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Feminist Social Epistemology

First published Thu Nov 9, 2006

Many of the significant contributors to the fast-developing field of social epistemology have been feminist epistemologists, theorists who investigate the role of gender in knowledge production. Motivated by the political project of eliminating the oppression of women, feminist epistemologists are interested in how the norms and practices of knowledge production affect the lives of women and are implicated in systems of oppression. Feminist epistemologists seek to understand not only how our social relations of gender have shaped our knowledge practices, but also whether and how these relations should play a role in good knowing. Feminists have distinguished between the categories of gender and (anatomical) sex, and for decades have focused much of their attention on gender, the analytical category capturing the cultural and social aspects of sexed bodies.[1] As a category of social relations then, gender is a significant area of investigation for social epistemology. Additionally, feminist epistemologists have increasingly attended to the interrelations between gender and other social categories such as race, class, and sexuality and their significance for knowledge.

Elizabeth Anderson characterizes feminist epistemology as properly belonging within social epistemology, describing it as "the branch of social epistemology that investigates the influence of socially constructed conceptions and norms of gender and gender-specific interests and experiences on the production of knowledge"(1995a, 54). It may be too strong a claim to suggest that all projects of feminist epistemology fall within the realm of social epistemology; it could be argued that some projects of feminist epistemology, such as Louise Antony's defense of epistemological individualism (1995), resist at least certain elements of a social epistemology. Similarly, theorists who argue that there are epistemically valuable feminine ways of knowing integral to women, without providing a social analysis, could also be viewed as resisting certain elements of a social epistemology.[2] Nevertheless, by far the majority of work in feminist epistemology is best understood as a form of social epistemology.

Feminist social epistemology represents more than just a small subset of social epistemology, however. The significant body of work of feminist social epistemologists has provided key theoretical resources for understanding the social dimensions of knowing. The interest of feminist social epistemologists in how gender plays out in knowledge practices is generalizable to an interest in how power relations play out epistemically. Their focus on power relations has led some to characterize feminist social epistemologists as falling on the radical end of the social epistemology spectrum (Goldman 2001; Kitcher 1994). Radical or not, few feminist epistemologists reduce knowledge to power politics, even as they draw attention to them. One of the key features of feminist epistemologies responsible for some of their significant contributions within social epistemology has been their serious commitment to developing normative epistemological accounts.

Social epistemology distinguishes itself from sociology of knowledge in its goal of providing a normative analysis of knowledge (Fuller 1988; Schmitt 1994a), seeking not only to describe our current social practices of knowledge production, but also to understand how we ought to know and how we can improve our knowledge practices. There is little agreement among social epistemologists on the scope or form of such normativity. However, feminist social epistemologists have felt this need to incorporate a normative dimension to their social analyses in a particularly pressing way: feminist political demands for the elimination of oppression are normative in a moral sense, but they also depend on epistemically normative claims for their justification. Their force depends on the ability to distinguish between better and worse claims to knowledge, for example by criticizing sexist knowledge claims and supporting non-sexist knowledge claims. Feminists can ill afford to simply describe the ways in which social relations such as gender currently shape knowledge practices if they are to defend their claims for social change. Thus, feminist social epistemologists have a particularly strong motivation to develop rich accounts that tease epistemic normativity out of a power-sensitive social understanding of knowledge production.

As is true of social epistemology generally, there is a great deal of variation in the theories and approaches constituting feminist epistemology and few generalizations can be made across the field. Acknowledging such variety, some theorists refer only to "feminist epistemologies" in the plural, fearing that characterizing a single field of feminist epistemology implies a greater unity than exists. Others have argued that feminist epistemology should best be identified not by its specific theoretical content, but rather by what "doing epistemology as a feminist" amounts to (Longino 1999). Doing epistemology as a feminist involves bringing one's feminist concerns and sensibilities to the epistemological table. As a result of bringing such concerns to epistemological work, significant feminist contributions to social epistemology have included extensive critiques of the individualism of contemporary analytic epistemology, the development of alternative models of knowers as social beings, defenses of the appropriate role of values and other culturally relative factors in knowing, and socially informed conceptions of objectivity.

1. Historical Development

As the second wave of feminism progressed throughout the 1970s, feminist philosophical work began to appear, first in ethics and political philosophy. At the same time, feminists working in other disciplines such as the social sciences were documenting the sexism and androcentrism in their fields. These theorists increasingly found the methodologies of their disciplines incapable of accounting for their feminist insights. Their interests turned to epistemological issues when it became apparent that alternative accounts of knowledge and of justification were required "in order to overthrow presuppositions in their disciplines which functioned as obstacles to necessary change" (Longino 1999, 330).

