as a dynamic interplay between the feminine semiotic and the masculine symbolic, Chodorow understands the self as fundamentally relational and thus linked to cultural norms of feminine interpersonal responsiveness. For Chodorow, the rigidly differentiated, compulsively rational, stubbornly independent self is a masculine defensive formation—a warped form of the relational self—that develops as a result of fathers' negligible involvement in childcare.

Feminist philosophers have noted strengths and weaknesses in both of these views. For example, Kristeva's questionable-subject-in-process seems to enshrine and endorse the very gender dichotomy that causes women so much grief. Yet, Chodorow's relational self seems to glorify weak individuation and scorn the independence and self-assertiveness that many women desperately need. Still, Kristeva's analyses of the psychic, social, and political potency of gender figurations underscore the need for feminist counter-imagery to offset culturally entrenched, patriarchal images of womanhood. And Chodorow's appreciation of the relational self together with her diagnosis of the damage wrought by hyperindividuation advances feminist demands for equitable parenting practices. These contributions notwithstanding, both of these views have come under attack for heterosexist biases as well as for inattention to other forms of difference among women.

Critical race theorists and poststructuralists have been particularly vocal about this failure to come to grips with the diversity of gender, and they have offered accounts of the self designed to accommodate difference. Poststructuralist Judith Butler maintains that personal identity—the sense that there are answers to the questions ‘who am I?’ and ‘what am I like?’—is an illusion (Butler 1990). The self is merely an unstable discursive node—a shifting confluence of multiple discursive currents—and sexed/gendered identity is merely a “corporeal style”—the imitation and repeated enactment of ubiquitous norms. For Butler, psychodynamic accounts of the self, including Kristeva's and Chodorow's, camouflage the performative nature of the self and collaborate in the cultural conspiracy that maintains the illusion that one has an emotionally anchored, interior identity that is derived from one's biological nature, which is manifest in one's genitalia. Such accounts are pernicious. In concealing the ways in which normalizing regimes deploy power to enforce the performative routines that construct “natural” sexed/gendered bodies together with debased, “unnatural” bodies, they obscure the arbitrariness of the constraints that are being imposed and deflect resistance to these constraints. The solution, in Butler's view, is to question the categories of biological sex, polarized gender, and determinate sexuality that serve as markers of personal identity, to treat the construction of identity as a site of political contestation, and to embrace the subversive potential of unorthodox performances and parodic identities.

African American feminists are less sanguine than poststructuralists about the felicitous social impact of playful deviations from norms and the laughter they may prompt (Williams 1991; Crenshaw 1993). Nevertheless, some of them have adapted poststructuralist theory to the purposes of critical race theory. Noting that gender, race, and class stratification do not operate in isolation from one another but rather interact to produce compound effects, these theorists conceive of the individual as an intersectional subject—a site where structures of domination and subordination converge (King 1988; Crenshaw 1993). Intersectional theory does not purport to offer a comprehensive theory of the self. Its aim is to capture those aspects of selfhood that are conditioned by membership in subordinated or privileged social groups. Accenting the liabilities of belonging to more than one subordinated group, Kimberle Crenshaw likens the position of such individuals to that of a pedestrian hit by several speeding vehicles simultaneously, and Maria Lugones likens their position to that of a stateless border-dweller who is not at home anywhere (Crenshaw 1991; Lugones 1992). Nevertheless, some theorists of mixed ancestry embrace border-dwelling as a model of positive identity (Anzaldua 1987; Alcoff 1995). Moreover, proponents of the intersectional self credit multiply oppressed people with a certain epistemic advantage. In virtue of their suffering and alienation, these individuals are well situated not only to discern which values and practices in their heritage deserve allegiance but also to identify shortcomings in the traditions of the groups to which they belong. Thus, African American women are acutely aware of racism within feminism and sexism within the struggle for racial justice. Their intersectional positioning and subjectivity makes such insight virtually unavoidable.

