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Michel Foucault

First published Wed Apr 2, 2003; substantive revision Wed Sep 17, 2008

Michel Foucault (1926-1984) was a French historian and philosopher, associated with the structuralist and post-structuralist movements. He has had wide influence not only (or even primarily) in philosophy but also in a wide range of humanistic and social scientific disciplines.

1. Biographical Sketch

Foucault was born in Poitiers, France, on October 15, 1926. His student years seem to have been psychologically tormented but were intellectually brilliant. He became academically established during the 1960s, when he held a series of positions at French universities, before his election in 1969 to the ultra-prestigious Collège de France, where he was Professor of the History of Systems of Thought until his death. From the 1970s on, Foucault was very active politically. He was a founder of the Groupe d'information sur les prisons and often protested on behalf of homosexuals and other marginalized groups. He frequently lectured outside France, particularly in the United States, and in 1983 had agreed to teach annually at the University of California at Berkeley. An early victim of AIDS, Foucault died in Paris on June 25, 1984. In addition to works published during his lifetime, his lectures at the Collège de France, being published posthumously, contain important elucidations and extensions of his ideas.

It can be difficult to think of Foucault as a philosopher. His academic formation was in psychology and its history as much as in philosophy, his books were mostly histories of medical and social sciences, his passions were literary and political. Nonetheless, almost all of Foucault's works can be fruitfully read as philosophical in either or both of two ways: as a carrying out of philosophy's traditional critical project in a new (historical) manner; and as a critical engagement with the thought of traditional philosophers. This article will present him as a philosopher in these two dimensions.

2. Intellectual Background

Let us begin, however, with a sketch of the philosophical environment in which Foucault was educated. He entered the École Normale Supérieure (the standard launching pad for major French philosophers) in 1946, during the heyday of existential phenomenology. Merleau-Ponty, whose lectures he attended, and Heidegger were particularly important. Hegel and Marx were also major concerns, the first through the interpretation of his work offered by Jean Hyppolite and the latter through the structuralist reading of Louis Althusser—both teachers who had a strong impact on Foucault at the École Normale. It is, accordingly, not surprising that Foucault's earliest works (his long “Introduction” to Dream and Existence by Ludwig Binswanger, a Heideggerian psychiatrist, and Maladie mentale et personalité, a short book on mental illness) were written in the grip of, respectively, existentialism and Marxism. But he soon turned away quite decisively from both.

Although Jean-Paul Sartre, living and working outside the University system, had no personal influence on Foucault, the thought of him, as the French master-thinker preceding Foucault, is always in the background. Like Sartre, Foucault began from a relentless hatred of bourgeois society and culture and with a spontaneous sympathy for groups at the margins of the bourgeoisie (artists, homosexuals, prisoners, etc.). They were also similar in their interests in literature and psychology, as well as philosophy, and both, after a early relative lack of political interest, became strong activists. But in the end Foucault seemed to insist on defining himself in contradiction to Sartre. Philosophically, he rejected what he saw as Sartre's centralization of the subject (which he mocked as “transcendental narcissism”). Personally and politically, he rejected Sartre's role as what Foucault called the “universal intellectual”, judging a society in terms of transcendent principles. There is, however, a tincture of protesting too much in Foucault's separation of himself from Sartre, and the question of the relation of their work remains a fertile one.

Three other factors were of much more positive significance for the young Foucault. First, there was the French tradition of history and philosophy of science, particularly as represented by Georges Canguilhem, a powerful figure in the French University establishment, whose work in the history and philosophy of biology provided a model for much of what Foucault was later to do in the history of the human sciences. Canguilhem sponsored Foucault's doctoral thesis on the history of madness and, throughout Foucault's career, remained one of his most important and effective supporters. Canguilhem's approach to the history of science (an approach developed from the work of Gaston Bachelard), provided Foucault with a strong sense (Kuhnian avant la lettre) of the discontinuities in scientific history, along with a “rationalist” understanding of the historical role of concepts that made them independent of the phenomenologists' transcendental consciousness. Foucault found this understanding reinforced in the structuralist linguistics and psychology developed, respectively, by Ferdinand de Saussure and Jacques Lacan, as well as in Georges Dumézil's proto-structuralist work on comparative religion. These anti-subjective standpoints provide the context for Foucault's marginalization of the subject in his “structuralist histories”, The Birth of the Clinic (on the origins of modern medicine) and The Order of Things (on the origins of the modern human sciences).

