Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Legal Rights

First published Thu Dec 20, 2001; substantive revision Wed Jan 14, 2009

Legal rights are, clearly, rights which exist under the rules of legal systems. They raise a number of different philosophical issues. (1) Whether legal rights are conceptually related to other types of rights, principally moral rights; (2) What the analysis of the concept of a legal right is; (3) What kinds of entities can be legal right-holders; (4) Whether there any kinds of rights which are exclusive to, or at least have much greater importance in, legal systems, as opposed to morality; (5) What rights legal systems ought to create or recognise. Issue (5) is primarily one of moral and political philosophy, and is not different in general principle from the issue of what duties, permissions, powers, etc, legal systems ought to create or recognise. It will not, therefore, be addressed here.

A preliminary point should be mentioned. Do all legal systems have a concept of rights? Their use is pervasive in modern legal systems. We talk of legislatures having the legal right to pass laws, of judges to decide cases, of private individuals to make wills and contracts; as well as of constitutions providing legal rights to the citizens against fellow citizens and against the state itself. Yet it has been suggested that even some sophisticated earlier systems, such as Roman law, had no terminology which clearly separated rights from duties (see Maine (1861), 269-70 ). The question is primarily one for legal historians and will not be pursued here, but it may be remarked that it may still be legitimate when describing those systems to talk of rights in the modern sense, since Roman law, for example, clearly achieved many of the same results as contemporary systems. Presumably, it did so by deploying some of the more basic concepts into which rights can, arguably, be analysed.

1. Are Legal Rights Conceptually Related to Other Types of Rights?

The position of many important writers on legal rights is difficult to ascertain on this point, because it is not one they addressed directly. Hohfeld (1919), for example, confined his discussion entirely to legal rights and never mentioned moral ones. Hart did write about moral rights (1955, 1979) as well as legal ones (1973, 1994), but not in a way that allows for much direct comparison. Bentham (1970 [1782]) wrote extensively about the analysis of legal rights, but, notoriously, thought that the idea of natural moral rights was conceptual nonsense.

Mill (1969 [1861]), whilst endorsing Bentham's overall Utilitarian position, did not share his scepticism about moral rights, and seems to have thought that moral and and legal rights were, analytically, closely connected - “When we call anything a person's right, we mean that he has a valid claim on society to protect him in the possession of it, either by the force of law, or by that of education and opinion.” Those things which ought to be so protected were, in his view, those which concerned the fundamentals of human well-being, and were therefore a sub-set of those things which a person ought to have on grounds of utility.

Whilst not necessarily sharing Mill's view about all rights being related to fundamentals of well-being, many contemporary writers (e.g., Raz (1984a, 1984b), Wellman (1985, 1995)) agree that the core concept of a right is something common to law and morality, though some have argued that jurisprudential writers, particularly Hohfeld, provide a better and clearer starting-point for general analysis than previous writers in moral philosophy. The view that the core concept is common to both would appear to be consistent with maintaining that, nevertheless, in terms of justification in practical reasoning, legal rights should be based on moral ones.

2. The Conceptual Analysis of Legal Rights

Not all philosophers have agreed that rights can be fully analysed. White (1984), for example, argued that the task is impossible because the concept of a right is as basic as any of the others, such as duty, liberty, power, etc (or any set of them) into which it is usually analysed. He agrees, however, that rights can in part be explained by reference to such concepts. White's approach, based largely on close linguistic analysis, has remained something of a minority one.

The remaining approaches can be categorised in different ways, but a main division is between those who think that rights are singled out by their great weight as practical reasons, and those who think that rights are not special in this regard, but instead are to be analysed into duties, permissions, powers, etc, or some combination of these, perhaps with the addition of other conditions.