One of the earliest pieces clearly identifiable as feminist epistemology was Lorraine Code's "Is the Sex of the Knower Epistemically Significant?" appearing in 1981 in Metaphilosophy. The first significant collection of articles in feminist epistemology appeared in 1983 with Harding and Hintikka's Discovering Reality: Feminist Perspectives on Epistemology, Metaphysics, Methodology and Philosophy of Science. Soon after the Harding and Hintikka volume, rates of publication in feminist epistemology picked up significantly. By contrast, although there are clear historical roots to the current form of the field (Goldman 2001), social epistemology didn't make its presence felt on the terrain of contemporary epistemology until the late 1980s and early 1990s. Steve Fuller's book Social Epistemology appeared in 1988 and in 1994 Schmitt's volume Socializing Epistemology appeared, the first significant collection of work in contemporary social epistemology (1994b). Though few articles in this collection make specific reference to feminist epistemology,[3] in his introduction Schmitt acknowledges feminist philosophers of science, along with sociology of science, and naturalistic epistemology as the major inspirations for social epistemology since 1980 (Schmitt 1994a, 3-4).

The Harding and Hintikka volume represented several angles of research, and set the stage for future discussions within feminist epistemology. Several pieces undertook deconstructive projects, demonstrating how masculinist perspectives and assumptions infiltrate the philosophies of particular historical figures. Other selections focused on science studies, offering illustrations of the congruence between specific scientific theories and the social and political ideologies of the day, including patriarchal ideologies. Still others represented reconstructive epistemological projects in response to such findings, arguing for a requisite role of values in scientific theorizing, or arguing that rational investigation requires a critical assessment of the metaphysical (and sometimes gendered) assumptions underlying a field of study. Additionally, Nancy Hartsock's contribution to the volume outlined her version of feminist standpoint theory, invoking the Marxist idea that social position is inversely related to epistemic position.[4] Standpoint theory offered an extensive argument for the grounding of epistemic perspective in one's social position, and would soon form one of the most fruitful and heavily debated areas of theorizing for feminist epistemologists.

As feminists turned to the reconstructive projects of developing new epistemologies, one of their major tasks was to explain the connection between the rise of the feminist movement and the recognition of sexism and androcentrism in what had previously been taken to be excellent cases of objective knowledge production. Why was it only with the rise of the feminist movement that critiques of the role of gendered assumptions in canonical figures such as Aristotle and Descartes began to appear? Why did primatology begin to question research based on male dominance schemas and begin to develop alternative models involving closer observation of female primate behavior at the same time that there was an increase in the number of women in the field? Why did it take feminist psychologists to point out the androcentrism involved in drawing conclusions about human beings based on all-male studies? In her contribution to the Discovering Reality volume, Sandra Harding phrased the question as "Why has the Sex/Gender System Become Visible Only Now?" To answer it, feminists very clearly needed to develop social epistemologies. They needed to show not only how feminist interests might motivate such knowledge production, but also how such feminist motivated work could offer what many (feminists and nonfeminists alike) considered improved knowledge production, not just alternative knowledge production.

Harding's 1986 book The Science Question in Feminism examined various epistemological options for feminists seeking to explain such political-epistemic connections within science. She set out what was to become a classic tripartite taxonomy of feminist epistemologies: feminist empiricism, feminist standpoint theory and feminist postmodernism. Harding characterized feminist empiricism as an approach arguing that the sexist and androcentric biases present in science are the result of "bad" science which can be corrected by stricter adherence to traditional norms of science, as represented by the feminist critiques identifying such biases (for example Bleier 1984, Hubbard 1983, Longino and Doell 1983). Feminist standpoint theory, according to Harding, argues that the political engagement of feminists and their corresponding focus on the lives of women leads to an epistemically privileged "standpoint" on social reality (for example Harstock 1983, Rose 1983, Smith 1974). In contrast, feminist postmodernism, skeptical of universal claims of reason and the progress of science, argues that only political solidarity across social locations can ground feminist findings, there being no independent epistemological groundings (for example Flax 1990, Haraway 1991).

Feminist epistemologies continued to multiply throughout the 1980s and early 1990s, quickly cross-fertilizing and rendering outmoded Harding's neat classification system. Few current works in feminist epistemology fall unequivocally into a single category according to Harding's three original definitions. For example, the leading theories of feminist empiricism from the 1990s on have very little in common with Harding's characterization of feminist empiricism, given that they do not explain past instances of sexism and androcentrism as simply "bad science" and they do not accept traditional norms of science as appropriate correctives (Longino 1990, Nelson 1990).[5] Even Harding has developed her own position as a blend of standpoint theory and feminist postmodernism (Harding 1991). In spite of their significant limitations, however, Harding's divisions are still often cited, and remain useful in characterizing some of the main directions of the literature.

