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Leibniz on the Problem of Evil

First published Sun Jan 4, 1998; substantive revision Wed Mar 16, 2005

Without question, the problem of evil vexed Leibniz as much as any philosophical problem during his career. This is obvious from the fact that the first and the last book length works that he authored, the Philosopher's Confession (written at age 26 in 1672) and the Theodicy (written in 1709, seven years before his death) were both devoted to this problem. It is, as well, equally striking that this latter work was the only book length treatise Leibniz saw fit to publish during his life. In this entry we will examine to two main species of the problem of evil which Leibniz addresses. The first, "the underachiver problem," is the one raised by the critic who argues that the evil in our world indicates that God cannot be as knowledgeable, powerful, or good, as traditional monotheists have claimed. The second, "the holiness problem," is one raised by a critic who argues that God's intimate causal entanglements with the world make God the cause of evil. God is thereby implicated in the evil at the expense of his holiness.

1. The Variety of Problems of Evil in Leibniz

Without question, the problem of evil vexed Leibniz as much as any philosophical problem during his career. This is obvious from the fact that the first and the last book length works that he authored, the Philosopher's Confession (written at age 26 in 1672) and the Theodicy (written in 1709, seven years before his death) were both devoted to this problem. It is, as well, equally striking that this latter work was the only book length treatise Leibniz saw fit to publish during his life.

Before we take a closer look at Leibniz's views on the problem of evil, we will need to do some stage-setting to help us understand just what sort of problem Leibniz thought evil presented. Open any contemporary introductory textbook and philosophy and it becomes clear that the problem of evil in contemporary philosophy is thought of as an argument for atheism. Since, the atheist contends, God and evil are incompatible, and evil clearly exists, there is no God. Some, thinking that the claimed incompatibility in the above argument is too strong, argue that even if the existence of God and the existence of evil prove compatible, the existence (or duration, or amount, or distribution) of evil provides us with at least strong evidence that God does not exist.

Framed in this way, the "atheistic problem of evil" invites certain sorts of responses. In particular, it invites the theist to explain how a being that is all-knowing, all-powerful, and all-good can allow evil to exist. And thus, contemporary responses to the problem of evil focus largely on presenting "theodicies" that is, reasons why a perfect being does or might allow evils of the sort (or duration, or amount, or distribution) we find in our world.

When we turn back, however, to the works of those medieval philosophers who treat the problem of evil, the "atheistic problem" is not to be found. Since these figures believed that the arguments of natural theology demonstrated overwhelmingly the existence of God, the problem that evil presented was quite different. For them, the problem was how the existence of evil was compatible with divine moral purity or holiness. Since, they argued, God is the author of everything that exists, and evil is one of the things that exists, God is thereby the author of evil. And if someone is an "author of evil," they are thereby implicated in the evil and thus cannot be morally pure or holy. Thus, God cannot be morally pure nor holy. Let's call this problem of evil the "holiness problem."

Because traditional theists held that God is the "author" or cause of everything in the cosmos in at least three different respects, discussions of the holiness problem often branch off into three correspondingly different directions. First, God is regarded as the creative cause of everything in the cosmos. Everything which exists contingently is caused to come into being by the creative activity of God. Second, God is the conserving cause of everything that exists. This means that God not only brings into existence every contingent thing that exists, but that every contingent thing which remains in existence does so by God's continuously maintaining it in existence. Third, every action by a created substance requires direct divine activity as concurrent cause. Thus, every whack of the hammer, every hit of my fingertip on the keyboard, every tug of a magnet on a piece of iron requires not merely that a created substance act, but also that the creator act concurrently with the substance to bring about the particular effect. [For a classic exposition of these various modes of divine causal involvement see St. Thomas Aquinas, Disputationes de Potentia Dei , Q.3, a.7, resp.]

Of course, since this traditional picture had God so intimately connected with the workings of the cosmos, the holiness problem seemed all the more intractable. In light of these intimate connections the problem is not just that God created a world in which evil happens to occur, but that God seems to be causally (and thus morally) implicated in, for example, every particular act of murder, every earthquake, and every death caused by plague. As a result, responses to the holiness problem sought to explain not only how God could remain holy in light of having created a world such as ours, but also how he could remain holy in light of conserving it in existence and cooperating in all the events that occur in it.

Since Leibniz lived in between these two eras, eras in which evil was taken to present quite different problems for the monotheistic philosopher, we are immediately led to wonder which sort of problem he sought to address. Without a doubt Leibniz expends a great deal of effort attempting to solve the holiness problem. But he also frequently takes up something much like the atheistic problem. It would be somewhat deceptive, however, to call it the atheistic problem at this stage in the history of ideas however, since, when raised in this way, evil was seen more an argument for an unorthodox form of theism, than an argument for atheism. Thus, for example, a group of thinkers collectively known as "Socinians" held, among other things, that the existence of evil was not incompatible with God's existence, but that it was incompatible with the existence of a God who is all-knowing. Thus, Socinians held that God must not be all-knowing, lacking at least knowledge of the future. [For Leibniz's view on the Socinians see Theodicy 364 (H343; G VI 318) et passim. More details on Socinianism can be found in Jolley, c.2, and Maclachlan.]

