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First published Mon Aug 31, 2009

Philosophical perplexity about intention begins with its appearance in three guises: intention for the future, as when I intend to complete this entry by the end of the month; the intention with which someone acts, as I am typing with the further intention of writing an introductory sentence; and intentional action, as in the fact that I am typing these words intentionally. As Elizabeth Anscombe wrote in a similar context, ‘it is implausible to say that the word is equivocal as it occurs in these different cases’ and from the fact that ‘we are tempted to speak of “different senses” of a word which is clearly not equivocal, we may infer that we are pretty much in the dark about the character of the concept which it represents’ (Anscombe 1963, p. 1).

The principal task of the philosophy of intention is to uncover and describe the unity of the three forms. This project matters for questions in the philosophy of mind, but also for ethics, where it is involved in the doctrine of double effect, for epistemology, and most obviously, for the nature of practical reason.

We can classify theories of intention roughly but usefully on two axes. First, how do they find unity in the guises of intention? Do they explain one in terms of another? Which, if any, do they treat as primary? There is a deep opposition here between accounts that take intention to be a mental state in terms of which we can explain intentional action, and those which do not. Second, how do they understand the relation between intention and evaluative thought, which bears on the possibility of akrasia, and the relation between intention and belief, which bears on the nature and scope of self-knowledge? These questions arise whatever the relation between intending and doing. Sections 1 and 2 address the first axis of disagreement, while sections 3 to 5 primarily address the second.

1. Intending as Doing

In ‘Actions, Reasons and Causes,’ Donald Davidson gave a reductive theory of ‘intention with which’ as ‘syncategorematic’: the phrase does not refer to an event or state of the agent, but is a way of redescribing what he is doing in terms of a ‘primary reason,’ where this is understood as a pro-attitude towards actions having some feature, F, along with the belief that the original action has that feature (Davidson 1963, pp. 5–8). It is in virtue of its relation to a primary reason that the action counts as intentional, and this reason gives the intention with which the action is done. Davidson thereby unified, or took himself to have unified, intentional action and intention-with-which.

As he came to see, however, this story neglects and cannot easily incorporate prospective intention or intention for the future (Davidson 1978). There are apparent cases of ‘pure intending’ in which no steps of any kind are taken. Suppose that I intend to write a book review but have yet to open the book. On the face of it, such pure intending cannot be reduced to intentional action. What is more, once we recognize the existence of pure intending, ‘there is no reason not to allow that intention of exactly the same kind is also present when the intended action eventuates’ (Davidson 1978, p. 89). If what I am doing intentionally takes time, as almost everything does, there will be early phases in which I stand to the completion of the deed just as I stand to future actions I intend to perform but have yet to begin.

Virtually all work since Davidson's conversion has followed him in acknowledging the state of prospective intention as irreducible to action, and has been led to seek unity in the forms of intention by explaining the others—intentional action and intention-with-which—in terms of intending as a mental state. Recently, however, philosophers inspired by Anscombe's Intention have offered resistance to this move. Anscombe denies that there is a sharp distinction between ‘I am doing A’ and ‘I am going to do A’ offered as answers to the question ‘Why are you doing B?’ (Anscombe 1963, p. 40). Nor does she regard intention for the future as needing further explanation once intentional action and intention-with-which have been understood (Anscombe 1963, pp. 90–4). On the face of it, Anscombe purports to solve the problem of unity without acknowledging intention as a mental state.

The simplest version of this approach would emphasize the ‘openness’ of the progressive, that ‘He is doing A’ does not imply that he will succeed in doing A, or that he has or will get very far with it. (That I am crossing the road is consistent with being hit by a car the moment I step off the curb.) It then identifies the fact that S intends to do A with the fact that S is doing A intentionally, though perhaps he has barely begun. (For this account, see Wilson 1989, pp. 222–30.) If I intend to visit the zoo next Thursday, I am already on the way to doing so. Here it is striking that we sometimes employ the present progressive in anticipation: ‘Kieran is visiting the zoo next Thursday’ sounds perfectly fine when said today, before I have taken any overt steps (see Thompson 2008, pp. 140–1; Moran and Stone 2009, pp. 145–6).

A more subtle line would concede that we do not always use the progressive quite so liberally, but insist that doing so carves nature at its joints. According to Michael Thompson (2008, pp. 91–2, 133–46), intending to do A is not a mental state because it is not static; instead it is a form of imperfectivity or being in progress towards the intentional completion of an act, where the progress may be so vestigial or ineffectual or interrupted that it would be odd to remark, ‘He is doing A.’ (See Thompson 2008, pp. 91–2, 133–7, 139–45; Moran and Stone 2009, pp. 146–8.) The unity of prospective intention and ‘doing A intentionally’ is that the latter, too, consists of being in progress, though perhaps with the implication of some success.

Along with this unity, and the hint supplied by the use of the progressive in anticipation, there are two main arguments for the theory of intending as being embarked on intentional action. First, it readily explains why intending is always intending to do something. (For this argument, see Thompson 2008, pp. 120–3, 127–8, 130–1, drawing on Baier 1970; Moran and Stone 2009, pp. 143, 147.) Although we sometimes report intention as a propositional attitude—‘I intend that p’—such reports can always be recast as ‘intending to…’ as when I intend to bring about that p. By contrast, it is difficult to rephrase such mundane expressions as ‘I intend to walk home’ in propositional terms. ‘I intend that I am (will be) walking home’ suggests indifference to getting there. ‘I intend that I (will) have walked home’ suggests indifference to my present agency. ‘I intend that I walk home’ can only be read as an intention with a habitual object, describing a general practice of getting home on foot; it is not directed at a particular action. If intending is being on the way to intentional action, it is no surprise that its proper object—what one is on the way to doing—is not a mere proposition or state of affairs, but something one can do.

