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Abraham Ibn Ezra

First published Tue Dec 19, 2006

All histories of Jewish philosophy include an entry on Abraham Ibn Ezra, and, judging from his impact on the field, he certainly deserves the recognition that he has received. Just how he earned it, however, poses a difficult historical problem. Ibn Ezra contributed virtually nothing to any of the branches of philosophy; he authored little in the way of strictly philosophical tracts and, indeed, there is no reason for us to suppose that he enjoyed any rigorous training in philosophy. Yet he certainly left his mark on Jewish thought, and his pronouncements are recorded and treated with respect by those who came after him.

Ibn Ezra's philosophical legacy consists in the main of the following, rather short list of doctrines. The deity governs the terrestrial world by means of the heavenly bodies. Humans toil under astral destiny; though the stars are subservient, formally at least, to God, their domination over the material universe is for all practical purposes complete. Neither the precise structure of the human soul, nor the mode of its bonding with the body, may be known with certainty. However, one component or aspect of the human soul is of the same fiber as the supernal realm that is above the stars; nothing in existence is more similar to God. Nurturing this spiritual component offers the one hope of refuge from this world. Ibn Ezra's poetry in particular gives very powerful expression to the themes of the soul's alienation and longing to return to its heavenly abode. To be sure, weighty questions are involved in all of these teachings, but Ibn Ezra does not take any of them up in depth.

In sum, it appears that Ibn Ezra, much like Sa‘adiah—the Jewish thinker who influenced him most strongly—adopted a mix of kalam and philosophical doctrines. There simply is no evidence that he trained in philosophy or studied anything more than a small sampling of the literature available in his day, which was considerable. His acknowledged sources are nearly all brief, gaonic, writings, which display the first grapplings of medieval Jewry with theological issues.

Nonetheless, Ibn Ezra achieved the status of the sage whose remarks, curt and enigmatic thought they may be, carry weight and authority. In a way, his role in philosophy, or, perhaps better put, in spreading certain philosophical teachings, is not that different from the one he played in mathematics, astronomy, and astrology. He copious writings on those subjects are not distinguished by any depth or originality; yet there can be no doubt that their role was pivotal in the spread of knowledge throughout Europe, most especially within the Jewish communities, though by no means limited to them. While not pretending to offer a complete and completely satisfying answer, we suggest a combination of factors that facilitated his success: industriousness, wide travels, the very popular vehicle of bible commentary, rational thought that gives a prominent place to astrology, and a soteriology that focuses upon the individual rather than the collective.

1. Life and Works

Ibn Ezra was likely born in or around 1093 in Tudela, at that time within the northern reaches of Muslim Spain. There he passed the first five decades of his life, apparently eking out his living as a poet. Like so many other Jews, he fled Spain in the face of the Almohade onslaughts of 1140. For the next three decades he wandered through Europe, spending time in Rome, Lucca, Rouen, London, and Béziers. Nearly all of the substantial body of writing that he left behind dates to this period. The names of a few of his students, correspondents, rivals, and patrons are known. We are rather well-informed about Ibn Ezra's relationship with Judah Halevi; their exchanges are very instructive for the history of Jewish philosophy, and we will return to them below. On the other hand, none of his disciples (who in any event do not seem to have been numerous) has clarified for us any of the “secrets” that Ibn Ezra is fond to refer to.

Ibn Ezra's literary legacy consists of short and extremely popular handbooks in a wide variety of fields: grammar and poetics, astrology and arithmetic, astronomy and religious speculations, as well as both short and lengthier biblical commentaries. Most of his astrological tracts circulate in at least two versions. Manuscripts number in many dozens. The biblical commentaries are also found in very manuscripts, and they are included in the margins of numerous printings. On the other hand, there are relatively few critical editions of his writings. (For the most recent inventory of primary sources and secondary studies, see Sela and Freudenthal 2006). Several long excursuses, for example to Exodus 3:15 or Exodus 33:21, recap his statements on the main issues. Yesod Mora, a monograph on the rationale underlying the biblical commandments written very late in his life, also contains a full statement of Ibn Ezra's teachings.

Two other short treatises have each a peculiar focus. Sefer ha-Shem is an enigmatic treatise on God's proper names written out with the Hebrew letters AHYH and YHWY. The basic idea is that the special properties of the numbers associated with these letters, their phonetic qualities, grammatical functions and graphic representations, all convey information about the godhead. Thus, for instance, one (A, aleph) is the foundation of number, but not a number itself; both five (H, heh) and six (W, waw) repeat themselves as the final digit in all higher powers; and ten (Y, yod) is the beginning of the next order in the decimal system. All this seems to indicate the unchanging aspect of the divine in its successive manifestations. The same collection of ideas is found in non-philosophical writings, for example, the grammatical treatise Sefer Zahut.

Sefer ha-Ehad is Ibn Ezra's venture in arithmology. Like the writings of Nicomachus of Gerasa and Philo, as well as a relatively short list of medieval Muslim and Jewish authors, Sefer ha-Ehad follows the Pythagorean tradition of listing which natural, mathematical, and other items, come in two's, three's, etc. The two most “philosophical” of his writings are Hayy ben Meqitz, a poetic visionary recital to be discussed in a separate section below, and Arugat ha-Bosem. The latter is also poetic in style. The doctrine it presents, for example atomism, is very much part and parcel of the kalam tradition, rather than philosophy, strictly speaking. For that reason, Ibn Ezra's authorship has been called into question (Greive 1973, 181-189, including German translation of the entire text).  

The two strongest influences on Ibn Ezra's thought are the anonymous tract known as Sefer Yesira and Sa‘adiah Gaon. The former is his acknowledged source for surveying reality according to three parallel schemes: Hebrew letters, numbers, and the cosmos. Sa‘adiah is cited very frequently, over thirty times in the commentary to the Torah alone. Some medieval writers cite from a commentary to Sefer Yesira that they ascribe to Ibn Ezra. Paul Fenton [2001] has recently argued that the text in question is a Hebrew condensation of the commentary by Dunash Ibn Tamîm, originally written in Arabic, and that Ibn Ezra may indeed have prepared the Hebrew version. However, Dunash was a student of Isaac Israeli, who strongly criticized Sa‘adiah's commentary to Sefer Yesira. Thus Ibn Ezra may, unwittingly, have drawn most heavily upon two divergent streams of thought.