Dworkin (1973, 1975, 1981, 1986) has been the principal proponent of the first view. According to him rights enjoy a categorial priority in weight over any other consideration which is not itself right-based. Clearly, it is true of many legal systems that constitutional rights, or some of them, should outweigh any other consideration which is not itself derived from a constitutional right. But that seems to be primarily because of the constitutional status of the right. Both in law and in morality many rights are of a rather trivial nature. In morality such rights can, arguably, sometimes be justifiably outweighed even by considerations of personal convenience (cf. Raz (1978)). Similarly in law it seems that many prima facie rights can be defeated by what the court regards as considerations of the general interest. Dworkin's (1977) response to the latter type of criticism has been to argue that, on closer inspection, the consideration opposing the right can be seen as itself an instantiation of another general right. But this depends on the contentious claim that the only considerations that courts can justifiably rely upon are pre-existing rights. The objection has also been raised that, as a general theory of the nature of rights, it risks being self-defeating, since any consideration whatsoever can then be argued to be right-based, which leaves rights with no special role in practical reasoning.

Most writers have, instead, favoured the view that rights are to be analysed into other, more basic, notions, principally those of duty, permission and power, with perhaps the addition of other criteria. This means that not all rights will be of great importance. Their importance will vary with the strength of the grounds for the duty, permission or power. Before looking more closely at these accounts, another point should be mentioned. Theorists are divided between those who think that rights are, as it were, the ‘reflex’ of the duty, permission or power, and those who think that the right has a priority over them. The question is whether the duty, etc, grounds the right, or the right the duty. Most older writers (e.g., Bentham, Austin, Hohfeld, Kelsen) appear to have adhered to the first view, whilst more recent writers (e.g., MacCormick, Raz, Wellman) take the second. The second view has the implication that the force of a right is not necessarily exhausted by any existing set of duties etc, that follow from it, but may be a ground for creating new duties as circumstances change. This latter view seems to accord better at least with the way that constitutional legal rights work.

Amongst those who think that rights can be analysed, at least in part, into duties, permissions and powers, there is a further main division. Some think that the essence of a right is to have choice or control over the corresponding duty etc. Others think that the main thing is that one's interests are protected by the duty etc. Hart and Wellman are amongst the proponents of the first view, Bentham, Austin, MacCormick and Raz are amongst those maintaining some version of the second.

An outline of Hart's (1973) theory may be given as an illustration of the first view. According to Hart, someone (call him ‘X’) may be a legal right-holder primarily in one of two ways. First of all, X may have a bilateral permission to perform some action, i.e., X is permitted both to A and to not-A (together with there being some prohibitions on others interfering). Secondly, someone else may have a duty (e.g., to pay X £10) over which X has control, primarily by waiving or enforcing it. Since X has a choice in each case that explains why he is referred to as being a right-holder. One difficulty about this kind of theory is to explain our apparent reference to rights when there is no choice, eg when one is not only entitled to vote in elections, but also obliged by law to do so.

Two different versions of the interest theory can be seen, corresponding to the question about the priority of rights mentioned above.

According to older versions, such as those of Bentham and Austin, X is a right-holder because he is the beneficiary, or intended beneficiary, of another's duty, or perhaps of the absence of a duty on him which the law might otherwise have imposed. For example, if X has a right to be paid £10 by Y, then this is explained by saying that Y has a duty, the performance of which (handing over the £10) is intended to benefit X. One problem about this theory is to explain why the criminal law, although it may in part exist to protect moral rights, is not generally regarded as directly conferring legal rights on individual citizens, despite the fact that they are intended beneficiaries of the corresponding duties. (There may, of course, in many systems be parallel civil law rights, but that is a contingent matter. See more on this point below.)

A more modern version of this theory was proposed by MacCormick (1977), who argued that a right-holder was the intended beneficiary of a specific share of benefit, rather than just being a generalised beneficiary of the rules. However, even with this amendment, it remains difficult to explain third party rights under contracts. Suppose X and Y enter into a contract which imposes duties on each of them with the intention that performance of these will benefit Z. According to the theory, Z must (conceptually) be a legal right-holder. But it is in fact an entirely contingent matter as to whether Z is or not. Some legal systems recognise Z as having rights in such a situation and others do not. In Britain, for example, Scots Law recognised such rights under certain conditions, but English Law did not until the English position was recently changed by statute.