In a quite different vein, Foucault was enthralled by French avant-garde literature, especially the writings of Georges Bataille and Maurice Blanchot, where he found the experiential concreteness of existential phenomenology without what he came to see as dubious philosophical assumptions about subjectivity. Of particular interest was this literature's evocation of “limit-experiences”, which push us to extremes where conventional categories of intelligibility begin to beak down.

This philosophical milieu provided materials for the critique of subjectivity and the corresponding “archaeological” and “genealogical” methods of writing history that inform Foucault's projects of historical critique, to which we now turn.

3. Foucault's Critiques of Historical Reason

Since its beginnings with Socrates, philosophy has typically involved the project of questioning the accepted knowledge of the day. Later, Locke, Hume, and especially, Kant developed a distinctively modern idea of philosophy as the critique of knowledge. Kant's great epistemological innovation was to maintain that the same critique that revealed the limits of our knowing powers could also reveal necessary conditions for their exercise. What might have seemed just contingent features of human cognition (for example, the spatial and temporal character of its objects) turn out to be necessary truths. Foucault, however, suggests the need to invert this Kantian move. Rather than asking what, in the apparently contingent, is actually necessary, he suggests asking what, in the apparently necessary, might be contingent. The focus of his questioning is the modern human sciences (biological, psychological, social). These purport to offer universal scientific truths about human nature that are, in fact, often mere expressions of ethical and political commitments of a particular society. Foucault's “critical philosophy” undermines such claims by exhibiting how they are just the outcome of contingent historical forces, and are not scientifically grounded truths.

3.1 History of Madness

The most striking example of this mode of Foucault's thought is his first major work, The History of Madness in the Classical Age (1961). This book originated in Foucault's academic study of psychology (a licence de psychologie in 1949 and a diplome de psycho-pathologie in 1952) and his work in a Parisian mental hospital, but it was mainly written during his post-graduate Wanderjahren (1955-59) through a succession of diplomatic/educational posts in Sweden, Germany, and Poland. A study of the emergence of the modern concept of “mental illness” in Europe, The History of Madness is formed from both Foucault's extensive archival work and his intense anger at what he saw as the moral hypocrisy of modern psychiatry. Standard histories saw the nineteenth-century medical treatment of madness (developed from the reforms of Pinel in France and the Tuke brothers in England) as an enlightened liberation of the mad from the ignorance and brutality of preceding ages. But, according to Foucault, the new idea that the mad were merely sick (“mentally” ill) and in need of medical treatment was not at all a clear improvement on earlier conceptions (e.g., the Renaissance idea that the mad were in contact with the mysterious forces of cosmic tragedy or the 17th-18th-century view of madness as a renouncing of reason). Moreover, he argued that the alleged scientific neutrality of modern medical treatments of insanity are in fact covers for controlling challenges to a conventional bourgeois morality. In short, Foucault argued that what was presented as an objective, incontrovertible scientific discovery (that madness is mental illness) was in fact the product of eminently questionable social and ethical commitments.

Foucault's next history, The Birth of the Clinic (1963) can similarly be read as a critique of modern clinical medicine. But the socio-ethical critique is muted (except for a few vehement passages), presumably because there is a substantial core of objective truth in medicine (as opposed to psychiatry) and so less basis for critique. As a result The Birth of the Clinic is much closer to a standard history of science, in the tradition of Canguilhem's history of concepts. The same is true of The Order of Things, which was controversial much more for its philosophical attacks on phenomenology (and Marxism) than for its complex and nuanced critique of the human sciences. But Foucault returns with full force to social critique in Discipline and Punish.

3.2 Archaeology and Genealogy

Discipline and Punish marks the transition to what commentators generally characterize as Foucault's “genealogical” period, in contrast to the preceding “archaeological” period. In 1969, he published The Archaeology of Knowledge, a methodological treatise that explicitly formulates what he took to be the implicit historical approach (“archaeology”) he deployed in The History of Madness, The Birth of the Clinic, and The Order of Things. The premise of the archaeological method is that systems of thought and knowledge (epistemes or discursive formations, in Foucault's terminology) are governed by rules, beyond those of grammar and logic, that operate beneath the consciousness of individual subjects and define a system of conceptual possibilities that determines the boundaries of thought in a given domain and period. So, for example, The History of Madness should, Foucault maintained, be read as an intellectual excavation of the radically different discursive formations that governed talk and thought about madness from the 17th through the 19th centuries. (Admittedly, his archaeological method was only adumbrated in this early work, but it was fully developed in The Order of Things.)