A few other sources are named in Yesod Mora: Shi‘ur Qoma, a cryptic writing that, like Sefer Yesira, nourished a good deal of speculation, much of it mystical, and a certain Sefer ha-Yihud, which is not extant. These works date to the gaonic period which, in Jewish historiography, corresponds to very late antiquity and the early Middle Ages. All in all, then, the sources that Ibn Ezra cites by name are a mix of gaonic kalam and proto-kabbalistic mysticism. Ibn Ezra adopted the literary format of early gaonic texts for those of his writings that can be called philosophical. Yesod Mora and Sefer ha-Shem, “The Book of the [Divine] Name”, are dense and cryptic, much like Sefer Yesira and Shi‘ur Qoma.

Throughout his life Ibn Ezra continued to write poetry in a wide variety of styles. Some of his liturgies make use of concepts drawn from medieval psychology. However, it is not so much the display of terminology, as it is the deep, powerful and sincere longings for liberation and the divine that are instructive for an appreciation of his thought. Ibn Ezra was no schoolman, but he certainly experienced, and expressed in rich and evocative Hebrew, a deep alienation from mundane reality and passionate longing to return to the spiritual realm.

2. Astrology

The central place of astrology in Ibn Ezra's thought must be singled out here. The query of the rabbis of Provence to Maimonides about the legitimacy of astrology was most likely prompted by the spread of Ibn Ezra's astrological teachings (Sela 2004). Though the query and Maimonides' response both turned upon the interpretation of traditional texts and their legal implications, de rigueur in correspondence of this sort, one finds here new probings into issues such as free will and divine governance. Ibn Ezra spurred a reassessment of Jewish positions on these points.

Astrology was one of Ibn Ezra's major interests, and it plays an important role in his thought (Sela 2001, mainly for bibliography; Goldstein 1996, for precise contents analysis). Briefly—in fact, as we have repeatedly noted, Ibn Ezra's expositions are always brief, with little argumentation—Ibn Ezra considers the material universe to be divided into celestial and terrestrial realms, the latter totally under the sway of the former. Humans can link up to a third, divine and super-celestial realm, thus outmaneuvering the stars, so to speak. However, more often than not, this will bring no relief to one's earthly plight; in any case, pessimism of this sort informs Ibn Ezra's commentary to Ecclesiastes. Ibn Ezra advocates a Stoic-like faith: the connection to the world “above the stars” affords one the spiritual stamina to endure whatever earthly misery the stars may dish out (Langermann 1993).

There is no difference between Jews and non-Jews with regard to astral governance. Here again, Ibn Ezra, in his biblical commentaries, was vague enough to give the impression that Jews alone are free of the stars, thus ingratiating himself to those many of his readers who were disposed to thinking that way. However, in his astrological writings, the Jews are no different from other peoples, in that they too are associated with certain planets and signs; this point was not lost upon his super-commentators. Ibn Ezra's astrology, like his philosophy overall, is humanist and universal, not Jewish and particularist.

Astrology offered a rational explanation for some biblical commandments, particularly animal sacrifices. True, over a millennium had passed since the Temple temple rituals had ceased. However, new conceptions of worship led Jews to wonder why such acts had ever been needed. In addition, new conceptions of Scripture caused Jews to ask why the details of the sacrifices had been recorded in the Torah, all of whose teachings were thought to be of permanent value, even if the rites themselves were no longer performed. Astrology provided a rationale: a practical reason for doing these performances as long as the Temple stood, and a lesson in the way the cosmos functions whose value endures even after the Temple's destruction. It should be added, however, that there is no evidence at all that these explanations inspired calls for the restoration of sacrifice. Ibn Ezra's followers were content merely to ponder these truths. Ironically, perhaps, the messianic drive exhibited itself more in the thought of Judah Halevi whose basic outlook, as we shall see, was diametrically opposed to that of Ibn Ezra.

3. Impact

Ibn Ezra's impact was swift and powerful. In the various communities through which he sojourned, the Arabic learning which he was able to present in consumable form was widely read. As a cultural mediator, particularly of astronomy and astrology, his contributions to Christian civilization were no less remarkable than those to his coreligionists. [See in particular Burnett 1997] Indeed, Ibn Ezra may well be the most important cultural broker of the medieval period. His writings in astrology, arithmetic, Hebrew grammar and poetics, and Jewish thought all fall far short of the highest achievements set by Judaeo-Arabic culture in al-Andalus. Yet no one succeeded more than Ibn Ezra in spreading the fruits of this culture so widely and deeply.

This seems to be the main reason why he has secured his place in the history of Jewish philosophy. Even in those domains where he has relatively much to say, for example, the theory of the soul, he draws upon stock notions that were widespread (especially among poets), and which by no means demonstrate a thorough education in philosophy, let alone the skill and propensity to philosophize. Historians of Jewish liturgy such as Jefim Schirmann have pointed out that Ibn Ezra was harping on themes that had been favorites of Jewish poets for generations. He exhibits a familiarity with many technical terms, and on occasion broaches some issues; however, he has left us no penetrating discussions, or anything of the sort that would demonstrate his mastery of the subject. Thus, for example, in his gloss to Exodus 23:30, he observes that we do not whether the soul is substance or accident, whether it survives the death of the body, nor why it has been bonded to the body in the first place. However, one can hardly find, if at all, any substantive discussions on any of these three questions; he tells us nothing about the options, their implications, or why the inquiry must end at an impasse.

For many Jews, Ibn Ezra was the spokesman of Hispano-Jewish culture, the personification of the “Sefardi” sage. His readers were led to believe that the prestige of Andalusian culture stood behind Ibn Ezra's pronouncements on issues such as the nature of the soul or free will, and that the Torah could and should be read in a manner that accommodates Ibn Ezra's views.

Ibn Ezra's use of the biblical commentary as a vehicle for the dissemination of his teachings was undoubtedly a major factor in his success. His commentary (actually two are preserved for several books) was a concise gloss, offering to his audiences a witty and critical selection of lexical and grammatical insights concerning the “plain” meaning of the text; this is the mode of interpretation that he expressly endorses. Ibn Ezra spiced his commentary with occasional references to a sod, meaning either (or both?) a secret, i.e. esoteric message ensconced in the bible—Ibn Ezra will teasingly pull at the veil, but never remove it—or a fundamental belief (sod thus being equivalent to yesod). Ibn Ezra prefaced his commentary with a lengthy essay on the four improper, and the one proper, way to go about interpreting the Torah. Finally, he dispersed a number of fairly long digressions, self-standing essays in their own right, in which, in which he generally rehearsed the gamut of his trademark views on grammar, arithmology, and astrology.