More recent versions, such as those of Raz (1984a, 1984b), take a different tack altogether. According to them, to say that X is a right-holder is to say that his interests, or an aspect of them, are sufficient reason for imposing duties on others either not to interfere with X in the performance of some action, or to secure him in something. This, inter alia, gets round the third-party rights' problem, because the explanation is simply that it is all a question of whether the system recognises the interests of Z as part of the reason for X and Y's duties, or whether it is only the interests of X and Y. Raz (1997) has emphasised that this does mean that only the right-holder's interests are relevant to the question of whether something should be recognised as a right. Considerations of the general or common interest may be relevant too.

Whilst discussion has continued on the relative merits of the choice and benefit theories, and ever more sophisticated versions of each have been proposed (see, for example, the three-sided debate in Kramer, Simmonds and Steiner (1998)), some writers have attempted to offer different, or combined, approaches. Wenar (2005) argues for what he calls a 'several functions' theory. According to this, any 'Hohfeldian incident' (or combination of them) which grants exemption, discretion or authorisation, or entitles the holder to protection, provision or performance is a right. Kramer and Steiner (2007) claim, however, that this is really no more than another version of benefit theory, and not superior to existing ones. Another proposal is made by Sreenivasan (2005), which is intended to apply only to claim-rights and not to other varieties of right. The essence of it is that Y has a claim-right that X perform an action if and only if Y's measure of control over X's duty matches (by design) the measure of control that advances Y's interests on balance. This, too, is criticised by Kramer and Steiner (2007) on the basis that it would include the case in which someone has, on the basis of his own interests, deliberately not been granted any such power at all. Yet this, they claim, would lead to a highly implausible expansion of the class of those who would have to be regarded as right-holders.

A number of subsidiary questions can be raised.

Firstly, should rights be analysed solely in terms of duties on others (together with some other condition), or do we need to bring in also other concepts, such as permission, power and immunity? Hohfeld thought that, strictly speaking, something was a legal right only if it corresponded to a duty on another, but he argued that legal usage was often confusing because the reference was really to one of the other concepts. Thus, in his view, the law sometimes also said that X had a right if (1) he had a permission to A, (2) he had a legal power to A, (3) Y had no legal power to affect him.

Waldron (1981) and Raz (1984a, 1984b) have been exponents of the view that rights should be seen as giving rise only to duties. Hart (1973), following Bentham, had argued that a liberty-right should be seen as a bilateral permission to A together with duties on others not to interfere with X's A-ing. Waldron and Raz argue that it is an important feature of rights that they entitle the right-holder to do not only that which is right, but also (within bounds) that which is wrong. This they regard as best explained by seeing rights as imposing only duties of non-interference on others, not as granting the right-holder a permission. An alternative view (Campbell 1997) is to see some rights as indeed granting permissions, but to point out that in granting a legal permission the law is not saying that there may not be reasons against performing the action, only that (within the bounds of the permission) the law will act as if there were not.

Powers raise a different issue. Many writers (e.g., Hohfeld, Hart (1973)) have considered them as being a type of right. By a legal power we mean the ability to bring about changes in legal rules or their application (plus some further conditions). Usually, of course, the lawmaker in granting a power also grants a right to exercise it, but occasionally this is not so, for example where the exercising of the right would itself be a crime or a civil wrong. In English Law, for example, until the position was recently changed by statute, a thief had, in certain special circumstances, the legal power to pass good title in the goods he had stolen to a third party, even though by doing so he committed a civil, and possibly also a criminal, wrong. This seems to indicate that powers should not be thought of as being rights themselves.

Powers also illustrate a general problem about the analysis of legal rights, and arguably of rights in general. Namely that of whether an element should be seen as part of the very essence of the concept of a right, or whether it is merely an element in that which is (contingently) its content, i.e., that which there is a right to do or have.

Relatedly, of the four fundamental types of rights which Hohfeld claimed to identify, immunities raise problems, though somewhat different ones. An immunity arises when Y has no power to change X's legal position. But is an immunity itself a right or is it simply a means of protecting a right, i.e., by making it immune from removal or alteration? As with powers, views have differed about this.

