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The Kokugaku (Native Studies) School

First published Thu Apr 19, 2007

The term “Kokugaku,” literally “the study of our country,” refers to an intellectual movement that emerged in late eighteenth century Japan in explicit opposition to “Kangaku” or “Chinese Studies,” the study of Confucian works. Those associated with the Kokugaku movement criticized the study of the Confucian classics, the primary object of intellectual endeavor in early modern Japan, and made the earliest Japanese works, which they asserted had escaped Chinese influence, the object of philological and exegetical examination. Ironically, even these works, the mytho-histories Kojiki (“Record of Ancient Matters,” 712 and Nihon shoki (“Chronicles of Japan,” 720), and the poetic anthology, Man'yôshû (“The Ten Thousand Leaves,” (late 8th century), were written in Chinese characters and to a large degree in what is recognizable as the syntax of classical Chinese, since they predate the formation of the Japanese syllabaries. However, Motoori Norinaga (1730-1801), arguably the most influential of the nativist scholars, asserted that when rigorously read with a correct understanding of the ancient Japanese language, these texts reveal that Japan had in ancient times been a natural community in which subject and ruler lived in perfect harmony with each other and the deities, with no need for the flawed ethical principles or coercive forms of governance authorized by Confucianism. Norinaga's work established the issues of language and textuality as central methodological concerns within Kokugaku discourse and made the exposition of cultural and social difference (first in relation to China and later with the West) a central theme.

In the mid-nineteenth century, some students of Kokugaku, most notably those associated with the school of Hirata Atsutane (1776-1843), became involved in the movement to overthrow the Shogunate and return the emperor to real political power. They asserted that the ancient texts revealed that the emperor alone was divinely authorized to govern Japan. After the Meiji Restoration of 1868, modern ideologues used language and ideas derived from Kokugaku discourse to create of a new ideology of imperial rule. From the 1880s onward, scholars working within the new modern disciplines of “National Literature” and “National History” argued that Kokugaku represented the rise of a modern sense of nation among the Japanese people. After World War II, however, Kokugaku came to be widely viewed as the intellectual point of origin for views that contributed to the rise of fascism and militarism in Japan in the 1930s and 40s.

1. The Origins of Kokugaku

Hirata Atsutane, the most prominent nativist scholar of the 1830s and 40s, traced the origin of Kokugaku to the work of Keichû (1640-1701), and many modern intellectual historians have confirmed this genealogy. Keichû was a Buddhist priest and scholar of Japanese poetic form known as waka, when he entered into the employment of Tokugawa Mitsukuni in the 1680s. One of the most powerful retainers of the shogun and a dedicated student of Confucianism, Mitsukuni wanted to compile a comprehensive history of Japan and employed many scholars to carry out textual studies in preparation for this project. Keichû was given the task of preparing a commentary of the Man'yôshû, the oldest poetic anthology in Japan. Like the two other eighth century texts, the Kojiki and Nihon shoki, it was written entirely in Chinese characters, with some deployed semantically and others phonetically. Keichû argued that the Man'yôshû poems could not be understood by reference to Confucian discourse because the perspective of the ancient Japanese was fundamentally informed by their faith in indigenous deities. In fact, he attributed the creation of the waka form (five lines of 5, 7, 5, 7, 7 syllables) to the deity Susanoo and said that this form continued to have a mystical power to move men and nature. Based on this, Keichû argued against the Confucian perspective that poetry served a didactic purpose by conveying ethical principles (Nosco, 56). Equally influential was Keichû's valorization of the ancient Japanese language he reconstructed through his study of the Man'yôshû. He characterized this as the Japanese language in its original and pristine state and viewed it as aesthetically superior to the language of his time