Ibn Ezra's commentary, mostly by virtue of the terse, enticing, yet thoroughly obtuse sodot, spawned a huge satellite literature (Simon 1993). These “supercommentaries” constitute one of the major branches of Jewish philosophical literature of the fourteenth century. As a rule, they tend to interpret Ibn Ezra along similar lines, emphasizing, for example, astral governance and the magical aspects of ritual. Yet Ibn Ezra succeeded in some sense in making himself all things to all people. The supercommentators as a rule find Ibn Ezra to be expounding a univeralist, or humanitarian, philosophy that shares much with, and draws much from, non-Jewish thought. On the other hand, Moses Nahmanides, an important exegete in his own right, a very astute reader of texts, and a staunch opponent of Aristotle, professed his “open hostility and concealed love” for Ibn Ezra. He loved many of Ibn Ezra's “hints” which, Nahmanides felt, were in line with his own kabbalistic tendencies.

Estimations of Ibn Ezra as a philosopher peaked in the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries (see characterizations). Glosses to his Torah commentary, some of them quite extensive, were written throughout the Mediterranean basin (Simon 1993). Ibn Ezra's writings became known within Arabic speaking communities as well. At least one of these supercommentaries was written in Judaeo-Arabic, and Ibn Ezra is cited, for example, by Abraham Maimonides in his own commentary to the Torah. Byzantine Jewish scholars in particular applied themselves to the entire corpus of Ibn Ezra's philosophical writings. Mordecai Khoumtianou (Comteano) wrote commentaries to Yesod Mora and Sefer ha-Shem, doing his best to read Ibn Ezra along the lines of the (basically Aristotelian) philosophy that he felt most comfortable with.

Levi ben Gerson, certainly one of the most systematic and original thinkers in the medieval Jewish tradition, will cite Abraham Ibn Ezra just as respectfully as he does Moses Maimonides. Consider, for example, his discussion of God's knowledge, especially the thorny question whether God knows a particular event befalling an individual per se, or whether He knows that event only “generally”, that is, by way of His knowledge of the “ordering of events, insofar as these events are ordered.” Levi argues in favor of the second option, and at the end of the chapter, suggests that both Maimonides and Ibn Ezra would agree with him. For Maimonides' view Levi can refer to the sustained discussion in Guide of the Perplexed 3.20; but for Ibn Ezra, he cites only the laconic comment to Genesis 18:21, which states: “The truth is that He knows every particular generally, not as a particular.”[1] It seems particularly noteworthy that Levi musters both Maimonides and Ibn Ezra for support for the claim that his own view does not contradict the Torah; both authorities are exploited, not for their argumentation on the issue, but rather for their reputation as exegetes. 

Ibn Ezra never fell into oblivion, and his writings generated interest in a wide variety of cultural and historical settings. However, there were significant shifts in the perception of his place in Jewish thought. Thus Judah Moscato, the sixteenth century Venetian savant and author of a very learned commentary to Halevi's Kuzari, arrays Ibn Ezra together with Gersonides against Maimonides and Halevi—the former denying creation ex nihilo, the latter defending it (Langermann 1997, 517).

Spinoza singled out Ibn Ezra for being the first, as far as he knew, to question the Mosaic authorship of the Pentateuch (Harris 1993, 130-132). This observation greatly enhanced Ibn Ezra's stature as an exegete, especially among Christians. Ibn Ezra's emphasis on peshat, the “natural” interpretation of the Bible founded on philology and free of rabbinic interpretations, gained thereby considerable prestige. To be sure, Spinoza's view of Ibn Ezra was not uniformly positive, and, for his part, Ibn Ezra makes it quite clear that his philological tools are not to be applied against tradition, but only where there is no tradition, and, especially, where no normative practices are at stake. However, as we have already seen, there have been wide fluctuations in the image of Ibn Ezra and the interpretation of his legacy.

The modern Jewish philosopher most indebted to Ibn Ezra is Nahum Krochmal. Jay Harris has argued persuasively that “Krochmal's understanding of Ibn Ezra, and his motivation for that understanding, can only be understood as the fashioning of a response to the most interesting and serious philosophical critique of Judaism the nineteenth century produced” (Harris 1993, 144)—that is, the critiques of Hegel and Schelling. Krochmal also influenced the philological side of Ibn Ezra scholarship, for example, by casting doubt upon the authenticity of Arugat ha-Bosem; there is as yet no consensus on this issue [Greive 1973, 175-177].

4. Emphasis upon the Individual

A very important feature of Ibn Ezra's philosophy is its focus upon the salvation of the individual. His expressions mark a major shift in religious attitude. Traditional rabbinic Judaism, especially as reflected in the liturgy, had been concerned above all with the collective redemption of the Jewish people. Sophisticated circles in Judaeo-Arabic culture of al-Andalus had, for at least a century before Ibn Ezra, focused their soteriology instead on the ultimate felicity of the individual. It is very probable that in this issue, as in so many others, Ibn Ezra's role was that of the transmitter. The crisp formulations scattered throughout his biblical commentaries and topical booklets were far more accessible to the Jews of Christian Europe than the writings of other Jewish Andalusians, and they were pivotal in the spread of this key idea.

The focus upon the salvation of the individual comes out clearly in the opening sections of Yesod Mora. Ibn Ezra critically reviews the different motivations people have for gaining expertise in the Law. Some do it for prestige, but this is leads to social friction. Others study the Law in order to improve society. This is commendable; however, this implies that in a just society, the Law would be superfluous. We can carry Ibn Ezra's reasoning further: the Law must have some ultimate justification that is invariant over any and every social or historical situation. With this in mind, we can see the connection to the next point raised in the passage, which is this: many laws of the Torah are rarely if ever applied. How, then, the reader is led to wonder, can the Law be an end in itself for Jewish life? Moreover, Ibn Ezra asks, how many legal experts do we need anyway?