Second, the theory of intending as being embarked on intentional action explains the unity of what Thompson calls ‘naïve’ and ‘sophisticated’ rationalization. (For this argument, see Thompson 2008, pp. 97–9, 118–9, 132–4.) As well as explaining action by intention—‘He is doing A because he intends to do B’—we explain action by action—‘He is doing A because he is doing B’—intention by intention—‘He intends to do A because he intends to do B’—and intention by action—‘He intends to do A because he is doing B.’ On the face of it, moreover, ‘naïve’ explanations in terms of what someone is doing entail ‘sophisticated’ explanations that appeal to intention. At least when we are using the ‘because’ of rationalization, ‘He is doing A because he is doing B’ arguably entails ‘He is doing A because he intends to do B.’ The same point holds for what is explained: ‘He is doing A because…’ entails ‘He intends to do A because…’ If intending is being on the way to intentional action, these are all forms of explanation by, and of, such progress. So, again, it is no surprise that they are bound together in just the way that they appear to be.

If we help ourselves to the ‘because’ of rationalization, we can further exploit the unity of its ‘naïve’ and ‘sophisticated’ forms to give a simple theory of intention-with-which. An intention with which one is doing A is an intentional-action-in-progress that explains one's doing it. We thus complete the task of unification that was set by the threefold division of intention for the future, intention-with-which, and intentional action, all of which are modes of, or modes of explanation by, being embarked on intentional action.

A final virtue of this account is that it captures the element of commitment in intention, emphasized by Michael Bratman, among others (Bratman 1987, pp. 18–20). Intention is not merely predominant desire. If one intends to do A, one is already in progress towards doing it. In that sense, deliberation is over: one has begun. This is one way to vindicate the Aristotelian doctrine of action itself as the conclusion of practical reasoning.

Because of its relatively recent recovery, and the prevalent acceptance of intention as a mental state, there has been little examination of the present alternative. That is a vital topic for the future. But some initial observations can be made. First, it is in fact controversial that intending to do A is necessary for doing A intentionally, as the present theory predicts. This raises complications best considered later on, in sections 2 and 4. (They are briefly discussed at Thompson 2008, pp. 102–3.)

Second, and more obviously, there is room to doubt whether intending to do A is sufficient for me to count as doing it intentionally, even when we admit that I can be doing what I will never successfully do. What about plans for tomorrow that require no preparatory steps, as for instance, to blink at 3:00pm? Isn't some intending utterly pure, as Davidson thought? Once we move away from the simple theory of intending as doing, however, and introduce the abstract notion of imperfectivity or being in progress, it is more difficult to say what such examples show. That the theory is false? Or just how liminal being in progress can be?

More telling, perhaps, is the possibility of making a mistake, as when I intend to walk home by the shortest possible route, but have taken a wrong turn. Do I count as being embarked on walking home by the shortest route? If not, the theory stands refuted. If so, I can be on the way not only to doing something I will never do, because I will be interrupted at the earliest moment, but something it is now impossible for me to do.

The arguments that motivate the theory of intending as being embarked on intentional action are in any case inconclusive. As to the second, while it is a constraint on any theory of intention to show the unity of ‘naïve’ and ‘sophisticated’ rationalization, insofar as they are really unified, it would take much further argument to show that this cannot be done while thinking of intention as a mental state (cf. Setiya 2007a, pp. 51–2). Further demands for unity push towards that view. So, for instance, if we hope to bring out what is common to the explanations ‘He is doing A because he is doing B’ and ‘He is doing A because p’ where these entail, respectively, ‘He is doing A because he intends to do B’ and ‘He is doing A because he believes that p,’ we will have to relate intention to the mental state of belief. If intention is not itself a mental state, but a way of being in progress, such relations become more puzzling. They are taken up again in section 5.

As to the first, those who think of intention as a mental state could explain why its objects are restricted to actions by saying more about the kind of state it is. For instance, if intention is a representation that is such as to guide and control what it represents, its object must be as such as to be guided: it must be the sort of thing that can be in progress and move towards completion, something that can be done, not a mere proposition or state of affairs. Alternatively, the restriction could be denied (as it is by Davis 1984, pp. 131–2). Intending that p is fundamental, and intending to walk home can be explained in terms of it: I intend that I will have walked home by walking home.

Finally, whatever view we take about the basic objects of intention—actions or propositions—it is a problem for the theory of intending as being embarked on intentional action that these objects can be logically complex. I intend not to be hit by a car as I walk home. I intend to drink wine or beer with dinner. I intend to read a book tonight if there's nothing on the radio. In none of these cases can we say, without contrivance or difficulty, what action I am now on the way to performing. Until it is supplied with an account of these cases, and of the relation between intention and the mental states with which it interacts, the theory of intending as being embarked on intentional action remains incomplete.

2. Intention in Action

If prospective intention cannot be explained in terms of intentional action, or both in terms of being in progress, how can we preserve the unity of our three divisions? In particular, how does intentional action relate to prospective intention and intention-with-which? There are two obvious thoughts. The first is that doing A intentionally is doing it with some further intention, or doing something with the intention of thereby doing A. The second is that both phenomena are to be explained in terms of intention as a mental state. Let us take these possibilities in turn.