By and large, recent feminist philosophy of the self reflects skepticism about modernist, unitary accounts of the self. In seeking to remedy the androcentric biases of the latter views, feminist philosophers emphasize features of selfhood that other philosophical schools neglect, including intersubjectivity, heterogeneity, and social construction. Still, some contemporary feminist philosophers express concern that the sorts of conceptions I have sketched are detrimental to feminist aims. Influenced by Jurgen Habermas's communicative ethics, Seyla Benhabib refuses to join poststructuralists in declaring the death of the autonomous, self-reflective individual who is capable of taking responsibility and acting on principle (Benhabib 1995). Although Benhabib is committed to viewing people as socially situated, interpersonally bonded, and embodied, she is also committed to the feasibility of rational philosophical justification of universal moral norms. Moreover, she argues that a narrative conception of the self renders the idea of a core self and coherent identity intelligible without suppressing difference and without insulating the self from social relations (Benhabib 1999). Autobiographical stories can include the many voices within us and the many relationships we have experienced, and these stories are constantly under revision, for they are always being contested by our associates' disparate self-narratives with their divergent versions of events. Nevertheless, these narratives do not collapse into incoherence, and they presuppose a core capacity to describe and reflect on one's experience. For Benhabib, this view of selfhood and reason is indispensable to feminist emancipatory objectives.

3.2. Gender and Identity

Postmodern challenges to the idea of a stable self and to the coherence of the category woman’ have sparked a lively debate about the relation between gender and the self. If there is no such thing as a self with persistent attributes, it seems that gender cannot be a feature of every woman's identity. But if there is nothing that all women have in common, it seems that there are no interests that all women share, and there is nothing for feminism to be about. Several feminist philosophers have proposed accounts of the relation between gender and the self that aim to rescue feminism from this reductio. Linda Alcoff rejects both the universalized conceptions of gender that cultural feminists advocate and the deconstructions of the category ‘woman’ that poststructuralist feminists tender. Her alternative is to construe femininity as “positionality.” Positionality has two dimensions (Alcoff 1994). First, it is the social context that locates the individual and that deprives her of power and mobility. Second, it is a political point of departure—the affirmation of women's collective right to take charge of their gendered identity. To be a woman is, then, to be deprived of equality, and to be a feminist is to take responsibility for redressing this wrong and for redefining the meaning of being a woman. Alcoff salvages the category ‘woman’ by defending an interpretation of the social meaning of being assigned to that category.

Iris Young introduces an additional layer of analysis. To explain gender, Young invokes Jean-Paul Sartre's idea of seriality (Young 1994). A social series is “a social collective whose members are unified passively by the objects around which their actions are oriented or by the objectified results of the material effects of the actions of others.” In other words, a series is constituted by a behavior-directing, meaning-defining environment. The lives of series members are affected by being assigned to particular social series, for serial existence is experienced as a “felt necessity.” People feel impelled to act in ways that are consonant with their series memberships. Yet, series membership “does not define the person's identity in the sense of forming his/her individual purposes, projects, and sense of self in relation to others.” Indeed, a woman “can choose to make none of her serial memberships important for her sense of identity.” For Young, then, a gendered self is optional although membership in the series ‘woman’ is not.

Sally Haslanger underscores three conceptions of ‘gender’, and her distinctions clear up much of what seems puzzling in Alcoff's and Young's views (Haslanger 2000). Haslanger argues in favor of a “critical analytical” approach to gender—that is, focusing on the “work the concepts of gender and race might do for us in a critical—specifically feminist and antiracist—social theory” and suggesting “concepts that can accomplish at least some important elements of that work.” To pursue this politicized approach to gender, it is necessary to decide which conception of gender best serves the aims of emancipatory political theory and politics. As Haslanger points out, feminist theorists have interpreted gender as the experience of sexed embodiment, a broad psychological orientation to the world, a set of internalized norms, a system of sexual symbolism, a set of traditional roles, and a social position or class. In her view, the principal task for feminist theory is to provide an analysis of gender as a “pattern of social relations that constitute the social classes of men as dominant and women as subordinate.” The other forms of gender, including gendered identity, should be explained in terms of this fundamental structure.