Two conclusions follow from this series of arguments. First, Torah study, in the sense of mastery of all the fine points of the Law, can not be the ultimate purpose of our existence. Second, the ultimate purpose does not lie in one's contribution to the community. Ibn Ezra is now ready to state what the goal of life is:

“The person (ha-adam) must set himself aright. He must know the commandments of God, Who created everything. He must try with all of his strength to understand [God's] works—then he will know his Creator…and when he knows Him he will find favor in His eyes.” After citing some biblical prooftexts—standard fare by then in the Arabic speaking communities for the view that knowledge is the true form of worship, Ibn Ezra sums up: “It is for this reason that man was created. Once one has rectified oneself, he may set others aright, if this be possible. (Cohen 2002, 83-84).”

On the face of it, then, Ibn Ezra conforms to the tradition that the Torah gives meaning to life. However, the Law is now just one of God's handiworks, and not necessarily the most important of them. Ibn Ezra clearly subscribes to the view then current among philosophers that the purpose and goal of human existence is to know God. This responsibility devolves upon each individual; it is not a communal project and, indeed, Ibn Ezra evinces no interest in the “ideal city”. However, he merely states this goal; he has no theory of the intellect, no refined or even coarse epistemology. He has in effect grossly devalued Torah study, but he has done this in a way that is not abrasive. (In fact, there is a long-standing controversy as to how much “Torah” Ibn Ezra himself knew.) This is a classic example of the way Ibn Ezra quietly if not elegantly insinuates radical views into the tradition.    

5. Characterizations of his Thought

Ibn Ezra's thought has been located (or fitted) into three traditions. Many medieval philosophers, and opponents of philosophy as well, sensed a commonality of purpose as well as the sharing of basic doctrines between Ibn Ezra and Maimonides. Joint allegiance to Maimonides and Ibn Ezra was particularly strong in the fourteenth century. The principle vehicle for this trend of thought was the supercommentary to Ibn Ezra, which number a few dozen. These authors were particularly impressed by the willingness of both sages to appeal to sources beyond the traditional rabbinic corpus in order to understand the biblical narratives and commandments. Rationality (in the sense of seeking a ratio for Judaism, its beliefs and precepts) bonded Ibn Ezra and Maimonides, blurring the differences between the two, even on such basic questions as the legitimacy of astrology.

The pseudepigraphic testament of Maimonides, in which he expresses his admiration in the strongest terms for Ibn Ezra's Torah commentary and the “great and deep secrets” that he revealed there, is most likely a product of this same trend. However, as Isadore Twersky has pointed out, the fact that the “testament” is said to have been written by Maimonides at the end of his life, after he had already written his own works, indicates that its author wants us only to take note of the literary and notional parallels between the two thinkers; the forger is not prepared to make any stronger claims of influence (Twersky 1993, 39-40).

Just how much, if anything, Maimonides owes to Ibn Ezra has been debated for over a century, without any clear resolution. The survey of Twersky (1993) covers the ground well. The strongest claims extend Ibn Ezra's influence even to the realm of legal theory, asserting that the fourteen principles enunciated by Maimonides at the beginning of his Book of Commandments were inspired and to a degree modeled upon the principles set down by Ibn Ezra in Yesod Mora. Since, by most modern accounts, Maimonides is to be classified as an Aristotelian (or perhaps neo-Aristotelian), it should stand to reason that, were he really a follower of Ibn Ezra, the latter would also be an Aristotelian. Histories of Jewish philosophy, as we shall see, unanimously locate Ibn Ezra in the neoplatonic camp. However, Yosef Cohen has recently argued that Ibn Ezra indeed fits more comfortably into the Aristotelian tradition (Cohen 1996).

Generations of scholars have found the “neo-platonist” label to be most appropriate. Julius Guttmann, who may well be responsible for defining medieval Jewish neoplatonism as a historical category, declared Ibn Ezra to be “the last in the line of Jewish Neoplatonists”. Guttmann was fully aware, like all historians of Jewish thought, that Ibn Ezra was not a systematic thinker, and he was more precise than any later historian in pinpointing the agreements and disagreements between Ibn Ezra and what may be called standard neoplatonic teachings. Nonetheless, he averred that “Ibn Ezra was moved more profoundly than most of his Jewish predecessors by the mysterious depths of Neoplatonism, approaching its metaphysical content more closely than any of the others except Gabirol” (Guttman 1973, 134).

Isaac Husik marks Ibn Ezra's role in the transmission of Andalusian wisdom, which consists of “grammar… mathematics and astronomy…the philosophy of Neo-Platonism, and the scientific and rationalistic spirit generally” (Husik 1969, 187). Like Guttmann, Husik calls attention to the affinity between Ibn Ezra and Ibn Gabirol. In 1973, Hermann Greive published a book-length study of Ibn Ezra under the title, Studien zum Jüdischen Neuplatonismus. Greive paid particular attention to Ibn Ezra's psychology; this is indeed the branch of philosophy to which Ibn Ezra was most strongly attracted, and the topic exploited most intensively by recent investigations into Ibn Ezra's philosophy (Tanenbaum 1990; Levin 1992). However, Greive is well-aware that the presence of neoplatonic teachings in Ibn Ezra's writings does not mean that Ibn Ezra's allegiance was limited to that school exclusively.

The trend is continued in the latest history of Jewish philosophy, that by Colette Sirat, who discusses Abraham Ibn Ezra at the end of the chapter on “The Neoplatonists”. However, cognizant of the rich Hebrew literature of the later medieval period (much of which was as yet unstudied and thus inaccessible to Guttmann), Sirat does not make Ibn Ezra into the last neoplatonist. Instead she observes, “The neoplatonic influence clearly marked in the Jewish philosophers of the of the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries was essentially expressed in terms and ideas drawn from Ibn Ezra” (Sirat 1985, 104).