The idea of explaining intentional action through intention-with-which is associated with resistance to causal accounts of acting for a reason. It begins instead with intentional teleology—doing A in order to do B, or with the intention of doing B—treating this as primitive and not involving intention as efficient cause. If we assume that every intentional action is done for a reason, and that this reason can be cast in teleological form, we can identify doing A intentionally with doing A in order to do something else. We thereby unify two guises of intention. Difficulties arise, however, from the case of idle behaviour, in which I am doing A intentionally for no particular reason (Anscombe 1963, p. 25), and from the possibility—or necessity—that teleological series come to an end. I am doing A in order to do B in order to do C … in order to do Z, which I am doing for its own sake. Not all intentional actions are performed with a further end. The purported unity fades. In order to solve this problem, George Wilson (1989) and Carl Ginet (1990, Ch. 6) appeal to intention de re. One need not intend one's doing A to promote some further end in order to count as doing A intentionally. It is sufficient to intend, of something one is doing, that it promote or constitute one's doing A.

This way of putting things prompts the objection that merely having that intention is not enough. If the intention is idle or ineffective, one will not, despite one's wishes, count as doing A intentionally, or as acting in order to do A (Mele 1992, pp. 248–55). We need to add a causal relation, after all. But this objection misunderstands the teleological view. It is not that the mere presence of a mental state—intending of … that it …—constitutes acting with an intention, or acting intentionally, but that intention-with-which is the basic unanalyzed material out of which to reconstruct the unity of intention.

A deeper problem for the teleological approach is how to complete this reconstruction with an account of prospective intention in terms of intention-with-which. In cases of pure intending, there is no intention with which I am doing anything yet. It is thus no accident that Wilson (1989, pp. 222–30) is led to identify intending to do A with doing A intentionally, and apparently pure intending with incipient action. This takes us back to the issues discussed in section 1.

What about the second approach, now orthodox in the philosophy of action, which attempts to explain both intentional action and intention-with-which in terms of intention as a mental state? According to the simplest possible view, an intentional action of doing A is the execution of a prior intention to do A, and doing A with the intention of doing B is intending, of one's doing A, that it promote or constitute one's doing B.

There are two immediate difficulties. First, although we sometimes form an intention prior to acting, this is not essential. I can wave my arm intentionally without planning in advance. This fact elicits a refinement often credited to Searle (1983, pp. 84–5): the distinction between prospective intention and intention in action. In the former case, one intends to do A, perhaps at some point in the future. In the latter, one intends to be doing it now. When S is doing A intentionally, she is doing it in execution of an intention in action, though except in very unusual cases she also intends to do A: to complete the action she is in the midst of performing.

This refinement preserves the idea that doing A intentionally requires an intention whose object is doing A. This is what Bratman (1987, p. 112) has dubbed ‘the Simple View.’ It is open to serious objections, the more subtle of which will be examined in section 4. For now, it is sufficient to note that I sometimes count as doing A intentionally when it is a merely foreseen and unintended consequence of what I intend to do. (See Harman 1976, pp. 151–2; Bratman 1987, pp. 123–5.) Thus if I am paid to pump water into the cistern of a house, and I continue to do so even when I realize that the water is poisoned, I poison the inhabitants of the house intentionally, despite the fact that I did not intend or desire such harm (cf. Anscombe 1963, pp. 41–2). Even here, however, an intention is executed: I intend to pump water into the house. In general, when it is not the execution of a directly corresponding intention, doing A intentionally is a foreseen or desired consequence of an action that is. Admittedly, this condition is necessary, not sufficient, for intentional action, a concept whose vagaries are hard to map. But the execution of intention remains the core phenomenon from which all instances of intentional action are derived.

Along with such matters of detail, two problems of principle can be raised against the present approach. The first contends that it is tacitly circular, because the content of intention always includes the concept of intentionality (Wilson 1989, pp. 274–5; Ginet 1990, pp. 34–5). In prospective intention, I intend not only to do A, but to do A intentionally, and the same point holds for the object of intention in action. This prevents us from explaining what it is to act intentionally in terms of intention as a mental state.

The force of this objection is unclear. While there is something troubling in an account of what it is to φ that appeals to being or doing φ, it is not so obviously problematic to appeal to mental states that represent something as being or doing φ. Our task is not to introduce the concept of intentional action to someone who lacks that concept, but to spell out the metaphysics of doing A intentionally. It is an open question whether ‘metaphysical definition’—saying what it is to φ—can be permissibly circular, so long as the circularity is contained in the scope of an attitude. Such circularity is characteristic of ‘response-dependent’ accounts of evaluative and other properties.

A more direct response to the challenge would deny its premise. While it is true that the execution of intention is intentional action, it does not follow that the object of intention is doing A intentionally (cf. Searle 1983, pp. 85–6.) If I intend to be smiling and am doing so involuntarily, I am doing what I intend, though not intentionally. Likewise, if I intend to skip breakfast and do so because I forget about it, my intention was fulfilled, though not by intentional action. (These claims are consistent with the view that, when I act for reasons, those reasons figure in my intention as a Kantian ‘maxim’. In that case, my intention is fulfilled, in its entirety, only if I act on them and thereby act intentionally. See Wallace 1999, pp. 60–2; Setiya 2007a, pp. 39–49; and on the content of intention, more generally, Harman 1976, pp. 156–8; Velleman 1989, pp. 94–7; Mele 1992, Ch. 11; and Ross, pp. 255–7, Appendix B.)

