Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Folk Psychology as Mental Simulation

First published Mon Dec 8, 1997; substantive revision Mon Jun 22, 2009

The simulation (or, “mental simulation”) theory (ST) is a theory of everyday human psychological competence: that is, of the skills and resources people routinely call on in the anticipation, explanation, and social coordination of behavior. ST holds that we represent the mental states and processes of others by mentally simulating them, or generating similar states and processes in ourselves: thus, for example, anticipating another's solution to a theoretical or practical problem by solving the problem ourselves (with adjustments for evident disparities, e.g., in skill level). The basic idea is that if the resources our own brain uses to guide our own behavior can be modified to work as representations of other people, then we have no need to store general information about what makes people tick: We just do the ticking for them. Simulation is thus said to be process-driven rather than theory-driven (Goldman 1989).

What initially sparked philosophical interest in ST was that it seemed to challenge the “theory” theory (TT), the view that a tacit theory (a “folk” psychology) underlies psychological competence. Without this assumption, a major issue in the philosophy of mind would be baseless: namely, the debate between psychological realists, who thought folk psychology a fundamentally sound foundation for cognitive science, and eliminativists, who deemed it a fundamentally flawed theory.

Some writers characterize ST as an account of “mindreading,” or “mentalizing.” These terms are understood to mean the attribution of mental states and processes to others, where this entails the application of mental concepts (Nichols & Stich, Goldman). How much of our psychological competence can be attributed to concept-dependent mindreading is an empirical question. Some evidence suggests that its role may be quite limited (Gallagher 2007, Gallese 2007). However, mental concepts have been a traditional focus for philosophy of mind. Functionalism and its empirical counterpart, the theory theory, have carried on that tradition. Simulation theorists, however, need not follow suit. For example, we may internalize another's facial expression, even when we fail to “read” it and identify the emotion it expresses. The expression, resonating in our gut and on our own face (see Section 4, Neural Simulation), may tip the balance in our vicarious decision-making. Desires, too, may be internalized without being conceptualized as desires. Vicarious decision-making begins with the world as known to the simulator, and often (in young children, always) proceeds without adjustment for the agent's differing beliefs. (See Section 1 and Section 4, False Belief) These are examples of nonconceptual simulative representation — that is, simulation that does not require the application of mental concepts. What is of primary importance in simulation, it would seem, is not that we categorize another's states, but that we embody them. If this is correct, then ST is not open to the criticism (Gallagher 2007) that, like its traditional rival, TT, it is committed to concept-dependent mindreading as the sole or chief means of social understanding.

Unlike earlier controversies concerning the role of empathetic understanding and historical reenactment in the human sciences, current discussions of ST frequently appeal to empirical findings, including experimental results concerning the development of psychological competence in children and recent work in the fields of cognitive and social neuroscience (see Section 4).

1. What is Meant by “Simulation”?

In recent discussions of everyday “folk” psychology, the term “simulation” has, like the term “theory,” come to be used broadly and in a variety of ways. Simulation is usually equated with role-taking, or imaginatively “putting oneself in the other's place.” This metaphor is understood to embrace adoption of different spatial and temporal perspectives as well as other shifts in indexically specified situations (e.g., in social role, office, or kinship relations); and further, adoption of alternative character traits and similar exercises of dramatic impersonation. However, the starting point for simulation, and also the default state, is one in which the simulator makes no adjustments. Often there is no need to move from this initial position. There is no need to put oneself in the other's place, either situationally or epistemically, because one is, in all relevant respects, already there: e.g., the tornado is approaching not just you or me but us, and we have both heard, with joint attention, the warning siren.

Along with this person-level characterization of simulation, simulation is also conceived by most proponents in cognitive-scientific terms. It is assumed that in role-taking, one's own behavior control system is employed as a manipulable model of other such systems. (This is not to say that the “person” who is simulating is the model; rather, only that one's brain can be manipulated to model other persons.) The system is first taken off-line, so that the output is not actual behavior but only predictions or anticipations of behavior, and inputs and system parameters are accordingly not limited to those that would regulate one's own behavior. Although this sometimes results in vicarious decision-making, more typically it stops at the more modest goal of establishing which options would be attractive (so that one would not be surprised to find the other pursuing one of them) and which unattractive (so that one would be surprised to find the other pursuing any of them).

In cognitive neuroscience, the term “simulation” is used to denote the (usually automatic and unconscious) activation, in response to the observed behavior of another, of neural mechanisms associated with the production of like behavior in oneself. Alvin Goldman terms such mirroring processes “low-level” simulation, to contrast them with the typically voluntary and conscious putting oneself in the other's place discussed earlier (“high level” simulation). (See Section 4.)

Stephen Stich and Shaun Nichols, whose critical papers have clarified the issues and helped refine ST, urge that the term “simulation” be dropped in favor of a finer-grained terminology. However, important as precision is in formulating testable hypotheses, there may also be value in a broad, open-ended inquiry that asks how implementations of the top-down imaginative procedures that philosophers and psychologists describe might mesh with the bottom-up mechanisms that neuroscientists have recently discovered (Gallese 2001; Hurley 2004).

2. Origins and Varieties of Simulation Theory

Robert Gordon's article, “Folk Psychology as Simulation” (1986) criticized the theory theory and introduced simulation as offering a better account of human psychological competence. In the same year, Jane Heal (1986) independently criticized functionalism and the theory theory, arguing for “replication,” a process similar to simulation, as an alternative. In support of ST, Gordon discussed findings in developmental psychology concerning the development of the capacity to attribute false belief. This attracted the interest of developmental psychologists, especially Paul Harris, who presented empirical support of ST, and Allison Gopnik and Joseph Perner, who argued against it. (Perner has since come to defend a hybrid version of ST.)