One term in particular found in some key passages, kol or “all”, has attracted a good deal of attention of late. Building on the observations of several scholars, Elliot Wolfson (1990; see esp. p. 80, nn. 14-16, for references to earlier work on the topic) examines closely the two different senses in which Ibn Ezra uses the term. At times it refers to the totality of created entities, but in other passages it refers to an entity that comprises all things within itself in ideal form—not God, but the demiurge (yoser bereishit). This dual meaning can be traced back to Proclus, and its usage highlights the neoplatonic trend in Ibn Ezra's thought. Howard Kreisel [1994] has rejected this interpretation. Kreisel criticizes the emphasis upon “neoplatonism” here; he encloses the term in quotation marks, as the present writer tends to do, and for much the same reasons. Medieval Jewish neoplatonism is an ill-defined term, and all attempts to explicate Ibn Ezra's “neoplatonism” are problematic, forcing scholars to note numerous points of agreement between Ibn Ezra and the Aristotelians—which, in turn, cannot be divorced from the neoplatonic interpretations informing Islamic Aristotelianism in general. Kreisel argues that, when read closely in context, the texts in question display one meaning only for kol—God, the Creator God, and not the demiurge.

Hence there seems to be little profit in belaboring Ibn Ezra's supposed neoplatonism. On the other hand, Ibn Ezra's affinities to Ibn Gabirol (Avicebron to the Latins, and a neoplatonist for sure) are relevant. Some of Ibn Gabirol's allegorical readings of the Bible are cited by Ibn Ezra—indeed, he is our only source for them. Ibn Gabirol's Fons Vitae certainly belongs to the neoplatonic tradition. Significantly, however, that work (which Ibn Ezra would presumably have seen in the original Arabic) is not mentioned by Ibn Ezra at all. By all indications, he would not have had the patience or disposition for that text's scholasticism.

The role of Ibn Gabirol is indeed pivotal. Ibn Gabirol was accused by his contemporaries, and credited by modern scholars, with introducing “Greek” notions into his poetry. All the great Andalusian poets, were to some degree—Ibn Ezra, quite substantially—students and imitators of Ibn Gabirol. The link between Ibn Ezra and Ibn Gabirol is significant, but the common thread running between the two, and other Andalusian Jewish poets as well who plunged into “the mysterious depths of Neoplatonism”, is to be found in their poetry, rather than in prose expositions of philosophy. The soul's longing for release from this world and liberation, or obliteration, in the divine, are themes which found powerful expression in their liturgies, and which bond them to at least one important facet of neoplatonism and to each other more truly than any specific doctrines that they may hold concerning the origin of matter or the nature of prophetic inspiration.

Historians of Jewish philosophy label Ibn Ezra's thought “neoplatonic” also on the strength of his deep involvement in astrology and arithmology, as well as his deep longing for release from this world. However, the very term “neoplatonic” is applied imprecisely in the history of medieval Jewish philosophy, and it usually indicates little more than a gross bifurcation between “Aristotelians” and all of the rest who, as a rule, are labeled neoplatonic. It is therefore appropriate to take note of Ibn Ezra's divergence from some widely accepted neoplatonic teachings. Ibn Ezra denies the existence of demons. He says nothing of the soul's descent through the celestial orbs, though this teaching was known to his contemporary pseudo-Bahya, and would perhaps naturally have appealed to an astrologer. Finally, he says nothing of musical harmonies—despite the clear Pythagoreanism of his Sefer ha-Ehad (Langermann 1993, 66).  

The least well-known characterization, but one which has a lot to argue in its favor, is given by Abraham, son of the illustrious Moses Maimonides. In his refreshing perspective Ibn Ezra finds his place within a list of rabbis who taught the fundamental doctrines that God is not a body; that God does not manifest any of the properties of bodies; and that all problematic biblical verses must be (re)interpreted in order to conform to these doctrines. It is interesting to note the other names on Abraham Maimonides' list: Sa‘adiah Gaon, Samuel ben Hofni, Isaac Alfasi, Joseph Ibn Migash.[2] Only the first of these is regarded today as a philosopher, and then only in the wider sense of the word. It seems that Abraham, like his father, looked upon the whole lot—Ibn Ezra included—as mutakallimūn, that is, religious thinkers who taught an acceptable (though not necessarily correct) theology, which, however, lacked philosophical rigor, and which contained some grave errors.

Indeed, Sa‘adiah's Beliefs and Opinions is the only extant, substantive work on Jewish philosophy that Ibn Ezra mentions by name. The citation occurs at the very end of the first chapter of Yesod Mora; Ibn Ezra observes that some portions of Sa‘adiah's book are correct, but others are baseless. However, he never tells us exactly which portions are acceptable and which not, nor does he engage Sa‘adiah in a pointed debate on any issue. Throughout his opus, but most notably in his biblical commentaries, Ibn Ezra mentions Sa‘adiah dozens of times; though he rarely mentions the specific source, he seems to be referring most often to Sa‘adiah's own biblical commentaries. On the basis of this statistic, at least, Sa‘adiah is, as noted above, the most important “influence” upon Ibn Ezra.

6. What is Philosophy for Ibn Ezra? Who are his philosophers?

The abundance of Hebrew terms in Ibn Ezra's writings that may refer to “philosophers” or “philosophy”—none of them very precise, some of them perhaps coined by Ibn Ezra itself—afford an additional perspective upon the peculiar nature of Ibn Ezra's “philosophy”. The Hebrew homonyms for “philosophy” or “philosophers” (which entered the language by way of the Arabic) never appear in the biblical commentaries. In the single instance cited in Klatzkin's Lexicon, Ibn Ezra is reported to have used the word in the restricted sense of astronomers, in a manner similar to that of his predecessor Abraham bar Hiyya (whose astronomical writings he studied closely). This is not necessarily the case; in the single instance cited by Klatzkin, filosofim is appears in apposition to hakhamim, an all-purpose word meaning scholar or master of any of the seven or ten sciences.[3] Nonetheless, it does seem clear that Ibn Ezra has no concept of falsafa in the sense that it was used in Arabic philosophy, that is, in the restricted sense of Platonic and Aristotelian traditions.

The term shiqqul ha-da‘at (rational analysis, literally, “weighing [in the balance of] reason”) is used in the broad sense of reason or rationality. In the introduction to his commentary to the Torah, Ibn Ezra writes: “rational analysis (shiqqul ha-da‘at) is the foundation, because the Torah was not given to those devoid of reason; and the go-between (mal’akh, “angel” or “messenger”) between man and his God is his intellect.” Soon after (gloss to Genesis 1:2) the same term is used in what could again be taken as a strictly astronomical or scientific context: “People who employ rational analysis have sure proofs that there is only one earth.” Ibn Ezra's main training was in the exact sciences, and this fact is reflected in his usage of filosofim and shiqqul ha-da‘at.

