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The Pure Theory of Law

First published Mon Nov 18, 2002

The idea of a Pure Theory of Law was propounded by the formidable Austrian jurist and philosopher Hans Kelsen (1881-1973). (See bibliographical note) Kelsen began his long career as a legal theorist at the beginning of the 20th century. The traditional legal philosophies at the time, were, Kelsen claimed, hopelessly contaminated with political ideology and moralizing on the one hand, or with attempts to reduce the law to natural or social sciences, on the other hand. He found both of these reductionist endeavors seriously flawed. Instead, Kelsen suggested a ‘pure’ theory of law which would avoid reductionism of any kind. The jurisprudence Kelsen propounded “characterizes itself as a ‘pure’ theory of law because it aims at cognition focused on the law alone” and this purity serves as its “basic methodological principle.” [PT1, 7] Note that this anti-reductionism is both methodological and substantive. Kelsen firmly believed that if the law is to be considered as a unique normative practice, methodological reductionism should be avoided entirely. But this approach is not only a matter of method. Reductionism should be avoided because the law is a unique phenomenon, quite separate from morality and nature.

1. The Basic Norm

The law, according to Kelsen, is a system of norms. Norms are ‘ought’ statements, prescribing certain modes of conduct. Unlike moral norms, however, Kelsen maintained that legal norms are created by acts of will. They are products of deliberate human action. For instance, some people gather in a hall, speak, raise their hands, count them, and promulgate a string of words. These are actions and events taking place at a specific time and space. To say that what we have described here is the enactment of a law, is to interpret these actions and events by ascribing a normative significance to them. Kelsen, however, firmly believed in Hume's distinction between ‘is’ and ‘ought’, and in the impossibility of deriving ‘ought’ conclusions from factual premises alone. Thus Kelsen believed that the law, which is comprised of norms or ‘ought’ statements, cannot be reduced to those natural actions and events which give rise to it. The gathering, speaking and raising of hands, in itself, is not the law; legal norms are essentially ‘ought’ statements, and as such, they cannot be deduced from factual premises alone.

How is it possible, then, to ascribe an ‘ought’ to those actions and events which purport to create legal norms? Kelsen's reply is enchantingly simple: we ascribe a legal ought to such norm-creating acts by, ultimately, presupposing it. Since ‘ought’ cannot be derived from ‘is’, and since legal norms are essentially ‘ought’ statements, there must be some kind of an ‘ought’ presupposition at the background, rendering the normativity of law intelligible.

As opposed to moral norms which, according to Kelsen, are typically deduced from other moral norms by syllogism (e.g., from general principles to more particular ones), legal norms are always created by acts of will. Such an act can only create law, however, if it is in accord with another ‘higher’ legal norm that authorizes its creation in that way. And the ‘higher’ legal norm, in turn, is valid only if it has been created in accordance with yet another, even ‘higher’ legal norm that authorizes its enactment. Ultimately, Kelsen argued, one must reach a point where the authorizing norm is no longer the product of an act of will, but is simply presupposed, and this is, what Kelsen called, the Basic Norm. More concretely, Kelsen maintained that in tracing back such a ‘chain of validity’ (to use Raz's terminology), one would reach a point where a ‘first’ historical constitution is the basic authorizing norm of the rest of the legal system, and the Basic Norm is the presupposition of the validity of that first constitution.

Kelsen attributed two main explanatory functions to the Basic Norm: it explains both the unity of a legal system and the reasons for the legal validity of norms. [PT2, 193] Apparently, Kelsen believed that these two ideas are very closely related, since he seems to have maintained that the legal validity of a norm and its membership in a given legal system are basically the same thing. Furthermore, Kelsen argued that every two norms which derive their validity from a single Basic Norm necessarily belong to the same legal system and, vice versa, so that all legal norms of a given legal system derive their validity from one Basic Norm. It is widely acknowledged that Kelsen erred in these assumptions about the unity of legal systems. Generally speaking, in spite of the considerable interest in Kelsen's theory of legal systems and their unity that derives from a single Basic Norm, critics have shown that this aspect of Kelsen's theory is refutable. Although it is certainly true that the law always comes in systems, the unity of the system and its separation from other systems is almost never as neat as Kelsen assumed. [see Raz, ‘Kelsen's Theory of the Basic Norm’.]

However, the role of the Basic Norm in explaining the normativity of law is crucially important. The presupposition of the Basic Norm as the condition of validity of legal norms marks Kelsen's theory as ‘pure’, and distinguishes it from other theories in the Legal Positivist tradition. Contemporary legal positivists have traditionally accounted for the normativity of law in terms of social facts: people tend to perceive of the legal norms in their community as valid because, ultimately, there are certain social conventions, or Rules of Recognition in H.L.A. Hart's terminology, that determine who is authorized to make law and how law making is to be done. But this is precisely the kind of reductionism that the Pure Theory strives to deny. Kelsen was convinced that any attempt to ground the law's normativity, namely, its ‘ought’ aspect, is doomed to failure if it is only based on facts, whether those facts are natural or social. Once again, to account for an ‘ought’ conclusion, one needs some ‘ought’ in the premises. Therefore, Kelsen thought, the normativity of law, as a genuine ‘ought’, must, ultimately, be presupposed.