The second problem is more a question: whether ‘the relation of being done in execution of a certain intention, or being done intentionally, is a causal relation between act and intention.’ (Anscombe 1983, p. 95) Anscombe denies that it is. (When she writes of ‘practical knowledge’ as ‘the cause of what it understands’ she means formal not efficient cause, and then only when ‘the description of the action is of a type to be formally the description of an executed intention.’ See Anscombe 1963, pp. 87–8.) One source of concern about intention as efficient cause is that intention need not precede intentional action, while causes must precede their effects. But causal theorists may deny that claim about the temporarily of causes, conceiving intention as the simultaneous, sustaining cause of what one is doing (Thalberg 1984, pp. 257–8). They can also accommodate the case in which intention is essential to, and thus not fully distinct from, the action it causes: for things that cannot be done except intentionally, as perhaps greeting and promising (Anscombe 1963, pp. 84–5). Even here, intention could play an efficient-causal role in its own execution (Setiya 2007a, pp 56–9).

A more familiar anxiety turns on ‘causal deviance’ (Davidson 1973, p. 79). If we are trying to say what it is to act intentionally, the condition of doing A because one so intends looks insufficient. For it says nothing about the causal path from intention to action. If I intend to be shaking in order to signal my confederate, and this intention makes me nervous, so that I shake, I am shaking because I intend to do so—though not intentionally. My intention did not cause me to shake ‘in the right way.’ Nor is the ‘right way’ obviously a matter of ‘proximate’ causation or the absence of causal intermediaries, since a causal theorist may well allow for neural intermediaries, and further intentions, in the causal path from intention to action. There is a failure of intentional action only when intermediaries are of the wrong kind.

Reactions to causal deviance vary widely. Some are convinced that the problem is hopeless (Wilson 1989, Ch. 9; O'Brien 2007, Ch. 8); others that it can be solved by appeal to such phenomena as causal direction and guidance, which are found outside the province of intentional action and therefore introduce no circularity (Thalberg 1984; Mele 1992, Ch. 11; Setiya 2007a, pp. 31–2). It is in fact unclear how this dispute affects the project of explaining intentional action through intention as a mental state. Would that project survive if the relation of execution and the corresponding ‘because’ were taken as primitive? Or in a ‘disjunctive’ theory according to which intention in action has two irreducible forms: doing A intentionally and ‘mere’ intending, frustrated by the world? (Like the theory of intending as being embarked upon intentional action, the disjunctive conception agrees with Aristotle that action is, or can be, the conclusion of practical thought.) Corresponding issues have been pursued in the philosophy of perception, where causal and disjunctive theories are sometimes opposed (as by Snowdon 1980–1). They deserve to be more fully discussed in action theory.

3. Intention and the Good

If intention is a mental state in relation to which doing A amounts to doing A intentionally, or with the further intention of doing B, that fact would unify the modes of intention with which we began. It would, however, tell us little about the state of intending itself. Does this state involve desire? Belief about what one is doing, or what one is going to do? Evaluative judgement? Similar questions arise for those who deny that intention is a mental state and explain it as being on the way to intentional action. Must I want to perform an action I am thus embarked upon? Believe that I am engaged in it? Hold it to be in some way good?

It is a matter of consensus in the philosophy of intention that intending to do A entails wanting to do A, in the motivational sense for which the ‘primitive sign of wanting is trying to get’ (Anscombe 1963, p. 68). Doubts about this entailment are attributed to ambiguities in ‘desire.’ When I intend to do A reluctantly, from the motive of duty, I may deny that I want to do it, but what I lack is ‘appetite’ not ‘volition’ (Davis 1984, pp. 135–40; Thompson 2008, pp. 103–5).

Intending is thus a ‘pro-attitude’ of some kind—assuming, for simplicity, that intention is a mental state. In his later work, Davidson specified this pro-attitude as ‘an all-out, unconditional judgement that the action is desirable’ (Davidson 1978, p. 99). He made two further refinements. First, when one is doing A intentionally, ‘at least when the action is of brief duration, nothing seems to stand in the way of an Aristotelian identification of the action with [all-out evaluative judgement]’ (Davidson 1978, p. 99). Second, one counts as intending an action only if one's beliefs are consistent with one's performing it; one cannot intend to do what one believes to be impossible (Davidson 1978, pp. 100–1).

In an influential critique, Bratman objects that choice is possible even when one sees no grounds for preferring A to B, or B to A; one can decide between equivalents (Bratman 1985, §V). If unconditional judgement presents its object as more desirable than any alternative, Davidson's theory wrongly prohibits such choice. If the judgement is merely that a given action is no less desirable than others, it permits me to intend A and intend B, even if I know that they are incompatible. Against this, Bratman claims that it is irrational to intend A and intend B if one cannot rationally intend A-and-B, as when doing both is inconsistent with one's beliefs.

