Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Joseph Kaspi

First published Tue Jun 6, 2006

Harry A. Wolfson once described medieval philosophy as a philosophy “which placed itself at the service of Scriptures” (Philo, II, p. 439). From a formal aspect, a new genre was created: “From now on, a new form of exposition appears in philosophic literature, the homily on some scriptural text or the running commentary upon some scriptural books” (p. 444). Joseph ibn Kaspi is a perfect illustration of this characterization of the medieval philosopher. He wrote some thirty works dedicated to explaining the Bible, in which philosophy served him both as a method and as a compendium of philosophical conclusions which, to his mind, the biblical author had wanted to convey to the reader. Some of Kaspi's works were devoted to logic and linguistics as methods suitable for biblical exegesis; others were commentaries on books of the Bible or supercommentaries, and he also wrote on theological subjects. Of this vast oeuvre, only some has been published; much remains in manuscript, and some works have apparently been lost.

1. Life

Joseph b. Abba Mari ibn Kaspi was born in Argentière, Provence, in 1280. His wife bore him a son and a daughter in Tarascon, and apparently engaged in moneylending to support him. He spent much of his life traveling from place to place, perhaps for domestic reasons: a troubled relationship with his wife, and the need to visit his children in Perpignan, Provence, and Valencia, Spain. We may also assume that his elitist tendencies forced him to leave the Jewish community of his home town; there is also some evidence of Christian persecution. Nevertheless, Kaspi himself ridiculed those who abandoned their homes, “for such is the custom of the fools of our time... that when some misfortune or accident befalls them in their place of residence they move to another place” (Commentary on Proverbs, p. 98). He attributed his own peregrinations to his constant quest for wisdom:

Twenty years ago, I became an exile to a place reputed for learning… I crossed to Egypt where I visited the College of that renowned and perfect sage, the Guide [=Maimonides]. I found there the fourth and fifth generations of his holy seed, all of them righteous, but none of them devoted to science. In all the Orient there were no scholars… A day came when the spirit of the Lord moved me to search among the capitals of the West; so I traveled through Catalonia and Aragon, and at this moment I live in the great city of Valencia. If the Quickener of the dead grant me life, I will again traverse the whole of Aragon and Spain. I will cross to Fez, for I have heard that it is a seat of learning

Kaspi was well educated. Besides Hebrew and Provençal, he was apparently also proficient in Arabic and Latin. He was familiar with the classical Hebrew religious literature, such as the Talmud and earlier Bible commentaries. He was well versed in the works of Maimonides and his translator Samuel ibn Tibbon, and probably also familiar with Falaquera's commentary on The Guide of the Perplexed. By his own admission, however, his knowledge of halakhic literature was limited. Among the philosophers he mentions, besides Plato and Aristotle, are Averro‘s, Avicenna, Boethius, Fārābi, and Galen. The date of his death is unknown; the latest date in his works is 1332. He must have died several years later, however, since he wrote several books after that date.

2. Exegesis

Kaspi considered himself primarily as a commentator. He distinguishes between a “commentary” (perush) and an independent work (chibbur), declaring, “I do not define a work as a ‘commentary’ unless it brings us to the real intention of the author of the book” (Commentary on the Song of Songs, p. 184). Nevertheless, he sometimes admits his inability to prove that his interpretation represents the author's real meaning, particular when that “author” is the biblical author, i.e., God Himself:

I do not assert that the intention of its Giver [= of the Torah] was those same purposes that I have assumed, for perhaps those were not intended, but he combined them with other intentions, which are presently hidden from us... For the same thing may have many purposes that do not necessarily contradict one another... But what I say..., whether I prophesy the intention of their author or not, at any rate, what I say is true, that we have learned such and such a matter from the subject of the narratives (Tirat Kesef, p. 64).

Understanding the author's intention is thus seen as a kind of prophecy (“whether I prophesy the intention...”). Kaspi's interpretative truth, he insists, is concerned not with the author and his intention, but with the reader and his or her understanding: The commentator can speak for himself alone. Such exegesis is subjective, dependent on each of the work's innumerable readers. Nevertheless, Kaspi is sometimes fairly certain of the author's meaning:

I have revealed to you what the Lord revealed to us of His secrets, for I think that we have thereby arrived in this chapter at the author's intention; “the truth,” as Aristotle says, “is its own witness, agreeing in every aspect.” The meaning of “agreeing in every aspect” is in what he explained, saying, “that one aspect thereof attests to [another] aspect...”... Now our own Sages of blessed memory have already said, “words of truth are recognizable” [Babylonian Talmud, Sotah 9b] (Tirat Kesef, p. 83).

