Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Idiolects

1. See Evans 1981, Wright 1986, Peacocke 1986, Davies 1987, Antony 1997, Knowles 2000, and Rattan 2002.

2. This is the second of two reasons given in Chomsky 1986: 24-36, though little weight is attached to the first, which is that our ordinary talk accords better with the I-language perspective than with the E-language perspective. E-language theorists often treat knowing a language as having an overt ability, where this is independent from facts about the mind/brain that underpin the ability and so of the differences between θ and θ*. But identifying knowledge of language with possession of an ability is at odds with how we speak. For example, someone may ‘know English’ yet be unable to put that knowledge to use because of a disabling throat or ear infection. This appeal to ordinary usage is not ultimately persuasive, as Chomsky acknowledges: first, ordinary language is no arbiter for science, and second, it does not deliver a clear verdict. Suppose a Martian were to come to know the meaning of our utterances by using a quite different system of rules. Ordinary usage leaves it open that such a creature ‘knows English’.

3. ‘Empiricism’ is being used here in its descriptive psychological sense rather than its normative epistemic sense. Empiricism in the second sense holds that the most promising way to acquire rational beliefs about the world is by forming hypotheses and testing them against experience. Chomsky has no immediate quarrel with this. His quarrel is with the psychological claim that this describes how children in actual fact acquire knowledge, with no help in the form of domain specific innate knowledge. See Empiricism.

4. See Hornstein 1989, Ludlow 2003 and Pietroski 2003 for more on this. Internalist equivalents to these extensional properties may well exist even on Chomsky's view. For example, anaphoric relations involving names and pronouns seem related to intuitions about reference (Chomsky 1986). But these truths about anaphora ought not to be mistaken for truths about the word-world relation that philosophers usually have in mind when they talk about the reference relation.

5. For discussion of this kind of objection see (consciousness) Nagel 1969, Searle 1990, (inferential promiscuity) Evans, Stich, (objectivity) Wiggins 1997, George 1990, Higginbotham 1991, and Barber 2001. For critical discussion of the notion of representation as it figures in Chomsky's work, see Georges Rey 2004a; 2004b. Dummett 1981 contains an interesting discussion of knowledge of language as an ability.

6. For this and similar views see Soames 1984, Devitt and Sterelny 1989, Katz 1990; for a defence of the Chomskian viewpoint see Fodor 1981.

7. Davidson uses ‘nested intention’ to mean an intention to bring about, in some single act, a series of outcomes (all of them counting as intended) in causal sequence. Some authors use it to mean an intention that contains mention of another intention within its content.