Common wisdom has it that in this kind of reasoning Kelsen self-consciously employs a Kantian Transcendental argument to establish the necessary presupposition of the Basic Norm. Thus the argument takes the following form:

  1. P.
  2. P is possible only if Q.
  3. Therefore, Q.

In Kelsen's case, P stands for the fact that legal norms are ‘ought’ statements, and Q is the presupposition of the Basic Norm. [PT2, 202]. Furthermore, commentators have pointed out that just as Kant's epistemology is an attempt to find the middle way between dogmatic Rationalism and skeptical Empiricism, Kelsen's pure theory of law is an attempt to find a middle way between Natural Law's dogmatism, and Positivism's reduction of law to the social sciences. [See Paulson, Introduction] But it is worth keeping in mind that Kelsen's argument about the Basic Norm is an explicitly shallow form of Kantian epistemology. The Kantian categories and modes of perception are not optional; they form a deep, universal, and necessary feature of rational cognition. One should recall that it is Humean skepticism that Kant strove to answer. Kelsen, however, remains Humean through and through, Kantian influences notwithstanding. First, Kelsen was very skeptical about any objectivist moral theory, Kant's included. [PT1, 16; PT2, 63-65] Second, Kelsen does not claim that the presupposition of the Basic Norm is a necessary feature, or category, of rational cognition. The Basic Norm is an ‘ought’ presumption and, as such, optional. It is not necessary for anyone to accept the Basic Norm. The Basic Norm is necessarily presupposed only by those who accept the ‘ought’, namely, the normativity, of the law. Likewise, those who believe in the normativity of a religious order must presuppose a Basic Norm that ‘one ought to obey God's commands’. But in both cases, there is nothing in the nature of things which would compel any particular person to adopt such a normative perspective. Kelsen's argument does not rule out atheism or anarchism. However, even the anarchist, Kelsen maintained, must presuppose the Basic Norm if she is to account for the normativity of law. But again, this presupposition is only an intellectual tool, not a normative commitment, and as the latter, it is entirely optional.

2. The Normativity of Law

This analogy between law and religion, on which Kelsen often dwells, is more limited than it first appears, however. The normativity of religion, like that of morality, does not depend on the actual obedience of their respective subjects. For those, for example, who presuppose the basic norm of Christianity, the latter would be valid even if there are no other Christians around. But this, as Kelsen explicitly admits, is not the case with law. The validity of a legal system partly, but crucially, depends on its actual practice: “A legal order is regarded as valid, if its norms are by and large effective (that is, actually applied and obeyed).” [PT2, 212] Furthermore, the actual content of the Basic Norm depends on its ‘effectiveness’. As Kelsen repeatedly argued, a successful revolution brings about a radical change in the content of the Basic Norm. Suppose, for example, that in a given legal system the Basic Norm is that the constitution enacted by Rex One is binding. At a certain point, a coup d'etat takes place and a republican government is successfully installed. At this point, Kelsen admits, “one presupposes a new basic norm, no longer the basic norm delegating law making authority to the monarch, but a basic norm delegating authority to the revolutionary government.” [PT1, 59].

This is very problematic, however, since it raises the suspicion that Kelsen has violated his own categorical injunction against deriving ‘ought’ from ‘is’. Kelsen was not unaware of the difficulty. In the first edition of the Pure Theory of Law, he suggests the solution to this problem by introducing international law as the source of validity for changes in the basic norms of municipal legal systems. It follows from the basic norm of international law, Kelsen maintains, that state sovereignty is determined by successful control over a given territory. Therefore, the changes in the basic norm which stem from successful revolutions can be accounted for in legalistic terms, relying on the dogmas of international law. [PT1, 61-62] The price Kelsen had to pay for this solution, however, is rather high: he was compelled to claim that all municipal legal systems derive their validity from international law, and this entails that there is only one Basic Norm in the entire world, namely, the Basic Norm of public international law. Although this solution is repeated in the second edition of the Pure Theory of Law [214-215], Kelsen presented it there with much more hesitation, perhaps just as an option which would make sense. It is not quite clear whether Kelsen really adhered to it. The hesitation is understandable; after all, the idea that municipal legal systems derive their legal validity from international law would strike most jurists and legal historians as rather fanciful and anachronistic. (We should recall that the development of international law is a relatively recent phenomenon in the history of law.)

