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Japanese Aesthetics

First published Mon Dec 12, 2005

Although the Japanese have been producing great art and writing about it for many centuries, the philosophical discipline in Japan corresponding to Western “aesthetics” did not get underway until the late nineteenth century. A good way to survey the field is to examine the most important aesthetic ideas that have arisen in the course of the tradition, all of them before aesthetics was formally established as a discipline: namely, mono no aware (the pathos of things), wabi (subdued, austere beauty), sabi (rustic patina), yûgen (mysterious profundity), and kire (cutting). (This last Japanese term is pronounced as two evenly accented syllables, the second of which rhymes with the vowel sound of “red.” The circumflex accents over some vowels signify a vowel sound of double length.)

1. Introduction

Two preliminary observations about the Japanese cultural tradition are in order. The first is that classical Japanese philosophy understands the basic reality as constant change, or (to use a Buddhist expression) impermanence. The world of flux that presents itself to our senses is the only reality: there is no conception of some stable “Platonic” realm above or behind it. The arts in Japan have traditionally reflected this fundamental impermanence—sometimes lamenting but more often celebrating it. The idea of mujô (impermanence) is perhaps most forcefully expressed in the writings and sayings of the thirteenth-century Zen thinker Dôgen Kigen, who is arguably Japan's profoundest philosopher, but here is a fine expression of it by a later Buddhist priest, Yoshida Kenkô, whose Tsurezuregusa (Essays in Idleness, 1332) sparkles with aesthetic insights:

“It does not matter how young or strong you may be, the hour of death comes sooner that you expect. It is an extraordinary miracle that you should have escaped to this day; do you suppose you have even the briefest respite in which to relax?” (Keene 1967: 120).

In the Japanese Buddhist tradition, awareness of the fundamental condition of existence is no cause for nihilistic despair, but rather a call to vital activity in the present moment and to gratitude for another moment's being granted to us.

The second observation is that the arts in Japan have tended to be closely connected with Confucian practices of self-cultivation, as evidenced in the fact that they are often referred to as “ways [of living]”: chadô, the way of tea (tea ceremony), shôdô, the way of writing (calligraphy), and so forth. And since the cultivated individual in China was expected to be skilled in the “Six Arts”—ceremonial ritual, music, charioteering, archery, calligraphy, and mathematics—the arts tend to be more closely interconnected than in the western traditions.

To this day it is not unusual in Japan for the scholar to be a fine calligrapher and an accomplished poet in addition to possessing the pertinent intellectual abilities.

2. Mono no aware: the Pathos of Things

The meaning of the phrase mono no aware is complex and changed over time, but it basically refers to a “pathos” (aware) of “things” (mono), deriving from their transience. In the classic anthology of Japanese poetry from the eighth century, the Manyôshû, the feeling of aware is typically triggered by the plaintive calls of birds or other animals. It also plays a major role in the world's first novel, Murasaki Shikibu's Genji monogatari (The Tale of Genji), from the early eleventh century. The somewhat later Heike monogatari (The Tale of the Heike Clan) begins with these famous lines, which clearly show impermanence as the basis for the feeling of mono no aware:

“The sound of the Gion shôja bells echoes the impermanence of all things; the color of the sôla flowers reveals the truth that the prosperous must decline. The proud do not endure, they are like a dream on a spring night; the mighty fall at last, they are as dust before the wind.” (McCullough 1988)

The well known literary theorist Motoori Norinaga brought the idea to the forefront of literary theory with a study of The Tale of Genji that showed mono no aware to be its central theme. He argues for a broader understanding of it as concerning a profound sensitivity to the emotional and affective dimensions of existence in general. The greatness of Lady Murasaki's achievement consists in her ability to portray characters with a profound sense of mono no aware in her writing, such that the reader is able to empathize with them in this feeling.

The films of Ozu Yasujirô, who is often thought to be the most “Japanese” of Japanese film directors, are a series of exercises in conveying mono no aware. Stanley Cavell's observation that “film returns to us and extends our first fascination with objects, with their inner and fixed lives” applies consummately to Ozu, who often expresses feelings through presenting the faces of things rather than of actors. A vase standing in the corner of a tatami-matted room where a father and daughter are asleep; two fathers contemplating the rocks in a “dry landscape” garden, their postures echoing the shapes of the stone; a mirror reflecting the absence of the daughter who has just left home after getting married—all images that express the pathos of things more powerfully than the expression on the greatest actor's face.