Archaeology was an essential method for Foucault because it supported a historiography that did not rest on the primacy of the consciousness of individual subjects; it allowed the historian of thought to operate at an unconscious level that displaced the primacy of the subject found in both phenomenology and in traditional historiography. However, archaeology's critical force was restricted to the comparison of the different discursive formations of different periods. Such comparisons could suggest the contingency of a given way of thinking by showing that previous ages had thought very differently (and, apparently, with as much effectiveness). But mere archaeological analysis could say nothing about the causes of the transition from one way of thinking to another and so had to ignore perhaps the most forceful case for the contingency of entrenched contemporary positions. Genealogy, the new method deployed in Discipline and Punish, was intended to remedy this deficiency.

Foucault intended the term “genealogy” to evoke Nietzsche's genealogy of morals, particularly with its suggestion of complex, mundane, inglorious origins — in no way part of any grand scheme of progressive history. The point of a genealogical analysis is to show that a given system of thought (itself uncovered in its essential structures by archaeology, which therefore remains part of Foucault's historiography) was the result of contingent turns of history, not the outcome of rationally inevitable trends.

3.3 History of the Prison

Discipline and Punish (1975)is a genealogical study of the development of the “gentler” modern way of imprisoning criminals rather than torturing or killing them. While recognizing the element of genuinely enlightened reform, Foucault particularly emphasizes how such reform also becomes a vehicle of more effective control: “to punish less, perhaps; but certainly to punish better”. He further argues that the new mode of punishment becomes the model for control of an entire society, with factories, hospitals, and schools modeled on the modern prison. We should not, however, think that the deployment of this model was due to the explicit decisions of some central controlling agency. In typically genealogical fashion, Foucault's analysis shows how techniques and institutions, developed for different and often quite innocuous purposes, converged to create the modern system of disciplinary power.

At the core of Foucault's picture of modern “disciplinary” society are three primary techniques of control: hierarchical observation, normalizing judgment, and the examination. To a great extent, control over people (power) can be achieved merely by observing them. So, for example, the tiered rows of seats in a stadium not only makes it easy for spectators to see but also for guards or security cameras to scan the audience. A perfect system of observation would allow one “guard” to see everything (a situation approximated, as we shall see, in Jeremy Bentham's Panopticon). But since this is not usually possible, there is a need for “relays” of observers, hierarchically ordered, through whom observed data passes from lower to higher levels.

A distinctive feature of modern power (disciplinary control) is its concern with what people have not done (nonobservence), with, that is, a person's failure to reach required standards. This concern illustrates the primary function of modern disciplinary systems: to correct deviant behavior. The goal is not revenge (as in the case of the tortures of premodern punishment) but reform, where, of course, reform means coming to live by society's standards or norms. Discipline through imposing precise norms (“normalization”) is quite different from the older system of judicial punishment, which merely judges each action as allowed by the law or not allowed by the law and does not say that those judged are “normal” or “abnormal”. This idea of normalization is pervasive in our society: e.g., national standards for educational programs, for medical practice, for industrial processes and products.

The examination (for example, of students in schools, of patients in hospitals) is a method of control that combines hierarchical observation with normalizing judgment. It is a prime example of what Foucault calls power/knowledge, since it combines into a unified whole “the deployment of force and the establishment of truth” (184). It both elicits the truth about those who undergo the examination (tells what they know or what is the state of their health) and controls their behavior (by forcing them to study or directing them to a course of treatment).

On Foucault's account, the relation of power and knowledge is far closer than in the familiar Baconian engineering model, for which “knowledge is power” means that knowledge is an instrument of power, although the two exist quite independently. Foucault's point is rather than, at least for the study of human beings, the goals of power and the goals of knowledge cannot be separated: in knowing we control and in controlling we know.