3. What Kinds of Entities Can be Legal Right-holders?

There has been much dispute amongst philosophers as what to kinds of entities can be right-holders. Corresponding pretty much to the general dispute about the very nature of rights, some have argued that any entity which would benefit from the performance by others of legal duties can be a right-holder; others that it has to be an entity which has interests; others that it has to be a entity capable of exercising some kind of control over the relevant legal machinery. And there are variants of all these positions.

There has to be a sense in which legal systems can confer rights on such entities as they please. This is because it has long been recognised that legal systems can regard as legal persons such entities as they please. In England, for example, ‘the Crown’ has, for centuries, been regarded as a legal entity, although what this means in terms of office-holders, far less the actual human beings who occupied those offices, has changed greatly over that time. Likewise, all modern societies recognise the legal existence as persons of companies or corporations and frequently of such entities as trade unions, government departments, universities, certain types of partnerships and clubs, etc.

One of the most contentious areas in recent years has been whether young children, the severely mentally ill, non-human animals, areas of endangered countryside, etc, can properly be regarded as being legal right-holders. Clearly anyone who has locus standi before a court must be a holder of some rights within the system. But it does not seem to follow automatically that an entity which does not, or which is physically or mentally incapable of bringing a legal action, is not thereby a right-holder. For it may be the intention of the system that the interests of that entity should be represented by another person. Given then, that all these entities may be protected by law, and that someone can bring some kind of legal action to ensure that those duties are enforced, when would we say that the entity itself is a right-holder and when not?

The answer will often turn upon whether one embraces an interest- or a choice-theory of rights. MacCormick (1976), for example, argued that any theory of rights which could not accommodate childrens' rights must be deficient, and this was a reason, in his view, for adopting an interest theory. Wellman (1995), on the other hand, claims that to assert that very young children or the severely mentally ill can have legal rights is to distort the concept of a right, since they lack the relevant control of the legal machinery. Instead, he argues, the relevant rights should be seen as belonging only to those who can bring the relevant actions on their behalf. For example, in his view a very young child would not have a right not to be negligently injured by the conduct of another. Rather, it would be the case that the child's parent had a right that their child not be negligently injured. One difficulty about this position appears to be that it does not easily square with the relevent remedial rights (e.g., to damages) that the law would recognise. In this example the law would clearly compensate the child's loss in being injured, not the parent's loss in their child being injured (though the latter might be a separate ground of action in some systems).

4. Exclusivity of Rights

The issue here is: whether there are any fundamental aspects of rights which are exclusive to, or at least more important in, legal systems, as opposed to morality.

Five particular sub-issues may be raised here.

4.1 Primary and Remedial Rights

Remedial rights are those which arise because of a breach of a primary one. Clearly they arise also outside the law, for example by the duty to apologise or make amends even if there is no legal obligation to do so. But legal remedial duties are generally more precise, and, just by the nature of law, institutionalised.

It is one of the main functions of legal systems to provide remedies for breach (or sometimes anticipated breach) of the primary rights which they confer. So if someone is injured by the negligence of another there will usually arise a remedial right to damages. If he is killed there may arise in members of his family an independent right to compensation, and so on. Other types of remedial right can include those for court orders requiring the party at fault to execute, or refrain from, some particular course of action, very often that which they had a duty to do, or to refrain from, under the primary right. Such rights are often very complex in the detail. For example the measure of damages may be different if the wrongful act is a tort/delict, as opposed to a breach of contract. Likewise, in many systems, some remedies must be granted as a matter of right whilst others are at the discretion of the court. By way of illustration of the remedies in the two British legal systems, reference may be made to Lawson (1980) and Walker (1974).

Usually remedial rights will themselves have further remedial rights attached, for example, to have the court impose a more coercive order, perhaps with the threat of a criminal or quasi-criminal sanction, or to have a person's assets frozen or confiscated, in the event, for example, that someone has failed to pay damages previously awarded by the court. The details of these further remedial rights vary from system to system.