A related objection is that we can fail to act, or intend, in accordance with our evaluations. In a typical case of akrasia, I conclude that I ought to quit, but decide to continue smoking instead. Davidson (1970) replied to this by distinguishing ‘all things considered’ from ‘unconditional’ evaluative judgement. In ‘conditional’ or ‘prima facie’ judgement one takes some body of considerations, r, to support A over B. All things considered judgement is the special case of this in which r includes all the considerations one holds relevant. There is no inconsistency in judging that the sum of these particular considerations favours A over B while judging that B is better than A, perhaps in light of other considerations one has not specifically considered. Since it is the latter judgement that constitutes intention, one can act intentionally against the former. This is how Davidson makes sense of my continuing to smoke.

Few have been convinced by Davidson's account. Can't we also act—intentionally and without self-contradiction—against an unconditional evaluative judgement? Or fail to intend in accordance with one? Such resistance does not simply beg the question. Even Davidson concedes that ‘A is better than B, all things considered’ entails ‘A is better than B’ if ‘all things considered’ means ‘all truths, moral and otherwise’ (Davidson 1970, p. 40). He may intend this to be trivial, counting that fact that A is better than B among the relevant truths. But it is both plausible and non-trivial to claim that A is better than B, in the relevant sense, if and only if the balance of reasons favours A over B, where the reasons are distinct from that evaluative fact. Since it is possible to grasp this connection, to hold that the balance of reasons favours quitting, and still not intend to quit, Davidson's theory must be false. (A consequence of this is the need to distinguish weakness as akrasia from weakness as failure of will; see Holton 2009, Ch. 4.)

If we hope to defend an evaluative theory of intention, despite this possibility, we will have to equate intending with judgement of some other evaluative proposition, not entailed by claims about the balance of reasons (as in Rödl 2007, Ch. 2)—this non-comparative account might also help with Bratman's objection—or distinguish kinds of judgement or ways of representing an action as to be done, one of which constitutes intending, the other of which we act against in akrasia (as in Tenenbaum 2007, Ch. 7). Either way, there is a task of clarification and a need to motivate the evaluative account. What is it about the role of intention in intentional action, or in planning for the future, that requires this sort of evaluation, and how does evaluation play this role? The evaluative theorist must say what is missing from theories of intention that do without it.

4. Intentions as Plans

Having criticized Davidson's theory of intention, Bratman offers a diagnosis of his mistake that connects directly with questions about the functional role of intending. According to Bratman (1985, §VI), Davidson neglects the place of prospective intentions in cross-temporal and inter-personal coordination, and as inputs to further practical thought. There is room for doubt about this verdict, since all-out evaluative judgement may well appear as a premise of practical syllogism (‘I ought to do A; doing B is a means to that; so I ought to do B’) and since it may sustain ‘diachronic autonomy,’ at least to some extent, just through the working of memory (a point emphasized by Ferrero 2006). But Bratman is right to indicate a gap in Davidson's story, which he has done more than anyone to fill.

For Bratman (1987), intention is a distinctive practical attitude marked by its pivotal role in planning for the future. Intention involves desire, but even predominant desire is insufficient for intention, since it need not involve a commitment to act: intentions are ‘conduct-controlling pro-attitudes, ones which we are disposed to retain without reconsideration, and which play a significant role as inputs to [means-end] reasoning’ (Bratman 1987, p. 20). The plans for action contained in our intentions are typically partial and must be filled out in accordance with changing circumstances as the future comes.

Among the advantages of being able to commit ourselves to action in advance, albeit defeasibly, are: (i) the capacity to make rational decisions in circumstances that leave no time to deliberate, or lend themselves to deliberative distortion; (ii) the capacity to engage in complex, temporally extended projects that require coordination with our future selves; and (iii) the capacity for similar coordination with others.

Bratman (1987, Ch. 3) argues that these advantages are best secured if our intentions are consistent with one another and with our beliefs, and if they conform to principles of means-end coherence—for instance, that when we intend E and believe that intending M is necessary to achieve E, we also intend M. There is, he claims, a ‘pragmatic rationale’ for such requirements, ‘one grounded in [their] long-run contribution to getting what we (rationally) want’ (Bratman 1987, p. 35).

Responses to Bratman's theory have focused largely on the nature of these alleged requirements. Bratman (1987, §2.5) argues persuasively that intentions do not provide inputs to practical reasoning by providing additional reasons. This conception is, on the one hand, too weak, since it treats the fact that I have settled on doing A as just one consideration among many in favour of doing it, whereas means-end coherence is a strict or peremptory demand. And it is, on the other hand, too strong, since it permits a form of illicit bootstrapping in which an irrational decision can generate a reason that tips the balance in favour of acting on it. Bratman's pragmatic theory is meant to avoid these problems while giving intention a crucial role in practical thought. But it faces problems of its own. In structure, Bratman's theory is akin to the variety of rule-utilitarianism on which we have utilitarian grounds for adopting a practice of punishment or promising that sometimes goes against considerations of utility. This structure prompts a serious dilemma. If reasons for adopting a practice or pattern of reasoning transmit to the actions or inferences that fall under it, as Rawls (1955) once argued, the problems of bootstrapping and peremptoriness return. All we have is a theory of why intentions give reasons. But if reasons do not transmit in this way, the picture appears to be one of ‘rational irrationality’: having reason to adopt or sustain an irrational pattern of reasoning, on the ground that the results of doing so are mostly for the best. Neither option is appealing.