Like Alcoff and Young, Haslanger is acutely aware of the political damage essentialist theories of gender have done—especially, the alienation of women of color and lesbians from feminism—and also the factual shortcomings of essentialist theories of gender—that is, many women do not fit the proposed accounts of what it is to be a woman. Although none of these feminist philosophers repudiates the conception of gender as a gendered self, each treats this conception as secondary or derivative. Alcoff politicizes gendered identity and ties it to a self-ascribed commitment to progressive social change. Young stresses the indeterminacy of gendered identity and allows that women's gender-based political commitments can be antifeminist as well as feminist. Although Haslanger insists that the connections between gender as social class and gendered identities are highly variable, she claims that gender “implicates each of us at the heart of our self-understandings,” and she advocates conscientious reflection on “who we think we are.”

Alcoff remarks that every woman's subjectivity is engendered; Young observes that every woman's identity is marked by gender; and Haslanger notes that every woman is invested in her gender. From the standpoint of a feminist philosophy of the self, it is crucial to account for this engendering, marking, and investment. In my view, the alternative to a common homogeneous feminine identity is gendered and individualized identities (Meyers forthcoming 2000). Individualization does not, however, entail optionality, for gender insinuates itself into identity in ways that we may not be conscious of and in ways that we may not be able to change no matter how much we try. Gender is constitutive of who we are—our personalities, our capabilities and liabilities, our aspirations, and how we feel about all of these attributes. Yet, there is no feature of identity that all women share. How is this possible? Nancy Chodorow uses psychoanalytic theory to make sense of individualized, gendered identities (Chodorow 1995). Psychoanalysis explains how individuals' affective dispositions, unconscious fantasies, and interpersonal relationships filter the culturally entrenched conception of gender they encounter. Through various psychic processes—projection and introjection together with the defense mechanisms—gender acquires a “personal meaning” that is inspired by, but that does not wholly replicate culturally transmitted strictures and iconography.

It is a mistake to picture gender as a toxic capsule full of norms and interpretive schemas that individuals swallow whole and that lodges intact in their psychic structure. The diversity of individuals' experience of gender belies this view. But it is also a mistake to picture attributes like gender as systems of social and economic opportunities, constraints, rewards, and penalties that need not impinge upon individual identity. The seeming naturalness of enacting gendered characteristics, the passion with which people cling to their sense of their gender, and the intractability of many gendered attributes when people seek to change them testify to the embeddedness of gender in identity. Still, it is important to recognize, as Alcoff, Young, Haslanger, and Chodorow do, that the potency of the impact of gender on the self does not altogether deprive women of control over their gendered attributes. Neither personal resistance to one's own gendered dispositions and evaluative standards nor political resistance to the social structures that gender women's identities is ruled out on this view (See Section 2).

4. Conclusion

As this article attests, there is tremendous foment and variety within the field of feminist work on the self. Yet, in reviewing this literature, I have been struck by a recurrent theme—the inextricability of metaphysical issues about the self from moral and political theory. Feminist critiques of regnant philosophical theories of the self expose the normative underpinnings of these theories. Feminist analyses of women's agentic capacities both acknowledge traditional feminine social contributions and provide accounts of how women can overcome oppressive norms and practices. Feminist reconstructions of the nature of the self are interwoven with arguments that draw out the emancipatory benefits of conceiving the self one way rather than another. There is nothing surprising, to be sure, about the salience of normative concerns in feminist philosophizing. Still, I mention it because I believe that feminists' attention to political concerns leads to fresh questions and also that asking novel questions enriches philosophical understanding of the self. Moreover, I would urge that this forthrightness about the political viewpoint that informs philosophy is a virtue, for overlooking the political suppositions and implications of esoteric philosophical views has led to considerable mischief.


Comprehensive Bibliography

In the interests of concision and readability, the present essay mentions only some of the representative works on the feminist literature on the self. These cited works are collated in the Bibliography which appears in the next section of this essay. However, the feminist literature on the self is vast. Lisa Cassidy has put together a comprehensive bibliography of this literature; it attempts to cite all of the books and articles that are relevant to the present entry. This comprehensive bibliography is linked into the present essay as the following supplementary document:

Comprehensive Bibliography of Feminist Perspectives on the Self (coauthored with Lisa Cassidy)

Readers are therefore encouraged to pursue additional references by following the above link.


The following works are cited in the entry:

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

feminist (topics): perspectives on class and work | feminist (topics): perspectives on reproduction and the family