Kaspi here outlines a rather pretentious doctrine, namely, that God somehow informed him of the secret hidden in the text. The criterion of his certainty is coherence. However, given Kaspi's own theology (see below), there is no need to assume that he was claiming to have received a supernatural revelation.

3. Logic

Kaspi accused his predecessors of misunderstanding Scripture because they had not used logic:

The truth has evaded some of the commentators in this and other matters in many places, for they are ignorant of the science of logic, and even if some of them do know it, they do not remember its foundations when they comment (Commentary on Esther, p. 32).

He himself wrote a brief treatise on logic (Tseror ha-Kesef), in which he summarized what he believed were important principles for a correct interpretation of Scripture. His own exegesis applies a variety of techniques: categorizing genera and species, distinguishing between essential and non-essential qualities, asserting the symmetry of relation, understanding the law of contradiction, recognizing valid and invalid syllogisms, as well as logical fallacies. For example, he criticizes commentators who conclude from the truth of a proposition that its individual parts are also true. To illustrate, he cites the verse “There was no man to till the soil” (Genesis 2:5): this verse does not imply that there were at the time no human beings—a proposition at variance with the Aristotelian thesis (to which Kaspi apparently subscribed) that the world has always existed alongside God.

4. Philosophy of language

Another methodological discipline that Kaspi used was the philosophy of language. While agreeing with Aristotle that languages are conventional rather than natural, he places Hebrew on a higher level, arguing that its combinations of letters into words are not accidental. A Hebrew word denotes the qualities of the object designated, and there is a one-to-one relation between words and their designata. In Kaspi's view, all Hebrew words are distinct; Hebrew has no real synonyms or homonyms. In support of this view he wrote a kind of dictionary of the roots of biblical Hebrew (Sharshot Kesef), in which he gave each root a single core meaning. Thus, for example, the root l-ch-m denotes “opposition and resistance,” and from it are derived the Hebrew words for “war” (milchamah) and “bread” (lechem). He explains the use of this root for “bread” in light of Aristotle's proposition in On the Soul 416 that “Food is... the contrary of what is fed.” Kaspi expresses amazement that anyone should disagree with this principle: “For how could a person think that the creators of the language, who were great scholars, could have used one noun... for things between which there is no relationship at all” (Sharshot Kesef, ed. Last, p. 29).

5. Theology and anthropology

Kaspi thus bases his biblical exegesis on the conventional theological assumptions of the philosophy of his times: God is a necessary existent, the Unmoved Mover, the intellect that intellectually cognizes itself. Kaspi's description of God as the intellect borders on a certain conception of divine immanence, as he makes the description symmetric: God is the intellect and the intellect is in effect God:

For we are our intellect in actu, we bring God into our minds, for the intellect is God and God is the intellect... For that reason Moses was called “a man of God,” because God was in his mind always... I mean to say, “divine power,” and there is no difference if one says “God” or “God's power,” since that same power is the intellect and God is the intellect (Maskiyot Kesef, p. 98).

Kaspi proposes another radical doctrine in connection with the Aristotelian conception of God as both the intellect, intellectually cognizer, and the intellectually cognized object: he compares this conception with the Holy Trinity of Christian theology. He is even willing to accept a moderate interpretation of the Trinity: “Some individuals among them (the Christians) are similar to us (in opinions)” (Gevia‘ ha-Kesef, p. 27).

Kaspi explains the relation between God and the world in as naturalistic a manner as possible. He agrees with the position, attributed to Aristotle and Plato, that the world was not created ex nihilo at a certain point in time, arguing that this was also Maimonides' position. In that spirit Kaspi himself proposes a systematic explanation of the creation as described in Genesis.

God's continual providence of the world is also understood by Kaspi in entirely naturalistic terms. He interprets the biblical miracles as rare but natural phenomena—an idea not dissimilar to Spinoza's teachings. To say that a certain phenomenon is contrary to natural law, Kaspi writes, is a subjective judgment, “for there is no doubt that those ignorant of natural science believe many natural things to be miraculous, not natural phenomena” (Tirat Kesef, p. 12). This may be compared with Spinoza in his Tractatus Theologico-Politicus (Chap. 6): “[S]ince miracles were wrought according to the understanding of the masses, who are wholly ignorant of the workings of nature,... we cannot doubt that many things are narrated in Scripture as miracles of which the causes could easily be explained by reference to ascertained workings of nature.” Kaspi also holds that a wise prophet is capable of performing miracles thanks to the possession of extensive knowledge. Moses, the wisest of men, performed miracles in Egypt because “he had acquired knowledge of the celestial body... as he had apprehended the world of the [four sublunar] elements” (Menorat Kesef, p. 93). This knowledge enabled him to inflict the plagues upon the Egyptians: “Moses performed with the four [elements] actions that would be impossible for any [other] wise man” (Commentary on Proverbs B, p. 127).