Keichû's work marked an important, but not necessarily original, critique of the universalist assumptions of what is often termed Neo-Confucianism; that is, the reinterpretation of Confucianism that took form in the work of Zhu Xi and other Song period scholars, which was the most influential form of intellectual practice in seventeenth century Japan. The Song Confucianists, by delineating a set of moral principles that were said to originate in nature and be manifest in all things, sought to establish the essential unity of natural laws, physical existence, and human conduct across time and space in spite of the appearance of cultural difference and historical change. Keichû was writing at the same time as Itô Jinsai (1627-1705), the founder of what is called the “Ancient Learning” school of Confucianism, who rejected the tenets of Neo-Confucianism on historicist grounds and argued for the necessity of returning to the original meaning of the Confucian classics. Mayn scholars have argued that Keichû's work was influenced by that of Itô, although there is no empirical evidence to support this claim. In any case, Keichû's work inspired new interest in the earliest Japanese texts, a new concern for conceptualizing the “difference” of the ancient Japanese language, and a new desire to interrogate the meaning of Confucian principles for Japanese society and culture.

Of those who took up the study of the ancient texts following Keichû, the most notable for the formation of Kokugaku was Kamo no Mabuchi (1730-1801), whom Norinaga would claim as his teacher, although the two only met on one occasion. Like Keichû, Mabuchi is best known for his work on the Man'yôshû, and he privileged the language of ancient times. Mabuchi, however, provided a new explanation of the superiority of ancient language when he asserted that it was the introduction of alien sounds through the mediation of Chinese written texts that had“corrupted” the ancient language. Central to Mabuchi's valorization of ancient Japanese was his assertion that the original fifty sounds of Japanese —what modern linguists might term phonemes—were derived from nature itself. In ancient times, when all communication relied upon these “natural” sounds there was a seamless relationship between human perception, the world itself, and language. However, according to Mabuchi, cultural contact with China introduced writing and with writing came new sounds that were “unnatural.” As a result, the original unity of man/nature/ sound was disrupted, with the result that the immediacy of experience and perception that characterized existence in ancient times was lost. For Mabuchi, the study of ancient texts came to be implicated in a new project, the recovery of the form of subjectness that characterized the Japanese in ancient times. (Harootunian, 50-56) (By “subjectness,” I mean to indicate an historicized and materialist conception of subjectivity.) To this end, Mabuchi advocated that Japanese of his day master the syntax and vocabulary of the Man'yôshû and other early texts and employ it in their own writing in the belief that resurrecting the language of the past would allow for the recovery of what Mabuchi called the “spirit” of the ancient people.

The conception of the ancient language that took form in the work of Keichû and Mabuchi marks the beginning of a new concern for temporal and cultural difference that contested the universalist assumptions of Confucianism. However, within their work, the new ideological value attached to the Japanese language did not lead to an overt attack on either Confucian metaphysics or history. It was Motoori Norinaga who made linguistic claims about the “difference” of ancient Japanese into the foundation of a theory of Japanese cultural uniqueness and superiority.

2. Motoori Norinaga's Kojikiden

The best-known figure of the Kokugaku movement was Motoori Norinaga, who authored the Kojikiden (“Commentaries on the Kojiki”). This work, begun in 1764 and completed thirty years later, transformed Japanese conceptions of their own history and culture and made the Kojiki, then still a relatively obscure text, a central work in the Japanese cultural canon. The Kojiki today is available in numerous annotated additions, but to a large degree the editors of these works have accepted the premise of the Kojikiden, namely that this work, although inscribed entirely in Chinese characters, is not only readable as “Japanese” but in fact intended to be read in this way. Within the Kojikiden, the notion that the Kojiki was compiled to record an authentically Japanese language became the lynchpin of a series of claims: that, the Kojiki related in an unmediated form the events of the so-called “Divine Age” during which the Japanese islands were created and the Japanese imperial line created, that this narrative depicted the proper form of social relations and governance for “our country,” that deciphering the language of the text would make possible the recovery not only these social relations, but also of an intrinsically “Japanese” mode of subject-ness that had existed in archaic times.