In some cases, it is possible to narrow the sense of terms used by Ibn Ezra. An example is “the scholars who [base their claims upon] proofs” (hakhmei ha-ra’ayot), which is found in an excursus upon psychology, which we shall scrutinize below. Joseph Ibn Aqnin employs a very similar expression: “logicians, who adduce proofs (ra’ayot) to strengthen the Islamic religion, and the Ishmaelites call them mutakallimūn.”[4] Given Ibn Ezra's attachments to kalam, some of which have already been noted, it seems clear that the term in question here, and perhaps others as well, refers to the doctors of the kalam. References here and elsewhere to logic and proofs thus stand, in fact, for disputations that are carried out on a rational basis, but not necessary by the rules of Aristotelian logic.

Another term employed by Ibn Ezra is hakhemei (or: anshei) ha-mehqar, literally “scholars (or: people of inquiry). Bar Hiyya uses the term hakhemei ha-mehqar in the sense of philosophers: “the form concerning which the hakhemei ha-mehqar said that it is neither body nor attached to a body.”[5]

Tushiyya is yet another term. In one place Ibn Ezra contrasts the views of the people of mehqar with those of the people of tushiyya, in a way that suggests that the former are mutakallimûn and the latter fâlasifa. In his gloss to Psalms 104:30 he notes: “The people of mehqar say that every living being will rise after his death; the people of tushiyya say that the universals are preserved, but individuals perish.” The choice of this term clearly derives from Sa'adiah's translation of tushiyyah (Job 26:3) as falsafa. However, this usage is neither statistically significant nor totally consistent.

Ibn Ezra notes (gloss to Eccelsiastes 7:9; see below) that one must read “many books” in order to master psychology, but he does not name a single one of them; this observation as well holds throughout his opus, where, to the best of my knowledge, not a single textbook on psychology, metaphysics, or logic is ever mentioned by name. However, formal study of scientific texts was only one means of access to the philosophy of the day. By the late eleventh century Andalusian Jewry had drunk deeply from the fountain of Greco-Arabic science, and Ibn Ezra could certainly have achieved some familiarity with psychology and other fields without having undergone any formal course of study. As we shall see, Ibn Ezra certainly read Ibn Sînâ's philosophical allegory, Hayy bin Yaqzân. In general, it would seem that he was attracted to short, tantalizing and cryptic expositions, rather than lengthy, discursive prose.

7. Ibn Ezra and Judah Halevi

The most interesting and truly philosophical chapters in his writings have nothing to do with recycling and restyling doctrines of the soul, but rather with frank discussions concerning fundamental questions of Jewish identity. In a lengthy gloss to the first of the ten commandments (Exodus 20:1), Ibn Ezra records a conversation he held with his close friend and fellow poet Judah Halevi. Why, Halevi wants to know, did God choose to reveal himself on Mount Sinai as the God Who took the Jews out of Egypt? Why didn't He instead reveal Himself as the God Who created heaven and earth, and created man as well? Why did He identify Himself with an event important to Israel alone, rather than with an event of universal significance? The implied criticism of the standard philosophical viewpoint, to which Ibn Ezra adheres consistently throughout his oeuvre, is transparent. If Creation is the most manifest and convincing indication for the existence of the deity, as the philosophers aver; if God reveals Himself to us through His works—why, then, does He choose to reveal Himself at Sinai as the God of history, the God of the Exodus?

Ibn Ezra begins his reply with the observation that people differ in the nature of their belief. Some believe in God because they have heard about Him or read about Him in the Bible; but should that belief be challenged in any way, they are immediately stymied. By contrast, those who have chosen the path of knowledge will work their way up from the study of mineral and animal kingdoms to the structure and functions of the human body, and thence to a study of the heavens. Thus will the scholar ascend from God's “ways” to an understanding of the divine name. According to Ibn Ezra, the first two words of the commandment (“I [am] YHWH”) hint at the knowledge of God that one obtains from creation; it would thus be superfluous to add “Who made heaven and earth”. 

Thus far Ibn Ezra has reiterated, and endorsed, the view of the philosophers. Now, however, he parts ways with them; astrology plays a key role in this turn of thought. The intellectuals who follow this path, observes Ibn Ezra, deny divine intervention in worldly matters. Israel's astral destiny was such that she should not have been freed from bondage at that particular time. God however can overrule the stars, and His doing so precisely at that astrally inauspicious moment is compelling proof, not only for His existence, but for the operation of the cosmos that He created.

God's self-introduction as the One Who took you out of Egypt connects to the truth of God's existence, as evidenced by the cosmos. It adds, however, the important detail that the Creator is also the Redeemer. In sum, God's self-revelation as “the one Who took you out of Egypt” does not contradict the tenet that God reveals Himself through His works; it rather adds to it an important point, either overlooked or denied by the philosophers. Immediately afterwards, however, and quite characteristically, Ibn Ezra continues his exposition in a somewhat different vein. He observes that the next word, “your God”, conveys our obligation to worship; finally, the remainder of the sentence, “Who took you out of Egypt”, simply hints at the miracles that are all the simple folk have to lean upon in their belief.

We have extracted here the main points from one of the longest excursuses in Ibn Ezra's biblical commentary. It does not require any great stretch of the imagination to suppose that the dry and concise resumé that Ibn Ezra chose to include in his gloss summarizes what must have been a lengthy debate, perhaps even a series of encounters, between the two poets. In fact, in his commentary to Daniel 9:2, Ibn Ezra describes more fully an exchange with Halevi over an issue of biblical chronology, recording several barbs and retorts until, in the end, Halevi fell silent. Perhaps, then, Ibn Ezra chose to abridge the conversation over the first commandment because that encounter did not exactly leave Halevi speechless. Quite the contrary: Halevi expanded upon his theme of Jewish particularism in his Kuzari, one of the most resonant works ever of Jewish thought.

Armchair philosophy this may be, but it concerns one of the most fundamental questions of the Jewish experience. Is Judaism just one set of directives among many for achieving one and the same spiritual objective, which is the goal of all humans? Are Jews one people among many, or do they occupy a special place in the scale of existents? Better analytic minds may have been tested in replying to these questions, but perhaps not two more vibrant, passionate souls than these two Hebrew poets. The “philosopher” of Halevi's Kuzari presents a point of view that coincides on major points with that of Ibn Ezra, most notably in the universalism of his program for humanity, and the relativism of his approach to ritual and praxis (Langermann 1993, 70-74). For his part, Halevi demands a much more real and meaningful cleavage between Jews and the rest of the nations.