Much of the early work in feminist social epistemology was highly critical of many mainstream epistemological approaches. As feminists turned to their reconstructive projects in the early 1990s, however, they focused their criticisms on particular versions of epistemology, recognizing that not all existing epistemologies were equally difficult to work with. In particular, post-Kuhnian historically-oriented philosophies of science as well as naturalized epistemology proved to be very important resources. Besides the fact that many feminists have been particularly interested in the workings of science as a dominant force in society, they have also found many forms of philosophy of science comparatively open to social analyses.[6] This openness stems from a recognition of the historically dynamic nature of knowledge not often evident in analytic epistemologies that focus on the general conditions of knowledge rather than the specific methodologies and activities of the sciences. Even more prominently, naturalized epistemology has proven to be very conducive to analyses of the role of gender in knowing. It demands that we look and see, turning to empirical evidence of how in fact we do know rather than making a priori announcements concerning how we know.[7] Thus, where it has been easy for certain forms of analytical epistemology to dismiss feminist empirical findings of the role of gender in knowledge as irrelevant to questions of serious epistemological import, naturalized epistemology insists that such empirical findings must have something important to tell us about knowledge production, or at a minimum, must be accounted for. Hence naturalized epistemology cannot consistently dismiss such findings of the role of gender. Despite the individualism of many naturalized epistemologies, a naturalized approach can operate as a very strong argument for a social epistemology: looking at how human beings know leaves little doubt that the vast majority of our knowing takes place socially. Even if the "socially" is understood in the minimal sense of individuals interacting with each other, exchanging information, the social interaction has the potential to be infused with the dynamics of gender, opening the door for analyses of how gender affects knowledge exchanges. While rejecting his individualism, many feminist epistemologists have relied heavily on the resources of Quine, from his overall naturalized approach to specifics of his holistic theory of evidence (Antony 1993; Campbell 1998; Nelson 1990, 1996).

Throughout the 1990s, the output of works in feminist social epistemology was rich and varied. Early in the decade substantive works appeared in feminist philosophy of science (Harding 1991; Longino 1990; Nelson 1990) along with significant developments in standpoint theory (Collins 1990; Harding 1991), postmodern feminist epistemology (Haraway 1991) and analyses of the role of subjectivity in knowing (Code 1991). By the mid-1990s, articles of feminist social epistemology were making appearances in numerous mainstream analytic philosophical journals, with special issues devoted to feminist epistemology in The Monist (1994), Philosophical Topics (1995) and Synthese (1995). Throughout the decade, the work of feminist social epistemologists addressed many issues being taken up by other social epistemologists as well: the dynamics of testimony and relations of cognitive authority, communal analyses of evidence and epistemic agency, the social structure of scientific knowledge, social conceptions of objectivity, and understandings of knowledge as social practice. In 2002, Social Epistemology devoted a special issue to "Feminist Epistemology as Social Epistemology". Yet despite feminist epistemology's shared interests with the developing field of social epistemology, its direction has been primarily driven by the needs and challenges of feminist theory itself. For example, as feminist theory in all its guises developed throughout the 1980s and early 1990s, it became apparent that gender was not the only significant social category, and more importantly that gender could not be properly understood in isolation from other social categories such as race, class and sexuality. Many feminist theorists were criticized on the grounds that their focus on gender had assumed a commonality across women and paid inadequate attention to the ways in which gendered experience was shaped by other social positions. Feminist social epistemology began to attend more closely to the intersections between various social categories. By 1993, Alcoff and Potter noted that feminist epistemology should no longer be taken "as involving a commitment to gender as the primary axis of oppression, in any sense of ‘primary,’ or positing that gender is a theoretical variable separable from other axes of oppression and susceptible to a unique analysis" (Alcoff and Potter 1993, 3-4). Instead, they suggested the continued use of the term "feminist epistemologies" as marking work that has historically evolved out of a concern with the relations between gender and knowledge (Alcoff and Potter 1993, 4).

2. Social Models of Knowers

One of the major contributions of feminist social epistemologies has been their thorough critique of the individualism of modern epistemology, and their corresponding reconstructions of epistemic subjects as situated knowers. Along with other social epistemologists, feminists have found themselves at least initially presenting their work as responses to a dominantly individualistic tradition. From the Cartesian beginnings of modern epistemology where knowledge was thought to result from the careful exercise of an individual's mental faculties, to the dominant contemporary epistemological frameworks resting on "S knows that p" formulations where "S" can be any epistemic subject, feminist social epistemologists have drawn attention to the inadequacies of the abstract individualism prevalent in epistemology (Code 1991; Jaggar 1983; Scheman 1995). The problems, feminists have argued, lie not simply in the claim that knowers are primarily individuals, but rather that these individual knowers are themselves conceptualized as generic (or interchangeable) and self-sufficient (or capable of self-sufficiency) in knowing (Code 1991; Grasswick 2004). The conjunction of these three features forms what has been called the atomistic model of knowers. The model does not deny that knowers have identities and social locations, but it does deny that these are relevant features to include in epistemic assessments. Though not a full-fledged solipsism, the atomistic view puts forth a methodological solipsism for epistemological purposes (Potter 1993), and is antithetical to social analyses of knowledge. For example, if one's epistemology begins with the assumption that all knowers are interchangeable, then any differences in individuals based on social location, including gender, will be deemed epistemically irrelevant from the start. Similarly, if one's epistemology begins with the assumption that knowers are or can be self-sufficient, analyses will focus on the types of knowledge that might be attainable in solitude, such as simple observational expressions as "The cat is on the mat", ignoring more complex knowledge, such as "the economy is in a recession", and leaving out of the analysis the social interactions that make many forms of knowledge possible.[8] Many feminists have identified the prevalence of the atomistic model within epistemology as an obstacle to the development of an accurate understanding of the role of gender in knowing, arguing that alternative, more social models of knowers are necessary.