In his 1987 book, Bratman in effect pursued the second path, hoping to soften its peculiarity by distinguishing ‘internal’ and ‘external’ perspectives on rationality and deliberation (Bratman 1987, §3.5). More recently, he has argued that the benefits of consistency and coherence are more than pragmatic, since they allow for a form of self-governance that is of non-instrumental value (Bratman 2009b), and that they are closely tied to the functional role of intentions as plans (Bratman 2009c, §§VIII–IX). He also adopts John Broome's (2004) idea that the relevant norms take ‘wide scope.’ For instance, it is irrational to [intend E, believe that intending M is necessary to achieve E, and not intend M]. It does not follow from this that, if one intends E, one is under rational pressure to intend the necessary means, since one can just as well avoid the forbidden combination of attitudes by giving up one's intention for the end. By the same token, there is no need to admit that intentions provide reasons for acting. We thus avoid both horns of the dilemma sketched above. How far this strategy succeeds is a matter of ongoing dispute (Setiya 2007b; Bratman 2009b; Way forthcoming).

A further objection to the demands for consistency and coherence turns on an implication which Bratman (1987, Ch. 8) himself draws out. According to the Simple View, doing A intentionally involves an intention whose object is A. As Bratman argues, however, it is sometimes rational to attempt both A and B, hoping to achieve one or the other, when I know that I cannot do both. If I succeed in doing A, I will have done so intentionally, and thus, on the Simple View, I must have intended to do A. Considerations of symmetry imply that I also intended to do B. But then my intentions are not jointly consistent with my beliefs. Bratman concludes that the Simple View is false, since it would be irrational to have such intentions. Instead, I intend to try doing A and to try doing B, knowing that I can make both attempts, though both cannot succeed. Bratman admits that, when I try to do A, I take the relevant means ‘with the intention’ of doing it. But he finds this phrase ambiguous. On one reading, it ascribes the intention to do A, but in the present case it does not. Instead, I merely ‘endeavour’ to do A, where this is a matter of ‘guiding desire’ (Bratman 1987, Ch. 9).

The main objection to this view, pressed forcefully by Hugh McCann (1991), is that it generates an unhappy proliferation of intention-like states, and that, by finding ambiguity in ‘intention with which,’ it fails to unify the guises of intention. What is more, there is a natural alternative, which equates intention with guiding desire, and defends the Simple View by finding the requirement of consistency defeasible. There is rational pressure to conform to it, in general, but this pressure can be outweighed, as when it makes sense to intend both A and B, despite their manifest inconsistency, hoping to achieve just one. On the most radical line, the reasons for being consistent in one's intentions, or conforming to means-end coherence, reduce to the reasons for acting in one way or another, and Bratman's alleged requirements are a ‘myth’ (Raz 2005; Kolodny 2008; but cf. Bratman 2009b).

A final objection to Bratman's theory is more basic, and would apply as well to the theory of intention as guiding desire. The question is whether such accounts reveal the unity of intentional action, intention for the future, and intention-with-which. McCann's objection concerned the latter. The more basic objection is about the role of intention in intentional action. Bratman (1987, Ch. 8) does not ignore this connection: he proposes necessary and sufficient conditions for doing A intentionally that rely on the state of intending, though not always the intention of doing A itself. But it is open to question how deep the envisaged unity goes. Why must there be intention in intentional action, if intentions are plans? (Velleman 2007, §3 asks a related question.) A partial answer is that there is a need for direction and guidance in doing anything that takes time or requires the selection of means. But it is not clear that such guidance requires intention (see Bratman 1987, pp. 126–7 on spontaneous action). Nor would this forge a general connection between the state of intending and the phenomenon of acting for reasons or the application of Anscombe's (1963, p. 9) question ‘Why?’ If S is doing A on the ground that p, she is doing it intentionally. Bratman's conditions do not explain why intention must be involved in the antecedent of this conditional. Why must reasons attach to what I am doing by way of plans or guiding desires? One response is to admit that they may not: there can be intentional action without intention (see Bratman 2000, pp. 51–2). But if we hope to unify intention with intentional action, we cannot accept this. Intention must figure in the correct account of acting for a reason, and thus intentionally. In order to avoid disunity, the theory of intentions as plans (or as guiding desires) needs such an account.

5. Intention and Belief

Some philosophers see the promise of a unified theory in the idea—influentially proposed by Elizabeth Anscombe (1963, pp. 11–15) and Stuart Hampshire (1959, pp. 95, 102)—that when S is doing A intentionally, S knows that she is doing A. In addition, where acting for a reason goes beyond mere purposive behaviour of the sort characteristic of non-human animals, it essentially involves such knowledge: in acting for a reason, I know an explanation of what I am doing that cites that reason, and therefore know that I am doing it. That is why, for Anscombe, the question ‘Why?’ is ‘given application’ by the agent. Intentional agency turns on knowing the answer to that question.

This picture raises many difficulties, and needs considerable refinement and defence. (For variations, see Velleman 1989; Setiya 2007a, Part One; Rödl 2007, Ch. 2.) Some will resist the claim that acting for a reason is acting with self-knowledge—though it is important to stress that the knowledge attributed here need not be conscious or ‘occurrent.’ There is also disagreement about the kind of explanation involved in giving the reasons for which one acts (Wilson 1989, Ch. 7; Ginet 1990, Ch. 6; Dancy 2000; Davis 2005). But if the picture is basically right, it suggests that the unity of intention can be found in knowledge or belief about action. Assuming that knowledge entails belief, the basic thought is that intention in action involves the belief that one is doing A. Doing something for a reason involves a belief about one's reason for doing it that constitutes intention in action. And prospective intention, or intention for the future, involves a belief about what one is going to do and why. Intention as involving belief is the thread that binds these phenomena together.