A related, more controversial, point is as to whether criminal, as opposed to civil, law confers any legal rights on the citizens protected by it. The orthodox view is that it does not, although there may well be a parallel civil right. Take the case of someone who is wrongfully assaulted. In most legal systems this will be both a crime and a tort/delict. The civil law clearly gives a remedial right, eg. to sue for damages. But since, in most jurisdictions, it is mainly (and sometimes exclusively) the state which decides whether to prosecute for the criminal aspect, the more usual view is that the citizen has no legal right corresponding to the criminal aspect.

The issue is often complicated, legally, by the absence of clear indication from the legislature as whether it intended, by a particular statute, to create only a crime or also to confer civil law rights on citizens. A further complication can be that criminal courts sometimes exercise a quasi-civil function (e.g., to make a restoration or compensation order after a conviction for theft), and vice versa (e.g., the power of a civil court to award punitive or exemplary damages).

This issue is different from that of whether criminal law can act to recognise and protect moral rights. It seems possible to suggest that it can, since moral rights can be protected not only by legal rights, but also by legal duties on others (without corresponding legal rights). For example, a legal system could create a criminal offence of harassment in order to protect a moral right to privacy, without thereby necessarily recognising a legal right to privacy, i.e., something which would act as a positive reason in favour of privacy in interpreting unclear rules, or in developing the law.

4.2 Conditional Rights

In the case of many legal rights a condition has to be satisfied for their possession or exercise. This, in itself, does not make legal rights different from many moral ones. Just as one has a legal right to damages for assault only if one has been assaulted, one has a moral one to an apology for being insulted only if one has been insulted. But legal rights can give rise to more complicated situations, which rarely arise in morality.

In the above examples we can say that the right-token, as opposed to the right-type, comes into existence only when the condition for its instantiation is triggered. But legal systems sometimes say that that the right-token exists before one of the conditions for the exercise of the right exists. Essentially, it is the difference between saying “if p, X has a right to A” and “X has a right, if p, to A.” In the latter case the implication is that the right-token exists now, not just that it will exist. Why should we say this? One proposed answer is that legal systems, unlike morality, have devised sets of rules for transmission of rights even before the triggering condition for the exercise of the right has arrived.

Suppose, for example, that X, under his will, left a sum of money to Y, on condition that Y had attained the age of 21. It may be that the correct way of understanding the provision, under the rules of the legal system, is that only if Y had attained 21 when X died does he have a right to the money. But it may be that the correct way of understanding it as saying that Y, even if he has not attained 21 when X dies, acquires a right to the money, but it is to be paid only when he is 21. One practical difference is that in the latter case the right can pass to Y's successor in title if Y, having survived X, nevertheless dies before he is 21. In the latter case, lawyers describe the right as ‘vested.’ There can be many complex legal rules relating to this type of situation, and they vary greatly from jurisdiction to jurisdiction. Reference should be made to textbooks, primarily on testamentary succession, in the jurisdiction.

4.3 Property Rights

A further particular kind of legal rights, or group of rights, which has received an increasing amount of attention from theorists is that of property rights. Discussion of this belongs more properly to that of property itself — see the entry on property. Only some very brief points will be made here.

The first is as to whether property rights, and hence the concept of property, are essentially legal in their nature, or whether they are more general social phenomena which are simply recognised and protected by law in all modern societies. According to Bentham (1843) “ … there is no natural property … property is entirely the creature of the law.” Bentham's argument is essentially that what we mean by property is security of expectation in being able to keep, sell, use, etc, objects, and only the law can guarantee such security.

On the other hand, it is certainly possible to talk coherently about property in a way that does not necessarily correspond to the legal position. A parent may for example say to a young child that a certain toy is theirs, though in law it is the parent's. Likewise it may be plausible to claim that concepts of ownership and possession, though they may be less securely protected, can exist in societies which do not have anything that we normally recognise as a fully-fledged legal system. Some people will perhaps regard these kind of examples as indications that the concept of property is not essentially legal, whilst others may incline to the view that these are simply metaphorical extensions of a concept which is legal au fond.