In the early 1990s, feminist attention to the identity of the epistemic subject abounded in such titles as Who Knows? (Nelson 1990), What Can She Know? (Code 1991) and Whose Science? Whose Knowledge? (Harding 1991). "Situated knowers" became a key term in feminist epistemologies, though theorists varied significantly on the specifics of the concept. Some focused on the socially differentiated nature of knowers (in contrast to the generic nature of knowers in the atomistic model), while others focused on their social interactive nature (in contrast to the self-sufficiency of knowers in the atomistic model). Still others argued for the adoption of the community as primary knower (in contrast to the individual as primary knower in the atomistic model). Many of these arguments intersect with each other. For example, by emphasizing the differentiated nature of knowers one strengthens the argument for the epistemic interdependence of knowers; interaction between knowers becomes crucial so that individuals can access knowledge beyond the reach of their specific social location. Since conceptions of knowers carry normative weight, making distinctions between those who know and those who don't, or between those who know more or less well, feminist discussions of situated knowers are very much integrated with their discussions of the objectivity and justification of knowledge claims (see Section 3: Social Models of Knowledge and Objectivity).

2.1 Differentiated Knowers and Standpoint Theory

At the core of many the feminist discussions of knowers is the idea that experiential differences lead to differences in perspective, and these perspectival differences carry epistemic consequences. At first, this suggestion may appear epistemically innocuous. Even a staunch supporter of the atomistic view can acknowledge that we don't all share the same experiences, and if one is an empiricist, holding that one obtains knowledge primarily through experience, one can acknowledge that different experiences will lead to different knowledge bases. But for the atomist, this point is not epistemically interesting, because a different knower could know the same thing as another if she were to have the particular experience in question. In this sense, knowers are interchangeable for the atomist. Feminists who argue for the epistemic relevance of the identity of knowers, however, are interested in forms of knowing for which it is questionable whether a differently located knower could have the same experience. To give an obvious example, sex-specific bodily experiences, such as knowing pain during childbirth, cannot be accessed by members of the other sex. Feminists arguing for differentiated knowers expand this idea, suggesting that there are a vast range of experiences differentiated along the lines of social location. In a gender-structured society, for example, a girl's experience in math class might differ significantly from her male counterpart's experience. The differences in knowers that feminists attend to are not random or idiosyncratic, but are socially structured and systematic, with the potential to be major influences on people's lives. The feminist arguments that gender is an epistemically relevant category of social location apply only as long as the society under consideration is structured along the lines of gender.

What makes these feminist arguments interesting is that they do more than argue for a direct link between having a certain experience and obtaining a certain piece of knowledge (though they include such cases in their analyses too). The intervening concept is that of perspective. If social location shapes one's perspective on the world (through differential experiences) and we can only interact with the world and know it through that perspective, then the areas of knowledge for which one's social location is relevant may be very broad indeed, and may include areas of knowledge not obviously connected to the experiences of a particular social location. According to these arguments, one's perspective both shapes and sets limits on how a particularly located individual can know, at least through her own achievements. Such arguments also suggest that institutions of knowledge production that are dominated by a particular group may be influenced by the perspective of that group, without that perspective being recognized. For example, many who argue that the underrepresentation of women in science is a concern do so not simply from the belief that women should be afforded equal opportunities, but also out of a worry that the science might be shaped by a dominant masculine perspective (Addelson 1983; Keller 1985; Lloyd 1984), making the underrepresentation of women an epistemic issue as well as a justice issue.

Feminist standpoint theory has done the most to articulate the importance of perspectival differences stemming from social location. Adopted from elements of Marxist theory, feminist standpoint theory also represents one of the more thorough attempts to ground epistemology and, correspondingly, a view of knowers in a social theory. It ties social location very closely to epistemic position, arguing that social locations not only vary from an epistemological point of view, but that some social locations are more epistemically reliable than others. According to strands of Marxist materialism developed by Georg Lukács, one's social position with respect to material labor is inversely related to one's epistemic position. Society is structured primarily along the lines of two classes, the working class (proletariat) and the capitalists (the bourgeoisie) who own the means of production. As the privileged class, the capitalists have a motivation to maintain the status quo, and this interest interferes in their ability to understand the exploitation of the working class upon which their capitalist privilege depends. The working class, however, as the socially underprivileged, can achieve a richer understanding of social relations; they not only have a motivation to understand the true nature of the exploitation to which they are subject (in order to be able to end to the exploitation), but their position offers the potential for a dual vision. Since they are subject to the rules of the capitalists who wield social power, the working class has an understanding of the capitalists' view of the world. But additionally, they have an experiential understanding of their own lives as the exploited. Thus, their position as socially underprivileged affords them the possibility of an epistemic privilege stemming from this dual vision.