8. Poetry and the Science of the Soul

For Ibn Ezra, the human soul is the only unchanging, eternal entity in the universe; it is the only thing that can be said to be similar, in some sense, to God. For example, the opening sentence in Sefer Zahut (a grammatical treatise!) states: “Because the human soul was created in the image of God, her actions are similar to his” (Levin 1985, 379). At the end of Yesod Mora (Cohen 2002, 200-201) he cites the five points of resemblance between the soul and God noted in the Talmud; and he implies that Shi‘ur Qoma professes a similar doctrine. Ibn Ezra takes these similarities rather literally, as it seems.

Given this state of affairs, it is no surprise that “the science of the soul” is the branch of philosophy concerning which Ibn Ezra has the most to say. Ibn Ezra evinces little interest in the metaphysics of the theologians—that is, questions of divine attributes, substance and accident, and so forth. Psychology was his metaphysics; it and it alone delved into questions beyond the material world and approaching the godhead. It comes as no surprise, then, that penetrating studies of Ibn Ezra's thought, such as Wolfson [1990], dwell at length on the Ibn Ezra's conceptions of soul.

Ibn Ezra's attitude towards psychology emerges mainly from his poetry; it is not simply copied from some sterile classification scheme. His poetry, more than anything, has nourished his image as a neoplatonist in the scholarly literature. In fact, psychology was one arena of sharp conflict between philosophers and mutakallimûn. If, as we have suggested, Ibn Ezra was mainly influenced by Sa‘adiah and other gaonim—and thus also by the kalam—many of his ideas about the soul derive from the traditions of Hebrew poetry in Spain, which betray traces of neoplatonism.

Even Ibn Ezra's prose pronouncements concerning the soul's longing to return to her source tend towards the lyrical. Consider this passage from the introduction to the commentary to Ecclesiastes:

Just as the passerby, who has been taken prisoner, longs to return to his homeland and to be with his family, so does the intellectizing spirit yearn to grab hold of the higher rungs, until she ascends to the formations of the living God, which do not dwell in material houses…This will transpire if the spirit whitens, sanctifying herself above the impurities of disgusting bodily lusts which sully what is holy…then what is distant will be like what is near, and night like day; then she will be configured to know the real truth, which will be inscribed upon her in such a way so as not be erased when she departs the body, for the script is the writing of God. She was brought here in order to be shown, and for that reason she was imprisoned until the end of her term….(Levin 1985, 288)

This prose exposition is replete with imagery but devoid, like similar accounts in Ibn Ezra's writings, of any thorough discussion of the soul's structure, origins, and path to liberation, of the kind that one does find in the Islamic neoplatonic tradition, including Jewish works such as pseudo-Bahya. It is really a reworking in rhymed prose—the medium of Ibn Gabirol's liturgical masterpiece, Keter Malkhut —of the same themes that inspire Ibn Ezra's poems. Nonetheless, Ibn Ezra undoubtedly impresses his readers with the great pathos and obvious sincerity of his liturgies. His hymn, “Tzom’ah nafshi” (“My soul thirsts”) is one of the most powerful expressions of longing for the divine in Hebrew letters. Ibn Ezra experienced deeply and fully the soul's alienation in this world and her longing for divine redemption, and his poetic expressions of these awesome feelings served better as credentials for his expertise in matters of his soul than could any academic diploma.

9. Excursus on the Soul in a Comment to Ecclesiastes

The best way to grasp all that has been said so far about Ibn Ezra's interests, influences, and style, is to have look at a sample passage, where the peculiarities of his writing and the difficulties of piecing together his “philosophy”, can be examined in situ, so to speak. The lengthy excursus on the structure of the human soul in his commentary to Ecclesiastes 7:9 offers such an opportunity. Ibn Ezra briefly notes the tri-partite division of the soul into vegetable, animal, and rational. This, he tells us, is the scheme adopted by “the scholars who [base their claims upon] proofs” (hakhmei ha-ra’ayot). One can achieve a full understanding only after reading “many books”. There is no specific lexical or grammatical problem that requires the exegete to go to any length here. However, an inquiry into the soul is mandated because this verse is one of the places in Ecclesiastes where King Solomon has, on the face of it, contradicted himself, and therefore the verse requires explication. After citing at length some of the apparent contradictions, Ibn Ezra proposes an alternative psychology to that of the “scholars”, employing a different tripartite scheme and different terminology: nefesh (appetite and lust), ru’ah (sensation and domineering), and neshamah (wisdom). He intimates that this switch is only for convenience's sake, though the truth appears to be otherwise. Ibn Ezra notes in passing that Sa‘adiah too employed this second classification.

10. Rationale for the Commandments: Yesod Mora

The most systematic formulation of Ibn Ezra's philosophical ideas is found in Yesod Mora (The Foundation of Reverence) (Cohen 2002). Significantly, this is a monograph on the rationale of the commandments, perhaps the key field (along with biblical interpretation, with which it overlaps somewhat) for the development of a specifically Judaic philosophy. Like his other writings, it is very short, contains not a few cryptic passages whose meaning has never been satisfactorily fleshed out, and does not always jive well with his pronouncements in other writings. There is good reason to believe that Yesod Mora was written shortly before Ibn Ezra's death, and it thus may comprise his final statement on the issues.

The beginning of Yesod Mora contains a valuable survey of the sciences. This is not a formal classification of the type written by al-Fârâbî and many others, whose aim is to put in their proper place all of the sciences. Instead, Ibn Ezra critically reviews the various branches of learning which are favored by groups of Jewish scholars. There are those whose “entire wisdom” consists in masora, the traditional inventory of letters and phonetic markings in Scripture. Some are interested only in Hebrew grammar; others study only the Bible, yet others are interested only in the Talmud. None of these groups can achieve the wisdom they seek, however, without studying astronomy (hokhmat ha-mazalot). Astronomy in turn requires a foundation in geometry (hokhmat ha-middot). Also mandatory are psychology (hokhmat ha-nefesh), which in turn has a perquisite physics, or perhaps more accurately, physiology (toledet ha-shamayim, literally “that which is produced [or induced] by the heavens”; toledet refers generally to transformations of matter, but, in Ibn Ezra's usage, it is almost always applied to biological processes). Finally, logic (hokhmatha-mivta), “the balance of all wisdom” is also indispensable.