The examination also situates individuals in a “field of documentation”. The results of exams are recorded in documents that provide detailed information about the individuals examined and allow power systems to control them (e.g., absentee records for schools, patients' charts in hospitals). On the basis of these records, those in control can formulate categories, averages, and norms that are in turn a basis for knowledge. The examination turns the individual into a “case”—in both senses of the term: a scientific example and an object of care; caring is always also an opportunity for control.

Bentham's Panopticon is, for Foucault, an ideal architectural model of modern disciplinary power. It is a design for a prison, built so that each inmate is separated from and invisible to all the others (in separate “cells”) and each inmate is always visible to a monitor situated in a central tower. Monitors will not in fact always see each inmate; the point is that they could at any time. Since inmates never know whether they are being observed, they must act as if they are always objects of observation. As a result, control is achieved more by the internal monitoring of those controlled than by heavy physical constraints.

The principle of the Panopticon can be applied not only to prisons but to any system of disciplinary power (a factory, a hospital, a school). And, in fact, although Bentham himself was never able to build it, its principle has come to pervade every aspect of modern society. It is the instrument through which modern discipline has replaced pre-modern sovereignty (kings, judges) as the fundamental power relation.

3.4 History of Modern Sexuality

Foucault's history of sexuality was originally projected as a fairly straightforward extension of the genealogical approach of Discipline and Punish to the topic of sexuality. Foucault's idea is that the various modern bodies of knowledge about sexuality (various “sciences of sexuality”, including psychoanalysis) have an intimate association with the power structures of modern society and so are prime candidates for genealogical analysis. The first volume of this project, published in 1976, was intended as the introduction to a series of studies on particular aspects of modern sexuality (children, women, “perverts”, population, etc.) It outlined the project of the overall history, explaining the basic viewpoint and the methods to be used.

On Foucault's account, modern control of sexuality parallels modern control of criminality by making sex (like crime) an object of allegedly scientific disciplines, which simultaneously offer knowledge and domination of their objects. However, it becomes apparent that there is a further dimension in the power associated with the sciences of sexuality. Not only is there control exercised via others' knowledge of individuals; there is also control via individuals' knowledge of themselves. Individuals internalize the norms laid down by the sciences of sexuality and monitor themselves in an effort to conform to these norms. Thus, they are controlled not only as objects of disciplines but also as self-scrutinizing and self-forming subjects.

For all their interest and importance, Foucault's critiques are not so much philosophy in the traditional sense as they are a matter of achieving a traditional philosophical goal — the critique of contemporary claims to knowledge — by new (historical) means. There are, however, also aspects of his work that directly engage standard philosophical topics, particular those tied to the central epistemological issue of representation. In particular, he offers, in The Order of Things, a detailed analysis of the question of representation from Descartes through Kant. This is, far and away, his most sustained piece of traditionally philosophical analysis and as such deserves our close attention.

4. Representation in Modern Philosophy

For Foucault, representation is not just one of many modern philosophical problems. Like many interpreters, he regards philosophical thought from Descartes on centering on the problem of knowledge. More distinctively (but consistent with the views of, for example, Heidegger), he sees representation as at the heart of the question of knowledge.

4.1 Classical Representation

Foucault argues that from Descartes up to Kant (during what the French call the Classical Age), representation was simply identified with thought: to think just was to employ ideas to represent the object of thought. But, he says, we need to be clear about what it meant for an idea to represent an object. This was not, first of all, any sort of relation of resemblance: there were no features (properties) of the idea that themselves constituted the representation of the object. (Saying this, however, does not require that the idea itself have no properties or even that these properties are not relevant to the idea's representation of the object.) By contrast, during the Renaissance, knowledge was understood as a matter of resemblance between signs.

The map is a useful model of Classical representation. It consists, for example, of a set of lines of varying widths, lengths, and colors, and thereby represent the roads in and around a city. This is not because the roads have the properties of the map (the widths, lengths, and colors of the lines) but because the abstract structure given in the map (the relations among the lines) duplicate the abstract structure of the roads. At the heart of Classical thought is the principle that we know in virtue of having ideas that, in this sense, represent what we know. Of course, in contrast to the map, we do not need to know what the actual features of our ideas are in virtue of which they are able to represent. (In Descartes' scholastic terminology, we do not need to know their “formal reality”.) We need to know only the abstract structure that they share with the things they represent (the structure of what Descartes calls their “objective reality”). We do, however, have direct (introspective) access to the abstract structures of our ideas: we can “see” what representational structure they have. Further, we can alter an idea's structure to make it a better representation of an object, as we can alter a map to improve it.