Feminist standpoint theory draws on these ideas, but rests on a sexual division of labor rather than class divisions. Sociologist Dorothy Smith argues for the epistemic advantage women sociologists have over male sociologists in their experience of a "bifurcated consciousness", caught as they are between the conceptual world of sociology and the material world of their lives as women (1974). Nancy Hartsock's 1983 articulation of the theory argues that women's contributions to subsistence and childrearing result in a systematic difference of experience across the genders. Accordingly, the activities of women that place them in a socially underprivileged position can form the basis of a privileged epistemic standpoint, through which a deeper understanding of patriarchal institutions and ideologies can be reached (Hartsock 1983). More recently, feminist standpoint theory has developed in response to feminist theorists' recognition that gender cannot be understood in isolation from other social categories. For example, Patricia Hill Collins has put forth the idea of a black women's standpoint, identifying specific epistemic resources in black women's experience that are important to the development of black feminist thought (Collins 1990).

Feminist standpoint theories are controversial because by connecting epistemic perspective so closely to one's material and social location, they appear to posit chasms between knowers, suggesting knowers are unable to share knowledge across social locations (Nelson 1990; Walby 2001). Versions of standpoint theory have also been criticized for failing to adequately account for phenomenon such as internalized oppression, in which the perspective of the oppressed is damaged by the forces of oppression and is unreliable. For example, feminists have argued that many women who blame themselves for their rapes have internalized damaging false beliefs about their responsibilities and the causes of their rapes, making it problematic to consider their perspective epistemically advantageous or reliable. Some versions of feminist standpoint theory have had difficulty accounting for the coherence of a feminist standpoint while acknowledging that women are variously situated and do not experience oppression in the same way. It has also been important for standpoint theories to specify the scope of their claims. Claims concerning the epistemic significance of social location have seemed most plausible for understanding social relations, and this is certainly the focus of the original contributions of standpoint theory. But there may be additional realms of knowledge for which social location is significant, and social location may not play out in the same way in all realms. Alison Wylie has argued that it is a contingent matter, open to empirical investigation, how certain subdominant standpoints offer epistemic advantages in particular fields of knowledge (2003).

Ultimately, the plausibility of standpoint theories depends on their specific details, and many versions have developed significantly since their first articulations. Additionally, many feminist social epistemologists who reject standpoint theory as a whole have adopted some form of the idea that social location is connected to epistemic perspective in significant ways, and hence that knowers are differentiated. The controversies evoked by standpoint theories and their criticisms have stimulated important discussions concerning how feminist social epistemologists are to understand the exact nature of the relationship between social location and epistemic perspective.

2.2 Interactive and Relational Knowers

Feminist social epistemologists also stress the socially interactive nature of knowers, arguing that epistemically, human beings are deeply dependent on one another. At least three strains of argument support a recognition of our epistemic dependence and correspondingly, the interactive nature of knowers.

First, feminist social epistemologists who focus on institutional forms of knowing such as scientific research, medical practice, and legal systems understand that in these contexts we are highly reliant on others to produce knowledge for us. Not only do laypersons rely on experts for knowledge, but even within epistemic communities such as in research teams there are cognitive divisions of labor that result in a dependence on other experts for knowledge relevant to one's own research. More than many other social epistemologists interested in cognitive divisions of labor, feminist social epistemologists develop analyses that attend to the power dynamics within epistemic communities, examining correlations between structures of cognitive and social authority, and demonstrating their influence on the direction of research. Kathryn Pyne Addelson (1983) for example, argues that in order to increase the rationality of scientific research, we need to include in our assessments criticism of the social arrangements within the scientific communities. For example, if social relations are such that men disproportionately hold the most significant positions of social and cognitive authority within scientific communities, the direction of research as well as the choice of methods and metaphysical assumptions underlying research may disproportionately reflect men's experiences and perspectives. Understanding the workings of such social arrangements can help us better assess the overall rationality and quality of scientific research. Feminists have also stressed the particular vulnerabilities of the oppressed that stem from their reliance on experts, when lines of credibility and expertise are woven into an oppressive set of social arrangements (Code 1991; Sherwin 1992). Whereas some social epistemologists take the presence of cognitive divisions of labor to offer support for a view of communities as knowers,[9] those feminist social epistemologists who focus on cognitive divisions of labor (as opposed to other dimensions of knowing that might point in the direction of communities as knowers) tend to focus instead on the epistemic role of trust, allowing that individuals can know beyond their personal grasp of the evidence, but insisting on philosophical analysis of the vulnerabilities and negotiations that play out through such dependence on others.

Second, arguments to the effect that knowers are differentiated from each other along the lines of social location suggest that in many cases knowers must rely on others differently situated from themselves in order to attain certain forms of knowledge. If perspectives differ along the lines of social location, then one cannot necessarily trust one's own perspective as epistemically reliable in a particular area of knowledge and one will need to interact with others differently socially located in order to increase the reliability of one's knowing. For example, a white male department chair may need to consult with professors who have experienced sexism and racism in the classroom in order to determine whether a white male student complaint about a young Chicana professor is legitimate or not (Alcoff 2001). Many feminist social epistemologists who focus on socially differentiated knowers argue that the necessary interaction cannot just be epistemic in nature; when categories of social location are hierarchically structured as they are in oppressive societies, social and political alliances must be built between groups in order to develop the trust necessary to share knowledge across social locations. Others have argued that in some cases the distrust across social locations is so strong that only relationships of friendship are sufficiently deep to allow for the sharing of knowledge and understanding across locations (Lugones 1987).