The most frequently cited example of mono no aware in contemporary Japan is the traditional love of cherry blossoms, as manifested by the huge crowds of people that go out every year to view (and picnic under) the cherry trees. The blossoms of the Japanese cherry trees are intrinsically no more beautiful than those of, say, the pear or the apple tree: they are more highly valued because of their transience, since they usually begin to fall within a week of their first appearing. It is precisely the evanescence of their beauty that evokes the wistful feeling of mono no aware in the viewer.

3. Wabi: Simple, Austere Beauty

In his Essays in Idleness Kenkô asks, “Are we to look at cherry blossoms only in full bloom, at the moon only when it is cloudless?” (Keene 1967: 115). If for the Buddhists the basic condition is impermanence, to privilege as consummate only certain moments in the eternal flux may signify a refusal to accept that basic condition. Kenkô continues: “To long for the moon while looking on the rain, to lower the blinds and be unaware of the passing of the spring—these are even more deeply moving. Branches about to blossom or gardens strewn with faded flowers are worthier of our admiration.” This is an example of the idea of wabi, understated beauty, which was first distinguished and praised when expressed in poetry. But it is in the art of tea, and the context of Zen, that the notion of wabi is most fully developed.

In the Nampôroku (1690), a record of sayings by the tea master Sen no Rikyû, we read: “In the small [tea] room, it is desirable for every utensil to be less than adequate. There are those who dislike a piece when it is even slightly damaged; such an attitude shows a complete lack of comprehension” (Hirota 1995:226). Implements with minor imperfections are often valued more highly, on the wabi aesthetic, than ones that are ostensibly perfect; and broken or cracked utensils, as long as they have been well repaired, more highly than unbroken. The wabi aesthetic does not imply asceticism but rather moderation, as this passage from the Nampôroku demonstrates: “The meal for a gathering in a small room should be but a single soup and two or three dishes; sakè should also be served in moderation. Elaborate preparation of food for the wabi gathering is inappropriate” (Hirota 1995:227).

The Zencharoku (Zen Tea Record, 1828) contains a well known section on the topic of wabi, which begins by saying that it is simply a matter of “upholding the [Buddhist] precepts” (Hirota 1995:274). The author continues: “Wabi means that even in straitened circumstances no thought of hardship arises. Even amid insufficiency, one is moved by no feeling of want. Even when faced with failure, one does not brood over injustice. If you find being in straitened circumstances to be confining, if you lament insufficiency as privation, if you complain that things have been ill-disposed—this is not wabi” (Hirota 1995:275). The way of tea exemplifies this attitude toward life in the elegant simplicity of the tea house and the utensils, which contradict any notion that beauty entails magnificence and opulence.

4. Sabi: Rustic Patina

The term sabi occurs often in the Manyôshû, where it has a connotation of desolateness (sabireru means “to become desolate”), and later on it seems to acquire the meaning of something that has aged well, grown rusty (another word pronounced sabi means “rust”), or has acquired a patina that makes it beautiful.

The importance of sabi for the way of tea was affirmed by the great fifteenth-century tea master Shukô, founder of one of the first schools of tea ceremony. As a distinguished commentator puts it: “The concept sabi carries not only the meaning ‘aged’—in the sense of ‘ripe with experience and insight’ as well as ‘infused with the patina that lends old things their beauty’—but also that of tranquility, aloneness, deep solitude” (Hammitzsch 1980: 46).

The idea of sabi also occurs in the haiku of the famous seventeenth-century poet Matsuo Bashô, where its connection with the word sabishi (solitary, lonely) is emphasized. The following haiku typifies sabi(shi) in conveying an atmosphere of solitude or loneliness that undercuts (as is usual in Japanese poetry) the distinction between subjective and objective:

Solitary now —
Standing amidst the blossoms
Is a cypress tree.

Contrasting with the colorful beauty of the blossoms, the more subdued gracefulness of the cypress—no doubt older than the person seeing it but no less solitary—typifies the poetic mood of sabi.