We might then characterize the problem raised by atheists in our own century and by Socinians, to cite just one example, in the seventeenth century, in more broad terms as what I will call the "underachiever problem." According to the underachiever problem, if there were the sort of being that traditional monotheism describes as God, the existence of this world would represent a vast underachievement on his part; thus there is no such being as this. Atheists take this conclusion to show that there is no God, Socinians take it to show that God is not the sort of being the traditionalist supposes.

Without a doubt, Leibniz is concerned about the underachiever problem, though it is the Socinian, and not the atheist, version of the problem that occupies his attention. The winds of atheism simply had not reached the gale force proportions that it would in succeeding centuries. As a result, this stronger conclusion was not yet taken as a serious, or at least the main, threat presented by evil.

It is important to distinguish these various problems of evil since we cannot understand Leibniz's treatment of evil in a given text until we know what problem it is that he is addressing. Having set the stage in this way, we can know turn to look at Leibniz's solutions to these problems of evil, beginning with the underachiever problem, then turning to the holiness problem.

2. The Underachiever Problem

The core of Leibniz's solution to the underachiever problem is quite straightforward. Leibniz argues that there is no underachieving involved in creating this world since this world is the best of all possible worlds. Many thinkers have supposed that commitment to the claim that this world is the best of all possible worlds follows straightforwardly from monotheism. Since God is all-powerful, all-knowing, and all-good, there is certainly nothing that can prevent God from creating the best world. And God's goodness further obliges God to create the best world. Thus, the actual world is the best world.

Leibniz's reasoning to his conclusion does not, however, follow this straightforward path since, among other things, it is not clearly cogent as it stands. A number of seventeenth century figures recognized that God would not be obliged to create the best if there were no best world. There might be no such best world if the series of possible worlds formed a continuum of increasingly good worlds ad infinitum. And if there were no such best world, we cannot fault God for failing to create the best since to do so is as impossible as, say, naming the highest number. There is no such number of course, and likewise no such world. Thus, while God may obliged to create a world which has at least some measure of goodness, he could not be obliged, on this view, to create the best. Thus, God simply chose arbitrarily to bring about one among the range of morally acceptable worlds. [This line of argument was common among certain Jesuit scholastics of the period. For discussions of this see, for example, Ruiz de Montoya, Commentaria ac Disputationes in primam partem Summae Thologicae S. Thomae. De voluntate Dei et propiis actibus eius , Lyon 1630, disp. 9 and 10, and Diego Granado, Diego Granado, Comentarii in primam partem Summae Theologicae S. Thomae , Pont-a-Mousson, 1624, pp.420-433.]

Leibniz was aware of this argument which denied God's obligation to create the best, but he was firmly committed to rejecting it. The reason for this is that a central principle of Leibniz's system, the Principle of Sufficient Reason, forced him to reject it. According to this principle, any state of affairs must have a reason sufficient which explains why it and not some other state of affairs obtains. When it comes to our world, then, there must be some reason which explains why it, and not some other world, obtains. Clearly, however, there can be no such reason on the view that the goodness of worlds increases ad infinitum. Thus, Leibniz held, there must be no such infinite continuum.

One might be tempted to resist Leibniz's argument here by saying that even on the "infinite continuum of good worlds" view there is something which can play the role of sufficient reason for the fact that this world is actual, namely, God's decree that this world be actual . But this, as Leibniz notes, would just push the problem back one step further, since the Principle of Sufficient Reason applies to free choices as much as any other event. Thus, we would have to provide a sufficient reason for God choosing this world over some other on the continuum. And it looks like providing such a sufficient reason is the very thing we cannot do on the infinite continuum of good worlds view. Notice that the sufficient reason cannot be provided by some feature or fact about the world actually chosen. For this would raise the obvious question: why did this feature provide the sufficient reason for God's choice? The only possible answers, it appears, would be: a) because God arbitrarily selected that feature as the one he would favor in deciding which world to create, or b) because that feature made that world better than the competitors. But notice that neither of these answers are acceptable. The first is inconsistent with the Principle of Sufficient Reason. The second is incompatible with the hypothesis we are trying to defend here: that there is no "best world."

One might think that declaring this world to be the best possible world is hardly a response to the underachiever problem. In fact, one might think it just provides ammunition for a new underachiever argument along the following lines:

1) If God were all-powerful, all-knowing, and all-good, then this world would be the best possible world.

2) But surely this world is not the best possible world.

3) Thus, God is not all-powerful, all-knowing, and all-good.

Leibniz believed that the evidence that the conclusion of this argument was false was simply overwhelming. So, he is committed to thinking that one of the two premises in this argument is false. Since he himself is committed to the first, he ought to reject the second. And this is what he does.