Secondly, it should be noted that, in law, property rights can be of many different types. Although ownership is obviously one of the most important, another major class is that of possession, whether temporary or relatively permanent. For example, the right to use a car which one has hired for a week or to live in a certain house for the rest of one's life. Yet other types, falling short of either ownership or possession, could be, for example, to walk across the local farmer's field or have one's next-door neighbour maintain his side of the joint garden wall.

The details of property rights vary from jurisdiction to jurisdiction perhaps more than those of almost any other types of right. Further, many jurisdictions have different rules relating to property rights in land (and its fixtures) as opposed to all other types of entity. For these details reference should be made to specialist books in the jursdiction.

Even when considering just ownership, there is debate amongst theorists as to how this should be analysed. Some see it as essentially a cluster of other property rights of particular content, such as those to possession, income, etc, whilst others see it as being basically a structural relation between rights, content being comparatively irrelevant. For example as being the person to whom possession or use, even though those may presently belong to others, would ultimately return if a certain series of contingent events were to occur.

For further discussion of property in a philosophical context see Honore (1960, 1961), Becker (1977), Waldron (1988), Munzer (1990), Campbell (1992), Harris (1996), Penner (1997). (Some of these are concerned more with the moral justification of ownership.)

4.4 Subjective Rights

The above account of rights has been written largely from the point of view of Anglo-American law and philosophy. It should, however, be mentioned that there is one aspect of legal rights which is to be found amongst the European Continental writers, but of which there is no trace in the Anglo-American tradition. That is the description of rights as being ‘subjective’ (droits subjectifs; subjektives Rechten).

In French and in German the same word (droit, Recht) serves as the noun which refers both to rules of law and the rights which are created by them, and therefore disambiguation is required.

In French law the distinction is drawn by distinguishing between le Droit objectif (the noun spelt with a capital according to some, but not all, writers) and les droits subjectifs. (For general discussion see, for example, Cornu 2000). However, French law seems at the same time to confine the term ‘droits subjectifs’ to a sub-class of legal rights, namely rights which are primarily those of private citizens, eg to make a will or contract. The term appears not to extend to such rights as those of a government agency owning property or a government minister making a legal order under delegated powers.

German law seems to draw a basically similar distinction between ‘das Recht’ and ‘subjektives Rechten’ (see, for example, Dietl 1983).

4.5 Means of Conferring Legal Rights

Many of the issues relating to this are not confined to rights, but are shared with duties and powers, so only a brief outline will be given.

In most modern legal systems certain fundamental rights are conferred by the constitution. This usually gives them a certain degree of priority over competing legal considerations, but this can vary from system to system. Sometimes constitutional rights will have an absolute priority over any other consideration not itself based on a constitutional right. Sometimes they will merely favour one legal outcome rather than another, without dictating it.

Constitutions will vary, too, as to whether certain rights are ‘entrenched’ or not. Entrenchment can be absolute, in which case the rights cannot be removed or altered by any constitutional means (as is the case with some of the ‘basic rights’ in the German Constitution), or it can be relative, requiring only a more onerous procedure than that for normal legislation (as with the Constitution of the USA.).

Constitutions will also vary on the extent to which human rights recognised under international law or treaty are recognised in national law. For example, in some countries in Europe, the European Convention on Human Rights, and decisions of the European Court of Human Rights thereon, are incorporated into national law and override any national law inconsistent with them. In others, such as the United Kingdom, the courts have, so far as possible, to interpret legislation to be consistent with the Convention, but have no power to strike it down if they find it to be clearly inconsistent.

Other rights can be conferred by normal legislation or by common law (ie. the tradition of judge-made law). One interesting point is that, arguably, many legal rights are conferred by no positive law, but arise simply from the absence of any law to the contrary. That is, it is probably a practical necessity that every legal system has an unwritten ‘closure rule’ to the effect that whatever is not prohibited is permitted. If some types of rights are essentially permissions, then many such rights arise in this way. In most legal systems my right to cross the street, for example, is of this nature. Probably no positive law will say that I can do so, and possibly no more general enacted right will imply it.


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