So we are back to the question of how ‘pure’ Kelsen's theory really is, if it is conceded that the content of the Basic Norm is basically determined by social practice. The answer depends on how we construe the explanatory function of the Basic Norm: Neither Kelsen nor his critics seem to have been careful to distinguish between the role of the Basic Norm in answering the question of how we identify the law as such, and in answering the question of law's normativity. An answer to the question of what counts as law or as law creating acts in a given community cannot be detached from practice, namely, social conventions. The social conventions prevalent in any given community determine, ultimately, what counts as law in that community. (See the Nature of Law) On the other hand, Kelsen is right to insist that social conventions, by themselves, could not explain the ‘ought’ which is inherent in law as a normative system. Such an ‘ought’ cannot be constituted by the conventions. Social conventions can only determine what the practice is, and how one would go about in engaging in it; conventions cannot determine that one ought to engage in the practice. [see Marmor, Positive Law & Objective Values, 25-33] Consider, for example, the analogy of a structured game, like chess. What chess is, and how one should play the game, are determined by its constitutive rules or conventions. Those rules which constitute the game of chess, however, cannot provide anyone with a complete reason to play the game. The normativity of the game is conditional; it depends on a prior reason, or commitment, to play the game. We cannot say, for example, that one “ought to move the bishop diagonally” unless we assume that the agent wants to play chess. The fact that the rules of chess require the players to move the bishop diagonally is not, in itself, a reason for doing so, unless, again, it is assumed that it is chess that one wants to play. Now, it is precisely this kind of assumption that the Basic Norm is there to capture. Just as the normativity of chess could not be explained without presupposing, as it were, that the players want to engage in that particular game, so the normativity of law must be premised on the Basic Norm.

Thus, it would seem that Kelsen's anti-reductionism is only partly successful. The explanatory role of the Basic Norm must be confined to the normativity of law. But in order to explain what counts as law and how law is identified and distinguished from other normative practices, the Basic Norms is not sufficient; one must refer to the social conventions which prevail in the relevant community.

None of this means, however, that Kelsen's account of the normativity of law is unproblematic. There are two main problems that may be worth exploring. First, Kelsen has never made it quite clear whether he maintains that the ‘ought’ which is presupposed in the legal domain is the same kind of ‘ought’ which would be characteristic of morality or, indeed, any other normative domain. Kelsen seems to have faced a dilemma here which would not be easy to resolve. On the one hand, he wanted to avoid the mistake which he attributed to the Natural Law tradition of reducing the normativity of law to moral ‘ought’. Kelsen has repeatedly argued that Natural Law, which would reduce the legal ‘ought’ to moral ‘ought’ fails because it can only achieve an account of the normativity of law at the expense of missing its target: If the only notion of validity is a moral one, we are left with no room for the concept of legal validity. Natural Law, as Kelsen understood it, does not make any allowance for the possibility that a norm is legally valid but morally wrong. Would this imply, then, that the kind of ‘ought’ which is presupposed by the Basic Norm is somehow different from moral ‘ought’? And what would the difference consist in? One should bear in mind that Kelsen thought that the normativity of morality, like that of religion or any other normative domain, is also ‘presupposed’. So here is the dilemma: either Kelsen maintains that the legal ‘ought’ and moral ‘ought’ are two different kinds of ‘ought’ (which, I think, is the stance he adopted in his earlier writings), but then it would be very difficult to explain what the difference consists in, given that both kinds of ‘ought’ are simply presupposed; or else, Kelsen would have to maintain that the moral and legal ‘ought’ are basically the same, in which case, he would be hard pressed to explain how he avoids the same kind of mistake which he attributed to the Natural Law tradition.

Secondly, and perhaps this is part of the reason for the former confusion, Kelsen's account of the normativity of law is seriously impeded by his Humean skepticism about the objectivity of morality, justice, or any other evaluative scheme. The view one gets, especially from Kelsen's later writings, is that there are countless potential normative systems, like morality, law, religion, etc., that one can either accept or not just by presupposing their respective Basic Norms. But without any rational or objective grounding of such evaluative systems, the choice of any Basic Norm remains rather whimsical, devoid of any reason. It is difficult to understand how normativity can really be explained on the basis of such rationally groundless choices.



Kelsen's academic publications span over almost seven decades in which he published dozens of books and hundreds of articles. Only about a third of this vast literature has been translated to English. Kelsen's two most important books on the pure theory of law are the first edition of his Reine Rechtslehre, published in 1934, and recently translated to English under the title Introduction to the Problems of Legal Theory, (Paulson and Paulson trans.) Oxford 2002, and the second edition which Kelsen published in 1960, Pure Theory of Law, (Knight trans.), UC Berkeley press, 1967. The second edition is a considerably extended version of the first edition. These books are abbreviated in the test as PT1 and PT2 respectively. In addition, most of the themes in these two books also appear in Kelsen's General Theory of Law and State, (1945), (Wedberg trans.), Russell & Russell, NY 1961 and What is Justice?, UC Berkeley Press, 1957. Other relevant publications in English include ‘The Pure Theory of Law and Analytical Jurisprudence’, 55 Harvard L. Rev. (1941), 44, ‘Professor Stone and the Pure Theory of Law: A Reply’, (1965), 17 Stanford L. Rev. 1128, and ‘On the Pure Theory of Law’ (1966), 1 Israel L. Rev. 1.

For a complete list of Kelsen's publications which have appeared in English see the Appendix to H. Kelsen, General Theory of Norms (M. Hartney trans.) Oxford, 1991, pp. 440-454.

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ethics: natural law tradition | Hume, David: moral philosophy | nature of law | nature of law: legal positivism