Both the Kojiki and the other mytho-history, the Nihon shoki, were compiled in the early eighth century by officials of a newly centralized theocratic state centered in western Japan. The Nihon shoki continued to be the object of court-supported scholarship until its publication in 1599 made it more widely available to other readers. This was the moment when Neo-Confucianism was becoming the predominant intellectual paradigm and in the seventeenth century Japanese scholars of Confucianism, such as Yamazaki Ansai (1619-1682), began to attempt to validate the universalist claims of Neo-Confucianism through the analysis of the Nihon shoki account of the Divine Age. Ansai, for example, argued that the Nihon shoki was analogous to the Yijing (“The Book of Changes”) in that both revealed the workings of the Neo-Confucian concept of ri (Chinese: li), the fundamental moral principle that permeated all things, and ki (Chinese:xi) the ethereal substance of existence that gave form to but corrupted ri. In the hands of Ansai and other Japanese Neo-Confucianists, the events of the “Divine Age” became metaphorical representations of the transformation of ri into the physical existence, the workings of the productive principles of yin and yang, and so on (Ooms, chapter 6). Another Confucian reinterpretation of the “Divine Age” recorded in the Nihon shoki was advanced by Arai Hakuseki (1657-1725), a shogunal advisor, who rejected the metaphysical readings of these works and argued that they should be read as histories of human events. This strategy rested upon the reinterpretation of key characters within the ancient texts. For example, Hakuseki argued that the character for kami or “deity” in fact meant “those above” and that the characters that literally meant “high heavenly plains” actually named a place on the island of Kyushu. By reinterpreting key terms in this way, Hakuseki put forth the theory that the texts in fact recorded not the acts of deities in the heavens but of powerful men vying for political authority at the time of the founding of Japan's imperial line. In this way, Hakuseki attempted to validate the Confucian notion of the “mandate of heaven” and to undermine the idea that the imperial line, because of its divine origins, was the ultimate source of political authority in Japan (Nakai, 247-248).

In contrast to the interest of Japanese Confucianists in the Nihon shoki, the Kojiki had attracted little scholarly interest before Norinaga's Kojikiden. The form of the two works is very different. While the Kojiki presents a more or less unitary narrative, the Nihon shoki brings together a number of variant forms of the story of Japan's mythic past. One of these is privileged as the “main narrative,” but each section of that narrative is followed by one or more variant versions of the same events. And as early modern scholars recognized, some sections of the Kojiki appeared within the Nihon shoki as a variant version, a fact regarded by many as evidence that the Kojiki account of the “Divine Age” was a flawed version of the story discarded with the compilation of the Nihon shoki or an early manuscript of one of the variant texts prepared to aid in the compilation of the Nihon shoki. Thus, Norinaga made a bold statement when he argued in the first volume of the Kojikiden that it was the Kojiki that was the more important work because it had been compiled with a very specific intention: to record the events of the “Divine Age” in a pure Japanese language unadulaterated by alien principles that originated in China.

To make this claim, Norinaga argued that in the late seventh century the emperor Tenmu concerned that the knowledge of the events of the “Divine Age” were being forgotten because of the introduction of new forms of knowledge, Confucianism and Buddhism, from China ordered that they be preserved in writing. The emperor himself, according to Norinaga, recited the “Divine Age” narrative, a true record of the events of that age, to a courtier who memorized them so that they could be recorded intact in what became the Kojiki. For Norinaga, establishing the oral nature of the Kojiki became an issue of great importance. It was the supposed direct link with the Divine Age, through the figure of the emperor himself divine, that distinguished the Kojiki from the Confucian classics, which were products of human authors and expressive of human knowledge. The relationship Norinaga established between the language of the Kojiki and the “real” of the Divine Age is made explicit in what is perhaps the most often quoted passage of the Kojikiden: “Words, ideas, and objects are things in accord with one another, so that the ancient period had its words, ideas, and things, and the later periods have their words, ideas, and things, and China had its words, ideas, and things. But the Nihon shoki took the words of later age and wrote of the ancient period and the words of China and wrote of the imperial land ”. However, the Kojiki “ … just inscribed what was passed from the ancient age, and so its words, ideas, and things are in accord with one another, and everything reveals the truth of that age” (Cited in Burns, p. 71). Norinaga's assertion then was that language reflected the reality of things as experienced by the human mind. Over the course of time or across cultures, languages differ, reflecting differences in the way human beings viewed and organized experience. Therefore, he argued, to understand the ancient age, it was necessary to interrogate the language of the early texts as the means to recover the world as perceived by the ancient people.