The claim that intention involves belief—most commonly, that if one intends to do A, one believes that one is going to do A—is widespread even among those who draw no particular inspiration from Anscombe. (See Audi 1973; Grice 1971; Harman 1976; Davis 1984; Ross 2009.) As Grice (1971, pp. 264–6) observed, there is peculiarity of some sort in asserting ‘I intend to do A, but I might not do it,’ a peculiarity readily explained if intention is a species of belief. It is equally striking that the ordinary expression of intention for the future is ‘I am going to do A’ (Anscombe 1963, p. 1), which looks like the assertoric expression of belief. The same point holds for intention in action: ‘What are you up to?’; ‘I am doing A.’ Although such evidence is suggestive, however, it might be explained in other ways. (See, for instance, Davidson 1978, pp. 91, 100; and for criticism, Pears 1985.)

So far, we have only the fragment of a theory, an alleged condition of intending, not an adequate account of what intention is. Here there are several possibilities. On the simplest proposal, to intend an action is to believe that one will perform it and to have an appropriate guiding desire (Audi 1973, p. 395). But a mere conjunction seems insufficient: the desire and belief could be utterly unrelated (Davis 1984, pp. 141–2). This prompts the suggestion that, when S intends to do A, his belief rests on his desire: to intend an action is to believe that one will perform it on the ground that one wants to do so (Davis 1984, p. 147; see also Grice 1971, pp. 278–9). The principal defect of this account is that it makes the belief component of intention epiphenomenal. This belief merely registers one's activity: the motivational work is done by a prior desire. (Something similar is true on more subtle theories that divorce the motivational role of intention from belief; as, for instance, Ross 2009, pp. 250–1.) If the claim that intention involves belief is to capture the essence of the will, not a superficial fact about the word ‘intend,’ the belief must be implicated in the functions of intending and the explanation of action. (For objections of this kind, see Bratman 1987, pp. 19–20 and Mele 1992, Ch. 8 on ‘intention*’; on the role of beliefs in planning for the future, see Velleman 1989, Ch. 8; Velleman 2007.)

There is variation even among those accounts that give a motivational role to belief. For Velleman (1989, p. 109), intentions are ‘self-fulfilling expectations that are motivated by a desire for their fulfillment and that represent themselves as such.’ Such expectations interact with a general desire for self-knowledge to motivate action by which they are confirmed. This view generates what Bratman (1991, pp. 261–2) has called ‘the problem of promiscuity’: in attributing a general desire for self-knowledge that motivates us to conform to our own expectations, it predicts that we will be just as strongly motivated by beliefs that do not constitute intentions, like the belief that I am going to trip over the step, or mispronounce a word.

A different proposal, due to Harman (1976, p. 168) is that intentions are ‘conclusion[s] of practical reasoning’ (see also Ross 2009, pp. 270–2). But it seems possible to intend an action spontaneously, for no particular reason. In later work, Harman looks downstream of intention, rather than upstream: an intention is a belief about what one is doing or what one is going to do that has the power to guide and motivate action through practical thought (Harman 1986, pp. 375–6; Setiya 2007a, pp. 48–53).

Finally, there is Anscombe's own view, on which the contrast between intention and belief is normative. If one fails to act as one intends, and not through a mistaken belief about the means or possibilities for action, ‘the mistake is not one of judgment but of performance’ (Anscombe 1963, pp. 56–7). Intention sets the standard of success for what does. What is more, there is ‘a difference of form between reasoning leading to action and reasoning for the truth of a conclusion’ (Anscombe 1963, p. 60). Intention is justified by the former, not the latter: by practical not theoretical reasoning (Anscombe 1963, pp. 57–62).

In this respect, Anscombe's doctrine differs most sharply from Velleman's. As well as thinking of intention as a kind of belief, Velleman holds that ‘practical reasoning is a kind of theoretical reasoning’ (Velleman 1989, p. 15; see also Ross 2009). In a review of Velleman's book, Bratman (1991, pp. 250–1) dubbed the conjunction of these claims ‘cognitivism about practical reason.’ It prompts what Davidson (1978, p. 95) called ‘the strongest argument against identifying [intention] with [belief],’ that ‘reasons for intending to do something are in general quite different from reasons for believing one will do it.’ Though Velleman (1989, pp. 122–5) defends that identification, one need not do so in order to accept the theory of intention as belief or the idea of ‘practical knowledge’ as ‘knowledge in intention.’

A more modest ‘cognitivism’ would hold that intention entails belief, that practical reasoning does not reduce to theoretical, but that some requirements that govern intention are best understood as requirements of theoretical reason. It is often regarded as a virtue of such cognitivism that it explains why there should be an indefeasible requirement of consistency among intentions and beliefs (Ross 2009, pp. 244–7). It has also been argued that the requirement of means-end coherence follows from requirements of theoretical reason on the beliefs that figure in our intentions (Harman 1976, p. 153; Wallace 2001; Setiya 2007b; Ross 2009, pp. 261–5). If I intend to do E and thus believe that I will do it, and I believe that doing M is a necessary means to doing E, but do not intend or believe that I am going to do M, I fail to believe a practically salient logical consequence of what I believe. The principal challenge for a cognitivist account of means-end coherence is to explain why one must avoid such theoretical failures by forming the relevant intention, not just the corresponding belief (Bratman 2009a). But once again, one need not defend cognitivism, even in its less ambitious form, in conceiving intention as a kind of belief.