Discussing the relationship between the prophet and the wise man, Kaspi agrees with the Muslim thinker al-Batalyusi that a person with a prophetic soul is superior in level and essence to the wise man who has a philosophical soul. Nevertheless, prophecy is not a super-rational phenomenon. A prophet's knowledge of the future is based on deductive inference, since he or she is well acquainted with the world and with all details of natural causality.

The ability of God and the prophets to foresee the future, despite the apparent contradiction with the principle of (free) choice, also receives a rational explanation. Kaspi proposes an analogy between their positive knowledge and the knowledge of wise men “with a good sense of evaluation and estimation,” who are capable of foreseeing the probable behavior of a person on the basis of their knowledge of his or her character. Like most medieval theologians, Kaspi accepts the simultaneous validity of an omniscient God and human choice..

Not unrelated to this antinomy is the theological problem posed by the human capacity for voluntary action: Maimonides stated the difficulty as follows: “How is it possible that a person can do whatever he pleases?... How can anything be done in the world without the permission and will of its Creator?” (Hilkhot Teshuvah 5:4). Maimonides' own solution was to define human choice as one expression of the divine will, which is the cause of everything that takes place in the world; accordingly, God “desired man to have his own free will” (ibid.). Kaspi goes farther, however, suggesting the radical view that God is “the remote mover,” even when a person chooses to realize his free will by sinning and worshiping idols; it was in that sense that the Bible described God as hardening Pharaoh's heart (Matsref la-Kesef, pp. 152–153).

In any case, Kaspi provides his readers with guidelines for a virtuous life. As a rationalist through and through, he recommends that a person acquire the best possible education. Every effort should be made to accumulate the financial resources necessary to improve one's education, by purchasing books and hiring teachers. Every man should set up a family: His wife will support him, and his children will keep him in his old age, “so that he should have time to acquire wisdom... Moreover, his sons, if they are good, will join him in his studies, all the more so if his eyes have become dimmed with age” (Commentary on Proverbs, pp. 59–60). This is a wholly utilitarian and egoistical philosophy, recommending self-realization of every human being. Kaspi enunciates these guidelines in the context of his scriptural exegesis, relying primarily on the wisdom literature written, according to Jewish tradition, by King Solomon, the wisest of men; he also derives his rules from biblical stories, citing the behavior of their heroes.

Kaspi's elitist principles, which creates a disparity between the wise and the masses, also implied a similarity between humans and other creatures One application of this thesis may be found in his commentary to Isaiah 41:14, referring to the phrase “worm of Jacob”:

For we are of the genus of the animals, similar in genus to the lowest of the creeping insects. We are also their equal in every respect, unless we realize the potential of our intellect. All that is... so that we should be aroused to acquire intelligence and the intelligibles, for in them we differ from the worms... (Adnei Kesef, p. 151).

In this context Kaspi expressed compassion for animals, coupled with a tendency toward vegetarianism, profound disapproval of sacrifices; he even expresses disapproval of Abraham's willingness to sacrifice his son.

6. Conclusion

If medieval philosophy from Philo to Spinoza may indeed be understood as philosophy at the service of biblical exegesis, Joseph ibn Kaspi may certainly be viewed as one of its most successful representatives. As already mentioned, in some contexts he also anticipated some of Spinoza's controversial ideas. In addition, both Kaspi and Spinoza held that only man is capable of loving God, whereas God does not love man (Kaspi, Commentary on Isaiah, p. 151; Spinoza, Ethics, On the Ability of the Intellect, Theorem 17).

Despite his brilliance and original thought, Kaspi has never been considered one of the most important medieval Jewish thinkers or commentators. Only in the 19th century were some of his works published for the first time, and others have yet to see the light of day. There are several possible explanations. Perhaps his controversial ideas militated against his acceptance in the surrounding society. Another explanation is implied by a comparison between Kaspi and his more famous contemporary, Gersonides, also a biblical exegete and philosopher; Gersonides, despite his by no means conservative ideas, earned considerable fame among both Jewish and non-Jewish thinkers. This was largely thanks to his systematic, profound, philosophical work Milchamot Hashem, which placed him squarely in the realm of philosophy, while his Bible commentaries were written in the spirit of plain interpretation. Kaspi, however, was something of a philosopher among commentators and a commentator among philosophers; perhaps that was why he never attained prominence in either group.


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Maimonides | Tibbon, Samuel Ibn