In 1950 a deranged Buddhist acolyte burned to the ground the late fourteenth-century Golden Pavilion at Kinkakuji in Kyoto. An exact replica was built on the original site in 1955.

thumbnail photo of Kinkakuji thumbnail photo of Kinkakuji

Enlarged Photographs of Kinkakuji

The aesthetic qualities of the original structure are celebrated in Mishima Yukio's novel The Temple of the Golden Pavilion (1956), as well as in Ichikawa Kon's classic film Enjo (Conflagration, 1958). In 1987, the burgeoning Japanese economy made it possible for the first time in the building's history to cover the entire structure with gold leaf, according to the creator's original intention. The result is breathtakingly spectacular—but totally un-Japanese. Old-time residents of Kyoto famously complained that it would take a long time for the building to acquire sufficient sabi to be worth looking at again. At the rate the patina seems to be progressing, probably several centuries.

5. Yûgen: Profound Grace

Yûgen may be, among generally recondite Japanese aesthetic ideas, the most ineffable. The term is first found in Chinese philosophical texts, where it has the meaning of “dark,” or “mysterious.”

Kamo no Chômei, the author of the well-known Hôjôki (An Account of my Hut, 1212), also wrote about poetry and considered yûgen to be a primary concern of the poetry of his time. He offers the following as a characerization of yûgen: “It is like an autumn evening under a colorless expanse of silent sky. Somehow, as if for some reason that we should be able to recall, tears well uncontrollably.” Another characterization helpfully mentions the importance of the imagination: “When looking at autumn mountains through mist, the view may be indistinct yet have great depth. Although few autumn leaves may be visible through the mist, the view is alluring. The limitless vista created in imagination far surpasses anything one can see more clearly” (Hume 1995: 253-54).

This passage instantiates a general feature of East-Asian culture, which favors allusiveness over explicitness and completeness. Yûgen does not, as has sometimes been supposed, have to do with some other world beyond this one, but rather with the depth of the world we live in, as experienced through cultivated imagination.

The art in which the notion of yûgen has played the most important role is the Nô drama, one of the world's great theater traditions, which attained its highest flourishing through the artistry of Zeami Motokiyo (1363-1443). Zeami wrote a number of treatises on Nô drama, in which yûgen (“Grace”) figures as “the highest principle” (Rimer 1984: 92). He associates it with the highly refined culture of the Japanese nobility, and with their speech in particular, though there is also in Nô a “Grace of music,” a “Grace of performance [of different roles],” and a “Grace of the dance” (Rimer 1984: 93). It is something rare, that is attained only by the greatest actors in the tradition, and only after decades of dedicated practice of the art. It is impossible to conceptualize, so that Zeami often resorts to imagery in trying to explain it: “Cannot the beauty of Grace be compared to the image of a swan holding a flower in its bill, I wonder?” (Rimer 1984: 73).

The most famous formulation comes at the beginning of Zeami's “Notes on the Nine Levels [of artistic attainment in Nô],” where the highest level is referred to as “the art of the flower[ing] of peerless charm”:

“The meaning of the phrase Peerless Charm surpasses any explanation in words and lies beyond the workings of consciousness. It can surely be said that the phrase ‘in the dead of night, the sun shines brightly’ exists in a realm beyond logical explanation. Indeed, concerning the Grace of the greatest performers in our art ” [it gives rise to] the moment of Feeling that Transcends Cognition, and to an art that lies beyond any level that the artist may consciously have attained.” (Rimer 1984: 120)

This passage alludes to the results of a pattern of rigorous discipline that informs many “performing arts” (which would include the tea ceremony and calligraphy as well as theater) in Japan, as well as East-Asian martial arts. Nô is exemplary in this respect, since its forms of diction, gestures, gaits, and dance movements are all highly stylized and extremely unnatural. The idea is that one practices for years a “form” (kata) that goes counter to the natural movements of the body and thus requires tremendous discipline—to the point of a breakthrough to a “higher naturalness” that is exhibited when the form has been consummately incorporated. This kind of spontaneity gives the impression, as in the case of Grace, of something “supernatural.”