Norinaga was not, however, as rigorously historicist as the words/ideas/things equation suggests. He viewed the ancient language not only as different but as superior to that of the present and explained linguistic change not as the product of inevitable historical transformation but as the consequence of the pernicious influence of what he termed karagokoro (“Chinese mind”). For Norinaga, “Chinese mind” was the consequence of the diffusion of alien epistemological categories, the metaphysical and ethical categories and principles of Confucianism and Buddhism, among the Japanese people so that their ability to view the world as the ancient Japanese did was lost. Norinaga noted that by his time these categories had been so naturalized that the Japanese people were no longer even aware of the extent to which they shaped their perceptions, judgments, and values. They had become, in his word, “commonsense.” Significantly, Norinaga argued that there were profound consequences for the “loss” of the authentically “Japanese” reality because of the “Chinese mind.” He traced the social and political strife of his day to the “unnatural” social relations that emerged because the “Chinese mind.”

It is important to take note of the relationship of individual and culture implied in this explanation. Norinaga argued that to recover an authentically yamato gokoro (“Japanese mind”), a state he also termed magokoro or “pure mind,” one had to strip away the secondary, alien categories of China. As this suggests, he believed that fundamental, distinct, and enduring forms of cultural identity characterized all human existence. These were innate, rather than acquired, and as such was always potentially recoverable. This notion of original cultural identity stands of course in sharp contrast to the Confucian ethos of universalism and its concept of “humanness,” as a universal state that preceded or transcended culture.

Norinaga used terms such as “cleanse” and “purge” to explain the process of freeing oneself from the “Chinese mind,” but in practical terms this meant the intense study of the Kojiki, the only text, he argued, that preserved the language and therefore the reality of the ancient age. The problem was that the Kojiki was written entirely in Chinese characters, and much of it in can be read as Chinese, albeit with what might be viewed as syntactic errors. Chinese characters were, however, also used as purely phonetic symbols, primarily to record proper nouns, such as place names and deity names. Norinaga insisted that it was possible to discover the ancient language within this complex system of inscription, by drawing upon traces preserved in poems, imperial edicts, and ritual prayers. This claim is highly problematic in that the texts that record the edicts and prayers, in particular, were compiled long after the Nihon shoki in an age Norinaga himself described as permeated by the “Chinese mind” and these forms have their own stylistic conventions. Nevertheless, Norinaga asserted that it was possible and rewrote the Kojiki: against the Chinese characters of the original text, he rewrote the Kojiki in what he claimed was the ancient language using kana (the Japanase syllabary). Norinaga's new Kojiki was a masterpiece. Its rhythmic prose possessed great rhetorical power, and the work is remarkable in its syntactical consistency. It is only recently that modern linguists have cast doubt upon the claim of “recovery” that oriented Norinaga's project, questioning whether the original Kojiki was meant to be “read” (as in vocalized) as “Japanese” at all (Burns, 80).