Third, recognizing that as children we are highly dependent on others both for our care and for the development of our epistemic skills, some feminist social epistemologists have argued that our epistemic dependence runs as deep as the conditions of epistemic agency itself. Building on the work of Annette Baier (1985), Lorraine Code has argued that epistemically, knowers are best thought of as "second persons", who acquire epistemic skills through others, and who are dependent on others' acknowledgment of them as an epistemic agent in order to develop and exercise epistemic agency (Code 1991). It is through our interactions with others and our development as children that we learn the skills of knowing, learn what constitutes knowing, and come to be counted among others as knowers. An implication of Code's view is that if one is systematically denied acknowledgment as a knower and credibility is consistently withheld, as can happen in systems of oppression, then one's epistemic agency and capacity to know will be diminished. Her arguments support a relational view of epistemic agency, one that still recognizes individuals as knowers, but conceptualizes them as socially constituted and epistemically dependent on their interactions with others.

While some feminist social epistemologists such as Code focus on interpersonal relations within a community, others draw attention to the importance of a knower's relations with multiple communities. They argue that many of the insights of feminist critics of science were made possible by bridge knowers, individual feminist scientists interacting with both scientific communities and feminist communities. Such cases suggest the need for a model of knowers that accounts for an individual's dynamic relations with multiple communities (Tuana 1995). The idea of knowers as individuals-in-communities has been suggested as a model that both captures the importance of interrelations with multiple communities and, by keeping individual knowers in the foreground, is capable of attending to the power relations that individual knowers must negotiate within those communities (Grasswick 2004).

Acknowledgment of the various forms of our epistemic interdependence has motivated investigations of the dynamics of social interaction and their effects on knowledge production. For example, recognizing that we frequently rely on the testimony of others, yet also make judgments on the worth of the testimony, feminist social epistemologists have investigated the complex links between assignments of credibility and social position (Alcoff 2001; Code 1995; Jones 2002). Many conclude that because of our epistemic interdependence, adequate epistemic analysis must attend to the political and moral dimensions of our social-epistemic interactions (Code 1995). For example, Miranda Fricker argues that there is social pressure to grant greater than warranted degrees of credibility to those with social power, with the effect that we do less well at attaining truths and avoiding falsehoods. Her conclusion is that an adequate social epistemology must acknowledge and assess the the epistemic effects of power relations. As she writes, "epistemology will not be truly socialized until it has been appropriately politicized" (Fricker 1998, 174). Feminist arguments for the importance of trust in knowing (Code 1991, 1995; Scheman 2001) coupled with their analyses of the moral and affective dimensions of trust (Baier 1986; Jones 1996, 2002) also suggest that the moral quality of social relations is important to assess as part of one's epistemic analysis.

2.3 Communities as Knowers

Statements pointing to communities as knowers can be found in a wide variety of feminist epistemologists (Harding 1993; Longino 2002; Nelson 1990; Potter 1993), though they do not all embrace the same arguments.

Some arguments to the effect that it is communities rather than individuals who are properly thought of as knowers build on the arguments for the interactive nature of knowers. For example, Helen Longino argues that claims and theories can only achieve the status of knowledge by going through a public process of critical scrutiny, in which individual knowers engage with each other epistemically in joint endeavors. She allows that individuals can know particular claims, but it is communities who are the knowledge producers, since it takes social processes of critical engagement to transform beliefs and theories into knowledge (2002).

Other feminist social epistemologists who embrace a community model of knowers do so based on arguments that there are crucial public and shared elements of knowing that cannot be understood by viewing individuals in isolation (Webb 1995). Along these lines, communities can be understood as knowers in the sense that a communal context is required for knowing. Individuals know only within communities. Arguments for such a view are supported by claims that language and conceptual schemas are required for knowledge, which are themselves community specific and acquired by individuals through participation in communities. A great deal of work in feminist social epistemology and feminist science studies has documented how gendered assumptions that stem from features of our social organization make their way into the metaphors and conceptual schemas of knowledge production (for example, Bleier 1984; Hubbard 1983; Keller 1985, 1992; Martin 1991). Many feminist social epistemologists have found it necessary to turn to the level of the communally-shared concepts and assumptions in order to explain why gendered work has been accepted and gone unnoticed within science for so long.

An argument advocating an even stronger model of communities as primary knowers comes from Lynn Hankinson Nelson (1990, 1993). Nelson's work is inspired by Quine and his holistic theory of evidence in which there are no firm boundaries between evidence and theory. What Nelson includes in her conception of evidence that Quine did not is the larger social and political context within which science is produced. She couples this with arguments for the historically dynamic nature of the category of evidence; changes in public and communal standards of evidence will result in changes to the evidence itself. According to Nelson it is communities who construct and share knowledge and standards of evidence, and thus it must be communities who are the primary agents of knowledge (Nelson 1990, 256). Nelson's point is that if we are to understand why a particular theory is supported at a particular time, we must examine communities, not just isolated individuals. Her arguments allow her to explain how androcentric science has lost its evidential support: although androcentric science may have enjoyed considerable evidential support at one time, changes in the social and political context of particular communities resulted in feminist work both revealing and resisting the influence of androcentric assumptions. This shift in the communal standards of evidence has diminished evidential support for androcentric research.