6. Kire: Cutting

A distinctive notion in Japanese aesthetic discourse is that of the “cut” (kire) or, “cut-continuity” (kire-tsuzuki). The “cut” is a basic trope in Rinzai School of Zen Buddhjism, especially as exemplified in the teachings of the Zen master Hakuin (1686-1769). For Hakuin the aim of “seeing into one's own nature” can only be realized if one has “cut off the root of life”: “You must be prepared to let go your hold when hanging from a sheer precipice, to die and return again to life” (Hakuin 1971: 133-35). The cut appears as a fundamental feature in the distinctively Japanese art of flower arrangement called ikebana. The term means literally “making flowers live”—a strange name, on first impression at least, for an art that begins by initiating their death. There is an exquisite essay by Nishitani Keiji on this marvelous art, in which organic life is cut off precisely in order to let the true nature of the flower come to the fore (Nishitani 1995: 23-7). There is something curiously deceptive, from the Buddhist viewpoint of the impermanence of all things, about plants, which, by sinking roots into the earth and lacking locomotion, assume an appearance of being especially “at home” wherever they are. In severing the flowers from their roots, Nishitani suggests, and placing them in an alcove, one is letting them show themselves as they truly are: as absolutely rootless as every other being in this world of radical impermanence.

The notion of cut-continuation is exemplified in the highly stylized gait of the actors in the Nô drama. The actor slides the foot along the floor with the toes raised, and then “cuts” off the movement by quickly lowering the toes to the floor—and beginning at that precise moment the sliding movement along the floor with the other foot. This stylization of the natural human walk draws attention to the episodic nature of life, which is also reflected in the pause between every exhalation of air from the lungs and the next inhalation. Through attending to the breath in zen meditation one becomes aware that the pause between exhalation and inhalation is different—more of a cut—from that between inhalation and exhalation. This reflects the possibility of life's being cut off at any moment: the one exhalation that isn't followed by an inhalation, known as “breathing one's last.”

Cutting also appears in the “cut-syllable” (kireji) in the art of haiku poetry, which cuts off one image from—at the same time as it links it to—the next. There is a famous cut-syllable at the end of the first line of the most famous haiku by Bashô, the most famous haiku poet:

Furuike ya
Kawazu tobikomu
Mizu no oto.
Ah, an ancient pond—
Suddenly a frog jumps in!
The sound of water.

The most distinctively Japanese style of garden, the “dry landscape” (karesansui) garden, owes its existence to the dry landscape's being “cut off” from the natural world outside its borders. The epitome of this style is the rock garden at Ryôanji in Kyoto, where fifteen “mountain”-shaped rocks are set in beds of moss in a rectangular “sea” of white gravel.

thumbnail photo of Ryoangi thumbnail photo of Ryoangi
thumbnail photo of Ryoangi thumbnail photo of Ryoangi

Enlarged Sequence of Ryoangi Photographs

(The Japanese word for landscape, sansui, means literally “mountains waters”: see Berthier 2000). At Ryôanji the rock garden is cut off from the outside by a splendid wall that is nevertheless low enough to permit a view of the natural surroundings. This cut, which is in a way doubled by the angled roof that runs along the top of the wall and seems to cut it off, is most evident in the contrast between movement and stillness. Above and beyond the wall there is nature in movement: branches wave and sway, clouds float by, and the occasional bird flies past. But unless rain or snow is falling, or a stray leaf is blown across, the only movement visible within the garden is shadowed or illusory, as the sun or moon casts moving shadows of tree branches on the motionless gravel.

The garden is cut off on the near side too, by a border of pebbles (larger, darker, and more rounded than the pieces of gravel) that runs along the east and north edges. There is a striking contrast between the severe rectangularity of the garden's borders and the irregular natural forms of the rocks within them. The expanse of gravel is also cut through by the upthrust of the rocks from below: earth energies mounting and peaking in irruptions of stone. Each group of rocks is cut off from the others by the expanse of gravel, and the separation enhanced by the “ripple” patterns in the raking that surrounds each group (and some individual rocks). And yet the overall effect of these cuttings is actually to intensify the invisible lines of connection among the rocks, whose interrelations exemplify the fundamental Buddhist insight of “dependent co-arising” (engi).

A corresponding process can be seen in the rock garden, insofar as its being cut off from the surrounding nature has the effect of drying up its organic life, which then no longer decays in the usual manner. Being dried up (the kare of karesansui means “withered”), the mountains and waters of the garden at Ryôanji at first appear less temporary than their counterparts outside, which manifest the cyclical changes that organic life is heir to. But just as plants look deceptively permanent thanks to their being rooted in the earth, so the rocks of the dry landscape garden give a misleading impression of permanence, especially when one revisits them over a period of years. As participants in (what Thoreau called) “the great central life” of the earth, rocks have a life that unfolds in time sequences that are different from ours—and yet also subject to the impermanence that conditions all things.