Alvin Goldman was an early and influential defender of ST and has done much to give the theory its prominence. His work with the neuroscientist Vittorio Gallese was the first to posit an important connection between ST and the newly discovered mirror neurons. Goldman's book, Simulating Minds, is the clearest and most comprehensive account to date of the relevant philosophical and empirical issues. Among other philosophical proponents of ST, Gregory Currie has been influential, especially in discussions of imagery and aesthetics.

Two issues on which Gordon and Goldman disagree concern introspection and the relation between simulation and mental concepts. For Goldman, but not Gordon, it is essential that the simulating system recognize its own mental states. This recognition generally requires, according to Goldman, that the simulator possess the relevant mental state concept and have an experiential or introspective basis for applying it. Gordon takes the position stated in the introductory section, that simulation that does not require the application of mental concepts. Both would agree, of course, that concept possession is required for simulation-based mindreading, where this is by definition the application of mental concepts. However, Gordon has proposed that the ascription of mental states rests on the capacity to express mental states (and the extension of this capacity to simulated others). Examples of such expressions are un-self-conscious utterances such as these:

“I want this one” (spoken to the store clerk)

“(I believe) it's raining” (a modulated assertion that it is raining)

“I hope she'll be there!” (expressing a hope)

Such utterances, made without ascriptive intent, are in fact the way young children first employ the linguistic forms of propositional attitude ascription (Diessel and Tomasello, 2001); Tomasello and Rakoczy, 2003). For example, children first use “I want” merely as a way of getting what they want. Yet the resulting utterance, were it construed as an ascription, would generally be a true one. Thus, children are linguistically bootstrapped from expression to reliable self-ascription. The same should hold whether one is expressing one's own propositional attitude or vicariously expressing another's.

While no simulation theorist claims that all our everyday explanations and predictions of the actions of other people are based on role-taking, Heal in particular has been a moderating influence, arguing for a hybrid simulation-and-theory account that reserves simulation primarily for items with rationally linked content, such as beliefs, desires, and actions. Other philosophers and psychologists have since put forward hybrid accounts, usually with the suggestion that people rely on simulation in some contexts and theory in others (Currie, G. and Ravenscroft, I. 2002 Mitchell, J. P. 2005 Nichols & Stich 2003, Perner & Kuhberger 2005). One point worth attending to, however, is that what appears to be a hybrid may really be just a version of TT, or, alternatively, of ST. An example of the latter might say: We do use a theory or theories about what is “in” minds, selves, or subjects; but, unlike theories of what is “in” objects, including even complex computational systems, such theories are, as Gordon suggests, unintelligible without a generalized understanding of the first person and thus a capacity for simulative recentering.

3. The Parsimony Argument

The most important distinguishing feature of folk psychology, according to many theory theorists, is the central and essential role it gives to the semantic content of the states it posits, particularly the propositional or sentential “objects” of propositional attitudes such as beliefs, desires, and intentions. Most theory theorists try to accommodate this feature with the hypothesis that folk psychology comprises laws or principles that quantify over this content, connecting, for example, what x believes and what x desires to what x chooses to do. Moreover, the connections are said generally to mirror the semantic relations that hold among these contents, particularly relations that can be represented abstractly by rules of logic and rational argument such as modus ponens and the practical syllogism. Thus the theory theory posits an internal store of causal laws or principles corresponding to these rules. The following is the sort of principle one might call on to anticipate what a particular person will do, say, upon losing a credit card, given that undesirable consequences would ensue if they did not take action:

If S believes that if p, then (q unless S does x); and S desires that not-q; and S does not believe that if p and S does x, then something r will be the case such that S desires not-r more than S desires that p; etc.; then, ceteris paribus, probably S will do x.

It seems implausible, however, to suppose that we must invoke such principles when we anticipate our own behavior in future contingent or counterfactual situations. To answer the question, “What would you do if your credit card were missing?” one would more likely use a simulative strategy. This is not to say that such a strategy is foolproof, or that we never employ generalizations in our own case. However, the generalizations we do sometimes employ tend to be not theoretical but behavioral descriptions: e.g., “I always become fatalistic in such situations,” where “become fatalistic” and “such situations,” though highly interpreted culture-bound descriptions, are not theoretical in any sense amenable to the theory theory: They do not describe the inner workings of a cognitive behavior control system, and they certainly do not constitute laws corresponding to rules of logic and reason.

Insofar as the store of causal generalizations mirrors the set of rules our own thinking typically conforms to, the simulation theory appears to render it otiose. For whatever rules our own thinking typically conforms to, our thinking continues to conform to them within the context of simulation, unless, of course, adjustments are made to accommodate evident differences. In short, we can use our own reasoning as a model of the reasoning of beings that reason the way we do. In the light of this alternative, it is argued, the hypothesis that people must be endowed with a special stock of laws corresponding to rules of logic and reason appears unmotivated and unparsimonious.

4. Areas of Empirical Investigation

Four main areas of empirical investigation have been thought especially relevant to the debate:

Some philosophers think the simulation theory may shed light on issues in traditional philosophy of mind and language concerning intentionality, referential opacity, broad and narrow content, the nature of mental causation, Twin Earth problems, the problem of other minds, and the peculiarities of self-knowledge. Several philosophers have applied the theory to aesthetics, ethics, and philosophy of the social sciences. Success or failure of these efforts to answer philosophical problems may be considered empirical tests of the theory, in a suitably broad sense of “empirical.”


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Related Entries

folk psychology: as a theory | materialism: eliminative


A portion of this entry is excerpted, with permission, from “Simulation vs Theory Theory”, MIT Encyclopedia of Cognitive Science (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1999).