How, on the Classical view, do we know that an idea is a representation of an object—and an adequate representation? Not, Foucault argues, by comparing the idea with the object as it is apart from its representation. This is impossible, since it would require knowing the object without a representation (when, for Classical thought, to know is to represent). The only possibility is that the idea itself must make it apparent that it is a representation. The idea represents the very fact that it is a representation. As to the question of whether an idea is a representation, this “self-referential” feature is all there is to it. As to adequacy, it must be that some subset of ideas likewise bear witness to their own adequacy—as, for example, Descartes' “clear and distinct perceptions” or Hume's simple impressions. In this sense, early modern philosophy must always be based on “intuition” (intellectual or sensory). Note, however, that an “intuition” of an idea's adequacy does not, of itself, establish the independent existence of the object represented by the idea. As far as the early modern view is concerned, there may be no such objects; or, if there are, this needs to be established by some other means (e.g., an argument or some other sort of intuition).

We see, then, that for Foucault the key to Classical knowing is the idea; that is, mental representation. Classical thinkers could disagree about the actual ontological status of ideas (their formal reality); but they all had to agree that as representations (epistemically, if not ontologically) they were “non-physical” and “non-historical”; that is, precisely as representing their objects, they could not be conceived as having any role in the causal networks of the natural or the human worlds. From this it further followed that language—precisely as a physical and/or historical reality—could have no fundamental role in knowledge. Language could be nothing more than a higher-order instrument of thought: a physical representation of ideas, having no meaning except in relation to them.

4.2. Kant's Critique of Classical Representation

Foucault maintains that the great “turn” in modern philosophy occurs when, with Kant (though no doubt he is merely an example of something much broader and deeper), it becomes possible to raise the question of whether ideas do in fact represent their objects and, if so, how (in virtue of what) they do so. In other words, ideas are no longer taken as the unproblematic vehicles of knowledge; it is now possible to think that knowledge might be (or have roots in) something other than representation. This did not mean that representation had nothing at all to do with knowledge. Perhaps some (or even all) knowledge still essentially involved ideas' representing objects. But, Foucault insists, the thought that was only now (with Kant) possible was that representation itself (and the ideas that represented) could have an origin in something else.

This thought, according to Foucault, led to some important and distinctively modern possibilities. The first was that developed by Kant himself, who thought that representations (thoughts or ideas) were themselves the product of (“constituted” by) the mind. Not, however, produced by the mind as a natural or historical reality, but as belonging to a special epistemic realm: transcendental subjectivity. Kant thus maintained the Classical insistence that knowledge cannot be understood as a physical or historical reality, but he located the grounds of knowledge in a domain (the transcendental) more fundamental than the ideas it subtended. (We must add, of course, that Kant also did not think of this domain as possessing a reality beyond the historical and the physical; it was not metaphysical. But this metaphysical alternative was explored by the idealistic metaphysics that followed Kant) Another—and in some ways more typically modern—view was that ideas were themselves historical realities. This could be most plausibly developed by making ideas essentially tied to language (as in, for example, Herder), now regarded as the primary (and historicized) vehicle of knowledge. But such an approach was not viable in its pure form, since to make knowledge entirely historical would deprive it of any normative character and so destroy its character as knowledge. In other words, even when modern thought makes knowledge essentially historical, it must retain some functional equivalent of Kant's transcendental realm to guarantee the normative validity of knowledge.