Rewriting the Kojiki as “Japanese” was only one part of Norinaga's project. The Kojikiden takes the form of an annotated version of the new text, with two or three lines of the Kojiki typically followed by ten or more pages of annotations. Norinaga's conceit was that he was only revealing the original meaning of the text, not “interpreting” it, an operation he argued derived from the “Chinese mind.” Nonetheless, he in fact created a new understanding of the text by using the annotations to impose new notions of temporality, causality, and intentionality on the often fragmented narrative strands that make up the original story. In Norinaga's retelling, two deities, Naobi and Magatsuhi (both of whom play relatively small roles within the original Kojiki) are identified as the divine agents that shape the course of events in the “Divine Age” but also in the social world of the present. In essays such as Naobi no mitama (“The Rectifying Spirit”), Kuzubana (“Arrowroot Flowers”), and Tamakushige (“The Jeweled Comb-Box”), he put forth a theory of history in which these two deities were identified as responsible for the unfolding of events. In contrast to the Neo-Confucian conception of historical change, in which “heaven” was a moral force that acted in response to human acts, rewarding those who acted morally, punishing those who did not, Norinaga insisted that history must be understood in terms of the “Divine Age”: the deities who act within the Kojiki continue to act, controlling the course of all events, so that men were, in a famous phrase, merely their “puppets.” Notably, Norinaga rejected the notion that the actions of the deities were comprehensible or predictable. Indeed, he argued that concepts such as “heaven” in Confucianism and “karma” in Buddhism were flawed in that they were founded on the assumption that events in the world were regular and stable and could form the basis for human action. Norinaga argued instead that the course of events in the past and present is ultimately inexplicable, precisely because the deities were ultimately beyond human knowledge. It is within this theory of history that Norinaga's notion of “Japanese mind” or “pure mind” became meaningful. Those that succeeded in achieving this state would be able to stand passive and reverent before the deities and the emperor who was their representative in the human realm.

In the Kojikiden, Norinaga defined the contours of a new theory of Japanese history, culture, and subject-ness that challenged the assumptions of Confucian doctrine. Rejecting the assumption of transcultural norms, he used his theory of ancient Japanese language to assert a theory of original cultural identity. Rejecting the tradition of attempting to identify stable metaphysical principles in the workings of history, he argued that human knowledge is limited and that a stance of passive belief was the proper stance for the Japanese people. Rejecting the notion that ethical principles originated in nature and were necessary for a stable social life, he held up Confucian ethical theory as evidence of the loss of an original and authentic form of community that had existed in Japan's distant past.

3. Responses to the Kojikiden

It was in the aftermath of the diffusion of the Kojikiden, first in manuscript form and then in printed form, that the term “Kokugaku” came to be widely used to refer to scholarship that focused on Japanese texts with the aim to discerning the distinct cultural characteristics of Japan. Norinaga himself disliked this term, precisely because it was coined in opposition to the term “Kangaku.” He insisted that work on Japan should simply be termed “gaku” or “study,” although he also made use of the term inishie no manabi (“ancient studies”) to refer to his work.

The Kojikiden sent shockwaves through the intellectual circles of early nineteenth century Japan. While many Confucian scholars were vehement in their attack on Norinaga's work, there were also influential attempts to reconcile his account of the Divine Age with Confucian ethical theory. Most notable was the work of scholars such as Fujita Tokô and Aizawa Seishisai, who were in service to the lord of Mito. Termed Mitogaku (“Mito Studies”), their work upheld nativist claims of Japanese superiority vis-à-vis China and the west by arguing that it was in fact Japanese social customs and cultural norms that best instantiated a set of universal ethical principles. Thus, Mito scholars synthesized Confucian ethics with Kokugaku theories about Japan's divine past.