Feminist social epistemologists who argue for a community model of knowers do not deny that individuals also know. However, their accounts challenge the possibility of understanding individuals as knowers in isolation from their communities, and press for a better understanding of the relative roles of individuals and communities in knowing. For example, communal accounts of knowing suggest that the epistemic responsibilities of individuals will need to be understood in relation to their communal memberships, which set limits on the conceptual resources and epistemic tools individuals have available to them.[10]

3. Social Models of Knowledge and Objectivity

With much of their work drawing attention to the perspectival nature of knowing and community-specific elements of knowing, feminist social epistemologists also need to articulate how we are to distinguish between better and worse knowing, or how we are able to identify objective knowledge. In a 1988 article, Donna Haraway first introduced the term situated knowledges to feminist epistemology, as a way of expressing a form of objectivity that takes seriously the social construction of knowledge and the perspectival nature of knowledge demonstrated by feminists. By invoking situated knowledges, Haraway suggests that all knowledge is local and limited, denying the possibility of the impartial view-from-nowhere that has often been associated with the perspective of objective knowledge. What Haraway suggests instead is an embodied objectivity (recognizing our material locations) that consists in partial connection across perspectives or locations: given the limited and perspectival nature of all knowing, the most we can hope for is forms of knowledge that are objective in the sense that they are translatable across particular subjective locations. For Haraway, it is through building political solidarities and engaging in epistemic conversations across our positionings that we come to agreement on how to know certain aspects of the world, but these agreements will never completely erase the differences in our perspectives. Other Feminist social epistemologists offer different analyses of how to attain such partial connection.

3.1 Strong Objectivity

Standpoint theorists, and many who are inspired by standpoint theory, not only maintain Haraway's the situated knowledge thesis, conceptualizing all knowledge as perspectival, but also hold a stronger thesis that some of those perspectives are epistemically more valuable than others. In other words, some perspectives offer objectivity in a way that others do not. While the privileging of some epistemic perspectives ensures that standpoint theory bears normative content, it remains to be explained how one attains a privileged epistemic standpoint that will lead to objective knowledge, and how one can identify such a standpoint.

Although some standpoint theorists argue for a women's standpoint stemming directly from women's experience, most influential standpoint theorists including Hartsock (1983) and Harding (1986) insist that the Marxist-inspired arguments imply that although the feminist standpoint is deeply connected to the lives of women, the epistemically privileged nature of the feminist standpoint stems from active political engagement in the feminist cause, not just the perspective of women. Thus, a certain kind of political activity is required in order to appreciate the situation of women or other oppressed groups. This sense of standpoint refers to the capacity to develop "a critical consciousness about the nature of our social location and the difference it makes epistemically" and builds upon, but is distinctive from the situated knowledge thesis that recognizes the importance of social location in shaping epistemic perspective (Wylie 2003, 31). A standpoint does not naturally or automatically arise from a particular social location, although the experiences of an oppressed social location can make the achievement of a standpoint more likely.

Harding has developed this idea further in her call for researchers to start their research from the perspective of women's lives and the lives of other marginalized groups, regardless of their own social location (Harding 1991). This line of reasoning weakens the connection between social or material location and epistemic perspective, since presumably a researcher can access a privileged epistemic perspective without occupying the relevant social location. Yet it maintains the situated knowledge thesis that perspectives are differentiated according to social location, and it calls on researchers to engage in reflexive analysis of how their own social location shapes their research. Harding argues that such reflexive analysis, coupled with an active attempt to engage in research from the perspectives of the oppressed will result in a stronger form of objectivity than the "weak objectivity" available through a neutral approach to knowing that ignores the role of social location and cultural assumptions in shaping one's perspective. Harding's strong objectivity results from an acknowledgment of the perspectival nature of all knowing, and a determined effort to examine the world from the perspectives of the socially underprivileged rather than the privileged. The result, according to standpoint theorists such as Harding, will be knowledge that is less partial and distorted, and hence, more objective.

3.2 Objectivity as a Social Process

Numerous feminist social epistemologists, particularly those working in philosophy of science, have employed the underdetermination thesis to argue for the necessary role of background assumptions in theory choice (Anderson 1995b; Longino 1990, 2002; Nelson 1990; Potter 1996). If theory is underdetermined by the data, and multiple theories can always explain the data equally well, then data alone cannot determine the best theory. Background assumptions must be employed as well. The problem is that background assumptions, which may include methodological assumptions, assumptions with empirical content, metaphysical assumptions, and value-laden assumptions, are rarely articulated. They may also be gendered. Drawing attention to the necessary role of these often unarticulated assumptions has allowed feminist philosophers of science to explain both how androcentric and sexist assumptions have managed to persevere for so long in science, as well as why feminist values do not have to be eliminated from scientific research in order for it to constitute good science. But in order to make epistemic distinctions and continue to claim that some theory choices are better than others, they must explain how we are to sort through and select those background assumptions we are willing to rely on.