4.3 Language and “Man”

At this point, The Order of Things introduces the two central features of thought after Kant: the return of language and the “birth of man”. Our discussion above readily explains why Foucault talks of a return of language: it now has an independent and essential role that it couldn't have as the mere instrument of Classical ideas. But the return is not a monolithic phenomenon. Language is related to knowledge in diverse ways, and to each there corresponds a distinctive sort of “return”. So, for example, the history of natural languages has introduced confusions and distortions that we can try to eliminate through techniques of formalization. On the other hand, this same history may have deposited fundamental truths in our languages that we can unearth only by the methods of hermeneutic interpretation. (So these two apparently opposed approaches — underlying the division of analytic and continental philosophy — are in fact, according to Foucault, complementary projects of modern thought.) But there is yet another possibility: freed from its subordination to ideas, language can be treated (as it had been in the Renaissance) as an autonomous reality — indeed as even more deeply autonomous than Renaissance language, since there is no system of resemblances binding it to the world. In this sense, language is a truth unto itself, speaking nothing other than its own meaning. This is the realm of “pure literature”, evoked by Mallarmé when he answered Nietzsche's (genealogical) question, “Who is speaking?” with, “Language itself”. In contrast to the Renaissance, however, there is no divine Word underlying and giving unique truth to the words of language. Literature is literally nothing but language — or rather many languages, speaking for and of themselves.

Even more important than language is the figure of man. The most important point about “man” is that it is an epistemological concept. Man, Foucault says, did not exist during the Classical age (or before). This is not because there was no idea of human beings as a species or of human nature as a psychological, moral, or political notion. Rather, “there was no epistemological consciousness of man as such” (The Order of Things, 309). But even “epistemological” needs construal. There is no doubt that even in the Classical age human beings were conceived as the locus of knowledge (i.e., it is humans who possessed the ideas that represented the world). Man, on the other hand, is an epistemological notion in the Kantian sense of a transcendental subject that is also an empirical object. For the Classical age, men are the locus of representations but not, as for Kant, their source. There is, in Classical thought, no room for the modern notion of “constitution”.

Foucault illustrates his point through a striking discussion of Descartes' cogito, showing why it is an indubitable certitude within the classical episteme, but not within the modern episteme. There are two ways of questioning the force of the cogito. One is to suggest that the subject (the thinking self, the I) that Descartes concludes exists is something more than just the act of representing objects; so we can't go from representation to a thinker. But for the Classical Age this makes no sense, since thinking is representation. A second criticism would be that the self as representer may not be “really real” but merely the “product of” (constituted by) a mind that is real in a fuller sense. But this objection has weight only if we can think of this “more real” mind as having the self as an object in some sense other than representing it. (Otherwise, there is no basis for saying that the self as representer is “less real”.) But, once again, this is precisely what cannot be thought in Classical terms.

4.4 The Analytic of Finitude

At the very heart of man is his finitude: the fact that, as described by the modern empirical sciences, he is limited by the various historical forces (organic, economic, linguistic) operating on him. This finitude is a philosophical problem because, this same historically limited empirical being must also somehow be the source of the representations whereby we know the empirical world, including ourselves as empirical beings. I (my consciousness) must, as Kant put it, be both an empirical object of representation and the transcendental source of representations. How is this possible? Foucault's view is that, in the end, it isn't — and that the impossibility (historically realized) means the collapse of the modern episteme. What Foucault calls the “analytic of finitude” sketches the historical case for this conclusion, examining the major efforts (together making up the heart of modern philosophy) to answer the question.

The question — and the basic strategy for answering it — go back, of course, to Kant, who put forward the following crucial idea: that the very factors that make us finite (our subjection to space, time, causality, etc.) are also conditions necessary for the possibility of knowledge. Our finitude is, therefore, simultaneously founded and founding (positive and fundamental, as Foucault puts it). The project of modern (Kantian and post-Kantian) philosophy — the analytic of finitude — is to show how this is possible.

Some modern philosophy tries to resolve the problem of man by, in effect, reducing the transcendental to the empirical. For example, positivism attempts to explain knowledge in terms of natural science (physics, biology), while Marxism appeals to historical social sciences. (The difference is that the first grounds knowledge in the past — e.g., an evolutionary history — whereas the second grounds it in a revolutionary future that will transcend the limitations of ideology.) Either approach simply ignores the terms of the problem: that man must be regarded as irreducibly both empirical and transcendental.