After Norinaga's death, Kokugaku practice itself came to be extraordinarily divisive. Norinaga's school continued under the direction of his adopted son, Motoori Ôhira, but it came to focus on the study of poetry and poetics rather than the Kojiki as the way to understand the “way of the deities.” The students of Kamo no Mabuchi too continued to be active in the field of poetics, although they were critical of the work of Ôhira and his students, arguing that poetry was the means to understand not the deities but the elegant “spirit” of the ancient Japanese people. The concern for the mytho-histories that had oriented Norinaga's work influenced a number of diverse scholars, the most influential of whom was Hirata Atsutane. In works such as his cosmological treatise Tama no mihashira (“The Pillars of the Spirit,” published 1813) and Koshi seibun (“The True Text of Ancient History,” 1818), Atsutane distanced himself from Norinaga's work on the Kojiki, asserting that the truth of the Divine Age was not revealed in the Kojiki but dispersed among the ancient texts. In the Koshi seibun, he brought together elements from a number of works, weaving them into a new narrative that put forth a new cosmological theory. According to Atsutane, the aim of Kokugaku must be the exploration of the fate of the human spirit after death, and he asserted that, when correctly understood, the Divine Age narrative revealed the existence and nature of what termed the “hidden world”—the place where the spirits of the dead resided. This “hidden world” was described as spatially contiguous to the social world of the living, but invisible, and much like the world of the living in all its attributes. Norinaga, by contrast, had no notable concern about the afterlife.

In another important departure from Norinaga, Atsutane portrayed the relationship of deity and man in more optimistic terms. While Norinaga had emphasized the power and inscrutability of the deities and termed human beings their puppets, Atsutane argued that men were causal agents whom the deities had bestowed with the means to shape the course of their own lives. According to Atsutane, men were required to repay this divine trust by acting in accordance with divine will, by living lives ordered around agricultural production, reproduction, and worship. In particular, Atsutane established a link between the“ productive” acts of the deities who created the world and the human act of agricultural production. In this way, Atsutane's rewriting of the myth affirmed the lives of Japan's villagers by infusing their work with value and offering them the promise of reward after death. (Harootunian, 143-168)

4. The Significance of Kokugaku for Modern Japan

There is an important and ongoing national narrative in which Kokugaku is valorized as the intellectual movement that marked the emergence of a Japanese national consciousness in the late eighteenth century, with the result that the early modern discourse in the modern Japanese discussions of social, political, and cultural identity. This understanding began to take form in the late nineteenth century after the overthrow of the Tokugawa Shogunate in 1868 and the founding of the modern Japanese state. For figures such as Haga Yaichi (1867-1927) and Muraoka Tsunetsugu (1884-1946) Norinaga's work marked the point of beginning for the modern humanistic study of the nation, a study in which they were involved as professors of “National Literature” and “Intellectual History.” They praised the “objectivity” of his analysis and embraced the points of inquiry he defined. The result was the embrace of the problematic notion that there existed a unique and enduring set of intrinsically “Japanese” cultural values that shared nothing with the ethos of individualism that characterized Western societies. In the 1930s and the war years, the Nihon Roman-ha (“Japan Romantic School”), which argued for an intellectual and cultural “revolt against the West” identified the achievements of Motoori Norinaga and other nativist scholars as a point of origin for their own endeavor.

In the aftermath of World War II, the centrality of Kokugaku in intellectual discourse on Japanese national identity continued, but now it was widely associated with (indeed, blamed for) the rise of Japanese fascism in the 1930s. The most influential of these critics was Maruyama Masao, who traced the ideology of the modern Japanese state back to eighteenth-century Kokugaku and argued that the anti-rational impulses he perceived as ordering it forestalled the development of the modern subjectivity necessary for a democratic political system. A similar point was made by Saigô Nobutsuna who asserted that Kokugaku was characterized by a set of methodological and historical fallacies, the widespread acceptance of which led to the production of a “passive,” “antiprogressive,” and “conservative” political subject in Japan. In the 1970s, however, scholarly opinion on Kokugaku shifted again. Social historian Haga Noboru, for one, argued that Kokugaku had to be separated from the politics of the 1930s and viewed in terms of its own historical context. He linked Kokugaku with other indigenous movements against Western imperialism in East Asia and recast it as a “modern” and “humanistic” popular movement for ethnic self-determination (Burns, 5-8).


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