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Lady Damaris Masham

First published Tue Jan 14, 2003; substantive revision Tue Jan 23, 2007

1. Life

Damaris Masham (1658-1708) was one of the very first English women to publish philosophical writings. She was born in 1658, the daughter of the Cambridge Platonist, Ralph Cudworth, who was Master of Christ's College, Cambridge. Little is known of her education, but she did have the advantage of being born into a family with a considerable library. However, despite the fact that her father was one of the most learned men of his generation he did not teach her Latin or Greek, though she did apparently learned French as was deemed requisite for a gentlewoman of the time. She learned Latin, later in life, according to the method recommended in Locke's Some Thoughts Concerning Education. Her interest in philosophy was nurtured by her reading of the Cambridge Platonists (Ralph Cudworth, Henry More and John Smith), with whose works she was familiar by the time she met Locke. It was her good fortune to make his acquaintance, since he certainly encouraged her interest in philosophy. Thus, unlike most women of her time, Damaris Cudworth had the relative advantages of a family and a friendship that enabled her to develop her interest in philosophy. On the other hand, her marriage in 1685, to Sir Francis Masham, an Essex squire and widower with nine children, was hardly one that enhanced her philosophical opportunities. She had one son, Francis Cudworth Masham.

Damaris Cudworth (as she then was) and Locke met sometime before 1682 (probably through their mutual friend, Edward Clark). By all accounts Locke held her in high esteem as a philosophical mind, and she was to be one of the earliest proponents of his philosophy. Their acquaintance, at least in the early stages, was more than merely an intellectual friendship. Among their earliest letters is a series of pastoral love poems, conducted under the noms de plume, Philoclea and Philander. They continued to correspond on a variety of philosophical subjects during Locke's in Holland. On his return in 1688, he became guest and later permanent resident at her home at Oates in Essex.

Lady Masham's philosophical writings constituted only a small part of her philosophical activity. Her letters to Locke and her correspondence with Leibniz show that her interest in philosophy went far beyond what she eventually published. Her two books, A Discourse Concerning the Love of God (1696) and Occasional Thoughts in Reference to a Vertuous or Christian Life (1705), were printed anonymously. She also wrote a biography of Locke which is the source of the first printed biographies of Locke. A Discourse and Occasional Thoughts were published with encouragement from Locke. Both books offer an optimistic view of human beings as rational and social creatures motivated by the love of happiness. This “earliest and strongest principle,” consists of the enjoyment of pleasure achieved through the regulatory exercise of reason. This directs us to the greatest happiness. The Lockean elements of both books led to their being attributed by some to Locke. Nonetheless the Platonism of her background remains evident, especially in the religious and ethical position which connects both her treatises which are both are concerned with practical ethics. Like both Locke and the Cambridge Platonists, Lady Masham held that morality is founded in reason and the freedom to act. They also agree that the end of ethics is human happiness, and that the exercise of virtue requires a right disposition of mind. While she is closer to Locke in epistemology, on ethics, she is closer to Cudworth than Locke on account of her acceptance that moral principles exist independently as part of the nature of things, her belief in free will and in her anti-voluntarism.

2. A Discourse Concerning the Love of God

A Discourse Concerning the Love of God (1696) was written in response to a collection of letters by John Norris and Mary Astell published as Letters Concerning the Love of God (1695). Norris had, in 1690, attacked Locke's Essay in his Cursory Reflections upon a Book Call'd Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Lady Masham's critique of Norris and Astell is also aimed, indirectly, at Nicolas Malebranche, of whom Norris was the most important English disciple. This may explain Lady Masham's hostility to Norris, in spite of the fact that she was the dedicatee of another book by Norris, Reflections upon the Conduct of Human Life (London, 1690). In Occasional Thoughts, Lady Masham takes a Lockean position when she argues that we derive our knowledge of God by comparing ideas “received from Sense and Reflection” and that the idea of God is “a Proposition containing many complex Ideas in it; and which we are not capable of framing till we have been long acquainted with pleasing Sensations” (Occasional Thoughts, p. 66). She also defines love in a Lockean manner as “complaisance.” Norris had maintained that God is the immediate cause of pleasure for us and is therefore the sole and proper object of our love. Creatures are therefore merely the occasional causes of pleasing effects in us, and our love of creatures is inferior and secondary to our love of God. In response Lady Masham argues that our love of God comes not from a divinely instilled idea of God in our minds, but from observing the world around us, whence we conclude, rationally, that we owe love to its creator, God. Her fundamental objection to Norris's occasionalism is that it undermines the basis of morality because, by denigrating Gods works, it undermines the bonds of human society and the very basis of Christian morality. In opposition to Norris, Lady Masham emphasises the importance of practical morality, arguing that it is integral to religious conduct.

3. Occasional Thoughts

In Occasional Thoughts in Reference to a Vertuous or Christian Life (1705) Masham sets out to defend reasonable Christianity from Deism on the one hand and superstition on the other. The book is also, in part, an answer to Mary Astell's The Christian Religion as Professed by a Daughter of the Church which was published as a reply to A Discourse Concerning the Love of God. Her discussion of the role of reason in religious matters includes the relationship between religion and morality. In developing further the arguments about practical morality that she had set out in Occasional Thoughts, she also sets out her views on education. Against the Deists, Masham insists on the importance of revelation and faith and denies that natural religion based purely on reason is possible. On the other hand religious belief that ignores the role of reason in religion is mere superstition and will result in bigotry and atheism, for “an Irrational Religion can never Rationally be conceived to come from God” (Occasional Thoughts, p. 36). (In Masham's view, Roman Catholicism, with its stress on the externals of religion is largely superstition). For her part, Lady Masham emphasises the moral aspect of religion, its practical application, rather that doctrinal content. She shares Locke's view that virtuous living is more important than religious ceremonial. Like Locke in the Epistola de tolerantia, she argues that moral conduct is central to religious practice. Accordingly she argues that morality and religion should not be separated in religious instruction. Furthermore, civil and religious liberties are necessary for the exercise of virtue. And education is the key means to inculcate virtue, which is to be learned not through precept but by developing a rational understanding of moral principles. She emphasises the key role of mothers in laying the foundations of morality through the education of their children. This practical point leads her to argue for the education of women.

4. Leibniz Correspondence

Between 1704 and 1705-6, Lady Masham corresponded with Leibniz, at his instigation, perhaps because he hoped thereby, to have contact with Locke. This gave her the opportunity to discuss Leibniz's philosophy with him, and for Leibniz to discuss the philosophy of her father, Ralph Cudworth. Lady Masham knew Leibniz's philosophy only indirectly from the Journal des Savants of 1695, and Bayle's article “Rorarius” in the first edition of his Dictionnaire. She takes issue with Leibniz on a number of points, including his theory of pre-established harmony, the nature of substance and free will. Lady Masham's defence of her father's True Intellectual System of the Universe is revealing in a number of ways. It shows she was willing to disagree with him (on the question of whether there could be such a thing as unextended substance), whilst retaining her respect for him and being prepared to defend him against his detractors (in this case Pierre Bayle). It also indicates that she had not abandoned all the Platonist tenets to which she subscribed before she met Locke.




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Cambridge Platonists | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Locke, John | Malebranche, Nicolas