It might seem that Husserl's phenomenology has carried out the Kantian project of synthesizing man as object and man as subject by radicalizing the Cartesian project; that is, by grounding our knowledge of empirical truths in the reality of the transcendental subject. The problem, however, is that the modern notion of man excludes Descartes' idea of the cogito as a “sovereign transparency” of pure consciousness. Thought is no longer pure representation and therefore cannot be separated from an “unthought” (i.e., the given empirical and historical truths about who we are). I can no longer go from “I think” to “I am” because the content of my reality (what I am) is always more than the content of any merely thinking self (I am, e.g., living, working, and speaking—and all these take me beyond the realm of mere thought). Or, putting the point in the reverse way, if we use “I” to denote my reality simply as a conscious being, then I “am not” much of what I (as a self in the world) am. As a result, to the extent that Husserl has grounded everything in the transcendental subject, this is not the subject (cogito) of Descartes but the modern cogito, which includes the (empirical) unthought that is part of man's reality. Phenomenology, like all modern thought, must accept the unthought as the ineliminable “other” of man. Nor are the existential phenomenologists (Sartre and Merleau-Ponty) able to solve the problem. Unlike Husserl, they avoid positing a transcendental ego and instead focus on the concrete reality of man-in-the world. But this, Foucault claims, is just a more subtle way of reducing the transcendental to the empirical.

Finally, some philosophers (Hegel and Marx in one way, Nietzsche and Heidegger in another) have tried to resolve the problem of man's dual status by treating him as a historical reality. But this move encounters the difficulty that man has to be both a product of historical processes and the origin of history. If we treat man as a product, we find ourselves reducing his reality to something non-human (this is what Foucault calls the “retreat” from man's origin). But if we insist on a “return” to man as his own proper origin, then we can no longer make sense of his place in the empirical world. This paradox may explain the endless modern obsession with origins, but there is never any way out of the contradiction between man as originator and man as originated. Nonetheless, Foucault thinks that the modern pursuit of the question of origins has provided us with a deeper sense of the ontological significance of time, particularly in the thought of Nietzsche and Heidegger, who reject Hegel's and Marx's view of the return to our origin as a redemptive fullness of being, and instead see it as a confrontation with the nothingness of our existence.

5. Philosophy and Ancient Sexuality

Foucault's final engagement with traditional philosophy arises from the rather surprising turn toward the ancient world he took in the last few years of his life. The History of Sexuality had been planned as a multi-volume work on various themes in a study of modern sexuality. The first volume, discussed above, was a general introduction. Foucault wrote, but never published, a second volume (The Confessions of the Flesh) that dealt with the origins of the modern notion of the subject in the practices of Christian confession. His concern was that a proper understanding of the Christian development required a comparison with ancient conceptions of the ethical self, something he undertook in his last two books (1984) on Greek and Roman sexuality: The Use of Pleasure and The Care of the Self .

These treatments of ancient sexuality moved Foucault into ethical issues that had been implicit but seldom explicitly thematized in his earlier writings. His specific goal was to compare ancient pagan and Christian ethics through the test-case of sexuality and to trace the development of Christian ideas about sex from the very different ideas of the ancients. On Foucault's account the great contrast was between the Christian view that sexual acts were, on the whole, evil in themselves and the Greek view that they were goods, natural and necessary, though subject to abuse. As a result, instead of the Christian moral code forbidding most forms of sexual activity (and severely restricting the rest), the ancient Greeks emphasized the proper use (chresis) of pleasures, where this involved engaging in the full range of sexual activities (heterosexual, homosexual, in marriage, out of marriage), but with proper moderation. So understood, sex for the Greeks was a major part of what Foucault called an “aesthetics of the self”: the self's creation of a beautiful and enjoyable existence.

These studies of ancient sexuality, and, particularly, the idea of an aesthetics of the self, led Foucault to the ancient idea of philosophy as a way of life rather than a search for theoretical truth. Although there is some discussion in The Use of Pleasure of Plato's conception of philosophy, Foucault's treatments of the topic are primarily in lectures (in the 1980s) at the Collège de France and at Berkeley; he had no time to develop them for publication. In the Collège de France lectures, he discusses Socrates (in the Apology and in Alcibiades I) as both a model and a exponent of a philosophical life focused on “care of the self” and follows the subsequent ancient discussions of this topic in, for example, Epictetus, Seneca, and Plutarch. The Berkeley lectures deal with the ancient ideal of “truthful speaking” (parrhesia), regarded as a central political and moral virtue. Here Foucault discusses earlier formulations of the notion, in Euripides and Socrates, as well as its later transformations by the Epicureans, Stoics, and Cynics. These two sets of lectures provide rich materials for what might well have been the most fruitful of all Foucault's engagements with traditional philosophy. But his early death in 1984 prevented him from completing the project.


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