7. Ozu Yasujirô: Consummate Cuts

The garden at Ryôanji makes a brief but significant appearance in one of the classics of Japanese cinema, Ozu Yasujirô's Late Spring (1949). It comes right after one of the film's most famous images: a vase standing on a tatami mat in front of a window on which silhouettes of bamboo are projected. The scene in question consists of eight shots, seven of which show the Ryôanji rocks (of which there are fifteen in total), and which are separated and joined by seven cuts. (Ozu hardly ever uses any other transition than the cut, such as the wipe.) After two shots of rocks in the garden, the camera angle reverses and we see the main protagonist with his friend—they are both fathers of daughters—sitting on the wooden platform with the tops of two rocks occupying the lower part of the frame. Two rocks and two fathers. Cut to a close-up of the fathers from their left side, with no rocks in view. In their dark suits, and seated in the classic Ozu “overlapping triangles” configuration, leaning forward toward the garden with their arms around knees drawn up toward their chins, they resemble two rocks. They talk about how they raise children who then go off to live their own lives. As they invoke such manifestations of impermanence, they remain motionless except for the occasional nod or turn of the head.

Enlarged Sequence of Stills from Late Spring

In their brief conversation by the edge of the garden, the two fathers do little more than exchange platitudes about family life—and yet the scene is a profoundly moving expression of the human condition. It gains this effect from the assimilation of the figures of the two men to rocks, which seems to affirm the persistence of cycles of impermanence. These images of assimilation capture one of the central ideas behind the dry landscape garden: that of the continuum between human consciousness and stone, which is also understandable as the kinship of awareness with its original basis.

The opening shots of Tokyo Story (1953), which some consider Ozu's greatest film, are also exemplary with respect to the cutting. The first shot shows a shrine sculpture to the left of center and behind it an estuary with a boat chugging along to the right. The hills on the horizon rise gradually to the right. After ten seconds, just as the boat is about to disappear beyond the frame—there is a cut to the pavement on the side of a street. A cart now occupies the left foreground of the frame, and beside it stand two large bottles (Ozu's signature shapes). Eight small children in school uniform walk away from the camera to the right. Continuity is provided by a parallel between the river and horizon of the first scene and the horizontal lines of the pavement and houses in the second, as well as by the movement toward the right. Also aurally by the continuing sound of the boat's putt-putting. A ninth child appears and as he passes the bottles and reaches the center of the frame—there is a cut to a shot over the roofs of houses of a train traveling to the right, with behind it the buildings of a shrine or temple, and then hills behind those. The putting sound of the boat continues before being drowned out by the sound of the train, and the almost horizontal line of the train's passage continue to be congruent with those of the street, descending gradually to the right. Smoke issues from two chimneys at left and center, the scene lasting fifteen seconds.

As the end of the train reaches the center of the frame—the sound continues but there is a cut to a closer shot of the train from the hill side, so that it is now moving up along a diagonal to the left. Behind the houses on the other side of the train is the estuary again. As the train's whistle blows—there is a cut to a shrine surrounded by pine trees and statuary standing on an embankment with the estuary in the background on the far left. Continuity is provided by a chimney in the foreground that spouts smoke as the train's steam whistle continues. The main line has reverted to a horizontal line rising toward the right. After six seconds, the shortest scene so far—there is a cut to a grandfather and grandmother sitting on the tatami matting of their home in the village, facing toward the right. The grandfather, consulting a timetable, says, “We'll pass Osaka at around 6:00 this evening,” referring to a train trip they are just about to take to Tokyo, which will initiate the film's main action.

Enlarged Sequence of Stills from Tokyo Story

For each cut Ozu has arranged for at least one formal element to provide continuity (kire-tsuzuki) between the adjacent scenes. There are of course other directors capable of consummate cuts, but a study of the numerous cuttings in Ozu's oeuvre show them to constitute what is perhaps “the kindest cut of all” in world cinema.


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The photographs of of the Kinkakuji temple and the Ryôanji rock garden are by Susanne Z. Riehemann, and are reproduced here with her permission. The acknowledgements for the still images from the films discussed in Section 7 are: Late Spring, directed by Ozu Yasujirô, 1949, copyright by Shochiku Co., Ltd.; and Tokyo Story, directed by Ozu Yasujirô, 1953, copyright by Shochiku Co., Ltd.