Helen Longino has developed a very influential theory of contextual empiricism that includes a social conception of objectivity. According to Longino, a theory is objective if it has undergone and survived a certain social process of critical scrutiny. Through public critical scrutiny, the background assumptions upon which particular theories depend for their support have the potential to be revealed, and idiosyncratic assumptions can be weeded out. In order to ensure that this system of public scrutiny is working well, Longino sets out four governing norms of interaction in an epistemic community: there must be publicly recognized forums for criticism, uptake of criticism, public standards, and tempered (to allow for differences in intellectual capacity) equality of intellectual authority (Longino 2002).[11] To the extent that these norms of social interaction are fulfilled by an epistemic community, the theories they are considering will be subject to the appropriate kind of public critical scrutiny, and their results will be objective. Diverse representation within the community also becomes important, since "a diversity of perspectives is necessary for vigorous and epistemically effective critical discourse" (Longino 2002, 131). The greater the diversity in the community, the greater the opportunity for revealing background assumptions that may be shared by large segments of the membership. Once a background assumption is revealed, the process of critical scrutiny determines whether it is acceptable or problematic and in need of rejection. The resultant knowledge will not be aperspectival and will not be free of background assumptions, but it will represent a perspective that is broader than any one individual can bring to the table, and that has been found to be appropriate for the particular epistemic goals of the community.

Others describe the possibility of objectivity given the perspectival nature of knowledge in a slightly different way. Using the term "bias" to refer to interest or perspective, Louise Antony characterizes the challenge for feminist epistemologists who criticize the idea of objectivity as neutrality or impartiality as the "bias paradox": such feminists both criticize neutrality and impartiality (arguing that such impartiality is impossible due to the situatedness of knowledge) at the same time as they must appeal to impartiality in criticizing male bias as "bad" (Antony 1993). Her solution is to adopt a naturalistic and empirical approach to biases, embracing the idea that biases are an inevitable component of knowing, but arguing that it is an empirical question to determine which biases are good in that they lead to the truth, and which are bad in that they lead us away from truth. Richmond Campbell has developed these ideas further, arguing that armed with realist conceptions of truth and objective justification, we can explain (without circularity) how feminist biases can lead us closer to the truth within contexts of systematic gender bias in epistemic communities (Campbell 2001, 1998).

4. Democracy, Ethics, and Knowledge

Many of the arguments and conclusions of feminist social epistemologists point in the direction of theorizing a deep connection between democracy and knowledge. For example, Longino's conditions of tempered intellectual authority and uptake of criticism (2002) suggest that objective knowledge can only be successfully pursued in conditions where knowers are respected for their epistemic contributions and not ignored or assigned less credibility because of who they are. Similarly, Elizabeth Anderson (1995c) argues explicitly that the aims of higher education demand that issues of justice and equality of respect within the academy be taken up as epistemic issues, securing the ability of all to contribute their ideas to the public discourse and have those ideas taken seriously. These arguments suggest that our epistemic projects are harmed when social relations conspire to either exclude particular knowers from relevant epistemic communities, or more insidiously deny them the credibility and epistemic respect they deserve within those communities. Epistemic improvement then, requires improvement to the structure of our social relations. Situations of oppression, and the marginalization of groups damage the epistemic potential of a community.

For many feminist social epistemologists, democracy is intimately connected to knowledge in another sense as well. Their arguments for the inevitable locatedness of all knowledge suggest that ultimately knowledge cannot be abstracted from the needs and interests of its producers (Haraway 1991; Harding 1991). Regardless of how diverse an epistemic community is, and how well it incorporates various viewpoints into the discussion, the knowledge produced will always represent some set of needs, goals, and interests. The goal of epistemic inquiry is not truths per se, but rather significant truths, and what is taken to be significant can only be answered with reference to the questions asked and the interests behind those questions (Anderson 1995b). If knowledge production can only be understood in relation to a given set of interests, it will continue be relevant to ask, as feminists have, "knowledge for whom?" There can be no legitimate assumption that the knowledge produced will serve the interests of all.

These feminist social epistemologists call for democratic goals to be invoked in guiding the direction of research. Sandra Harding, for example, calls for "the reinvention of sciences for the many to replace sciences that are often only for the elite few" (1991, 312). While recognizing that knowledge pursuits must be examined in their specificity, Lorraine Code argues for a guiding ecological principle of cohabitability in epistemic decision-making (2006). Ultimately, she argues, we should select directions of research and methods of research that permit and foster our living well amongst one another. Positions such as Harding's and Code's demonstrate a significant ramification of much of the work in feminist social epistemology: the break down of the traditional distinction between ethics and epistemology. Many of the feminist arguments pointing to the social aspects of knowing imply that choices need to be made concerning what knowledge we produce and how we produce it, with issues of responsibility being unavoidable (Code 1991, 2006; Heldke 2001). Given feminist arguments that such choices are implicated in epistemic justification and theory choice (Anderson 1995b; Longino 1990, 1996) these choices are properly viewed as both epistemic and ethical in nature.


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epistemology: social | feminist (interventions): epistemology and philosophy of science | scientific knowledge: social dimensions of