There are two main arguments against this conception. The first turns on apparent cases of intention without belief. Suppose that I am recovering from paralysis, and movement slowly returns to my hands. At a certain point, I am not sure that I can clench my fist. As it happens, I can. But if I try to do so behind my back, under anesthesia, I may not believe that I am clenching my fist, even though—on the face of it—I am doing so intentionally, and that is just what I intend. Something similar crops up in planning for the future. I intend to mail the bills on the way to work, but I know that I am forgetful, and don't believe that I will do it (see Bratman 1987, pp. 37–8).

Such examples can be dealt with in various ways. One strategy insists that, when I do not believe that I am clenching my fist, or that I will mail the bills, I do not intend the corresponding actions, I merely intend to try (Harman 1986, pp. 364–5; Velleman 1989, pp. 115–6). But do I really act as I intended if I try and fail? (See Pears 1985, p. 86; McCann 1991, p. 212.) And when I know that I am forgetful, do I even believe that I will try to mail the bills? A more radical response points to the simplifying assumption, often made in epistemology and the philosophy of action, that belief is binary and does not come by degree. On that assumption, it may be harmless to claim that intention involves belief. But the truth is bound to be more complex: that in forming an intention one becomes more confident than one would otherwise be (Setiya 2008, pp. 390–2); or that the will is a capacity to know what one is doing, or what one is going to do, whose exercise may be impeded, yielding mere belief or partial belief instead of knowledge (Pears 1985, pp. 78–81). While such maneuvers make it harder to construct decisive counterexamples, however, they do nothing to establish cognitive conditions on intention or the will. (For a view that incorporates partial belief but concludes against such conditions, see Holton 2009, Ch. 2.)

The second objection is epistemic. If forming an intention is, among other things, coming to believe that one is doing A, or that one is going to do A, what entitles us to form such beliefs? Not, or not ordinarily, that we have sufficient evidence of their truth. Forming an intention is not predicting the future on the basis of what one takes to be, or what ought to be, adequate grounds. That is why Anscombe calls practical knowledge ‘knowledge without observation,’ meaning to exclude not only observation in the narrow sense but knowledge by inference (Anscombe 1963, p. 50). And it is why Velleman (1989) writes about ‘spontaneous’ knowledge of action. Even though he hopes to reduce practical to theoretical reasoning, and holds that intention involves belief, he denies that intentions are formed on the basis of sufficient prior evidence. The postulation of beliefs that lack such support is sometimes regarded as a fatal flaw. In a memorable formulation, Grice (1971, p. 268) wrote that it makes decision ‘a case of licensed wishful thinking.’ According to Grice, we are not epistemically permitted to form beliefs about what we are doing, or what we are going to do, without sufficient prior evidence. Instead, we know what we are doing, or what we are going to do, by inference from the condition of our will, along with premises about our own abilities (Grice 1971, pp. 275–9; Paul 2009). The condition of the will does not itself involve belief.

Reactions to this problem vary widely. The most dismissive reject the demand for prior evidence outright, holding that we are justified in forming a belief if we will have sufficient evidence for its truth once formed, and that this condition is met when we are justified in forming an intention (Harman 1976, p. 164, n. 8; Velleman 1989, pp. 56–64). So long as I know what I intend, and that my intention will be effective, I have sufficient evidence for what I am doing, or what am I going to do, even though this evidence did not precede the forming of my intention. Others object that this assimilates intention to faith, as when I form the belief that I can leap a great chasm even though I have no evidence of my ability to do so, knowing that the belief itself will guarantee success. It is not clear that such acts of faith are possible, that they are epistemically rational, or that they provide a plausible model for intention (Langton 2004; Setiya 2008, §III). On less dismissive views, there is a general demand for prior evidence in forming beliefs, but our intentions are sometimes exempt from it, as perhaps when we know how to perform the relevant acts (Setiya 2008; Setiya forthcoming). Anscombe's position on the matter is elusive, and may have to do with her normative contrast between intention and belief. Is ‘practical knowledge’ exempt from ordinary requirements of evidence because there is no mistake of judgement when its object is false (See Anscombe 1963, pp. 4–5, 56–7)? Would it then amount to knowledge of what is not the case? (See Anscombe 1963, p. 82; though it is unclear whether she accepts or merely entertains this possibility.)

In the background of these disputes is a question about the scope of groundless (non-perceptual, non-inferential) self-knowledge. A blanket objection to beliefs formed without sufficient prior evidence cannot be sustained: I often know what I believe without having come to know on the basis of perception or inference. Is groundless knowledge of this kind restricted to our mental states? Or can it extend to what we are doing and what we are going to do? Compare externalism about content: at least typically, believing that p has implications for the constitution of the world outside one's skin; but it remains accessible to self-knowledge (Burge 1988). Why should that not be true of intentional action? On any reading, part of the aim of Anscombe's Intention was to break the Cartesian prejudice against self-knowledge of what is happening in the world. If she failed in that endeavour, she at least prescribed a task for future work: to say whether it is indeed a prejudice or a decisive obstacle to the possibility of practical knowledge and the theory that intention involves belief.


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action | agency: shared | choice, dynamic | double effect, doctrine of | practical reason | rationality: instrumental | self-knowledge | weakness of will


Thanks to Michael Bratman, Luca Ferrero, and Niko Kolodny for valuable comments on an earlier draft.