Towards the end of this disquisition, theosophy of some sort (sod ha-merkaba, shi‘ur qoma) is mentioned; Ibn Ezra seems to approve of it, if approached properly. At the very end of the passage, Ibn Ezra tries to tie everything together into a coherent study plan: “How can someone attempt to know something more sublime than he, if he knows neither his soul nor his body? Only he who knows physics (or physiology?) and all of its proofs and logic can know the universals that are preserved like a seal. Astronomy can be known by means of clear proofs drawn from arithmetic (hokhmat ha-heshbon), geometry (hokhmat ha-middot), and proportions (hokhmat ha-‘arakhim). Only then will he be able to ascend high above, and to know the secret of the soul, the supernal angels, and the world to come.” The plan calls for study of the body and soul, and astronomy as well, with the aim of securing universals. One can then move beyond the stars to “the secret of the soul” and the world or worlds beyond our own. The order in which the sciences are to be studied is clear enough, the connection between them far less so.

Ibn Ezra never makes a clean break between traditional or religious sciences; quite the contrary, he urges all along that the sciences that we would call secular are mandatory for understanding scriptural, legal, and other issues of concern to Jews, not the least of which, of course, is self-fulfillment. In the course of a long list of examples that illustrating this need, astrology (mishpatei ha-mazalot) is mentioned only once. Clearly, in this key text at least, Ibn Ezra does not accord to astrology the major standing it holds in his legacy. Moreover, none of the disciplines named seems to stand for “philosophy”, though psychology, some sort of natural philosophy, and theosophy are all mentioned separately. (See: What is “Philosophy” for Ibn Ezra?) In any case, the separate listing of psychology lends credence to our claim that Ibn Ezra's clear interest in the science of the soul is independent of, and by no means indicative of, any strong interest in philosophy in general.

The second chapter begins with an encomium to logic: “How noble is the science of logic, and it commences with knowledge of the five words (millot).” Ibn Ezra seems to be referring to the quinque voces; he names here “high universal”, “lower universal” or “high species”, and “low species”. Understanding species and other such groups are of great use in classifying commandments, as well as in resolving some apparent contradictions between biblical texts. However, the logic applied is extremely basic, and once again, we have no evidence that Ibn Ezra knew more than the basic terminology.

The discussion then moves on to commandments that are contingent, insofar as they depend upon, or are limited to, a certain group (e.g. priests), an institution (e.g. temple sacrifices), gender specific (e.g. circumcision). This sifting allows Ibn Ezra, in chapter five, to get at those commandments that are absolute, “principles that do not depend upon a given time, a given place, or anything else.” These commandments, “planted in the heart”, were known by means of reason even before the giving of the Torah. Ibn Ezra himself thus inserts, at the heart of this very Jewish, and legalistic, treatise, the rational, humanistic outlook that marks his philosophy: the core demands of Judaism depend not upon revelation but upon innate human reason, and they are no different from the rules that must govern every human.

11. Philosophical Allegory: Hayy ben Meqitz

Ibn Ezra has left us one writing that undoubtedly fits into a very special medieval philosophical tradition: a visionary recital, or initiatory tale, in rhymed Hebrew prose, Hayy ben Meqitz (Levin 1985, 119-132). The great tenth century philosopher Ibn Sina wrote a philosophical allegory Hayy bin Yaqzân, and the Andalusian Ibn Tufayl, as well as the Persian expatriate Suhrawardi penned distinct versions, each tale suited to the message that its author wished to convey. Ibn Ezra's Hebrew composition fits into this special theme of philosophical allegory.

In Ibn Ezra's version, Hayy is the guide—an old man on whom time has not taken its toll. The narrator, who has fled his home, meets Hayy, who enchants him with words of wisdom, then invites him to immerse himself in the fountain of life and imbibe its waters. Hayy then guides the narrator through eight “kingdoms,” that is, the stellar spheres, describing their astrological associations in vivid imagery, then to the angelic realm. The narrator asks if is there anything beyond, something that he cannot see? Hayy replies positively; there is “the One, who has no second”, sublime and invisible. However, he continues, if the narrator will follow in Hayy's path, he will yet be able to know and see Him.

This philosophical tale further complicates the question of Ibn Ezra's doctrinal allegiances. Issues such as the structure of the soul or the contours of union with the divine, which are not treated systematically or uniformly elsewhere, cannot be fully harmonized with Ibn Ezra's pronouncements elsewhere. Hayy is the only one of Ibn Ezra's philosophical ventures that has no intrinsic connection to Judaism. Snippets of biblical verses are skillfully woven into Hayy, making the poem amenable to the Jewish reader and making it easier for the reader to answer the invitation—if one is indeed extended—to join the excursion under Hayy's guidance. On the other hand, the ritual immersion in the nude that the narrator performs, while not totally foreign to Judaism, must have seemed to carry Christian overtones to some readers. It should be borne in mind that Ibn Ezra wrote Hayy at the request of Samuel Ibn Jami, a learned and philosophically inclined North African Jew, himself a poet. Is Hayy the response to a literary challenge?

Greive [1973, 103-114] characterizes Hayy as “a religious-philosophical work, expressed in a mystical fashion.” It is part of a tradition of Himmelsreisen that stretches back to antiquity and is open to a number of interpretations. Three central moments can be discerned: (1) The soul's imprisonment in the terrestrial world, which is foreign to her; (2) the role of self-knowledge (i.e. coming to know one's true, other-worldly self) in the process of liberation; (3) wisdom as the means to this liberation. Greive explores in particular, the literary connections with Avicenna's recital, also called Hayy, as well as Ibn Gabirol's liturgical masterpiece, Keter Malkhut.

More recently, Aaron Hughes [2004, 186] has strongly emphasized the neoplatonic aesthetics at play in Hayy, asserting that aesthetics and poetry are “currency whereby the imagination and philosophy are able to tease out and subsequently map the various relationships between the physical and the metaphysical”.


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Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, historical and methodological topics in: Arabic and Islamic Theological Philosophy (Kalam) | Maimonides | Neoplatonism | Saadya [Saadiah]