What reason, Leibniz asks, does the critic have for thinking that 2) is true? When Leibniz addresses this issue, he usually has the critic saying something along the following lines:

Surely this world is not the best possible world since we can easily conceive of possible worlds that are better. Take some token instance of suffering: the tragic bombing of the Oklahoma City federal building. Surely a world without that event would be better than the actual world. And there is no reason why God couldn't have created the world without that event. Thus, this is not the best possible world. [See Theodicy 118-119 (H 188-191; G VI 168-172)

Leibniz's response to this sort of criticism comes in two stages. First, Leibniz says that while we can think of certain token features of the world that might be better than they are taken individually, we don't know whether or not it is possible to create a better world without those features, since we are never sure of what the connections between the token events and other events in the world might be. If we could improve the token event without otherwise changing the world, we may well have a better world. Unfortunately, we have no way of knowing if changing the token would leave the world otherwise unchanged, or might instead make things, on balance, worse. [See Theodicy 211-214 (H260-2; G VI 244-7) and Gr, p.64f., for examples]

Second, examples such as these are deceptive because they presume that God utilizes standards of world goodness that he does not use. For example, it might presume that a world is only good if each part taken in isolation is good (a standard we have seen Leibniz argues against). Or, it might presume that a world is good only if earthly humans enjoy happiness.

Leibniz argued repeatedly that it was surely too parochial to think that the standard by which the goodness of worlds is to be judged is earthly human happiness. A more reasonable standard, says Leibniz, would be the happiness of all sentient beings. But once we admit this, it may turn out that the amount of unhappiness in the created realm is quite small since for all we know, the sentient beings on the earth might represent a very small percentage of the sentient beings God has created. Here he includes not only preternatural beings such as angels, but the possibility of extra-terrestrial rational beings as well [Theodicy 19 (H134-5; G VI 113-4)].

Leibniz scholars differ about which standard Leibniz thought was applicable in judging the goodness of worlds. Various scholars have defended one or more of the following:

1) The best world is the one which maximizes happiness (i.e., virtue) of rational beings.

2) The best world is the one which maximizes the "quantity of essence."

3) The best world is the one which yields the greatest variety of phenomena governed by the simplest set of laws.

Whether or not Leibniz believed that the maximizing the happiness or virtue of rational beings is one of the standards by which God judges world goodness is a disputed question. [For supporters of this claim see Rutherford, c.3; Blumenfeld, Brown; for detractors see Russell, p.199, Gale]. It is unlikely that Leibniz believed that 1) alone was the true standard of world goodness in light of the fact that he says, in commenting on an argument by Bayle:

the author is still presupposing that false maxim . . . stating that the happiness of rational creatures is the sole aim of God [Theodicy 120 (H192; G VI 172)]

In part, the dispute over this standard hangs on whether or not 1) is compatible with the more metaphysical standards embodied in 2) and 3), since it is these more metaphysical standards that Leibniz seems to endorse most consistently. In some cases, Leibniz writes as if the standard of happiness is fully compatible with the more metaphysical criteria For example, within a single work, the Discourse on Metaphysics , Leibniz entitled section 5 "What the rules of the perfection of divine conduct consist in, and that the simplicity of the ways is in balance with the richness of effects," and entitled section 36: "God is the monarch of the most perfect republic, composed of all minds, and the happiness of this city of God is his principle purpose." Here Leibniz seems to advance both standards 1) and 3) in the same work [For another example, see R p.105 (K X pp.9-10)]. In other places however, he writes as if they compete with one another [See Theodicy 124 (H197-8;G VI 178-9)].

Whatever position one comes to hold on this matter, Leibniz often points to the more metaphysical standards as the ones God utilizes in assessing world goodness. But there is further controversy over exactly which metaphysical standard, 2) or 3), Leibniz endorses. In general, Leibniz holds that God creates the world in order to share his goodness with created things in the most perfect manner possible [Gr 355-6]. Since limited created things can only mirror the divine goodness in limited respects, God creates a variety of things, each of which has an essence that reflects different facets of divine perfection in unique ways. Since this is God's goal in creating, it would be reasonable to think that maximizing the mirroring of divine goodness in creation is the goal that God seeks in creating. And this in fact is one of the standards Leibniz seems to endorse. We might call this the "maximization of essence" standard. Leibniz seemed convinced that the actual world met this standard and that we could therefore find creatures which mirrored the divine perfections in all the sorts of ways that creatures could do this. Thus, there are creatures with bodies and creatures without, creatures with freedom and intelligence and creatures without, creatures with sentience and creatures without, etc. [See, for example, MP pp.75-6 and 138 (G VII 303-4 and 310)].

In some texts, however, Leibniz frames the standard of goodness in what some have taken to be a third distinct way. In these places he argues that the goodness of a world is measured by the ratio of the variety of phenomena a world contains to the simplicity of the laws which govern it. Here Leibniz emphasizes the fact that the perfection of a world which maximizes the variety of phenomena it contains is enhanced by the simplicity of its laws since this displays the intelligence of the creator who created it.

Various scholars have made the case that one or the other of these two more metaphysical standards represents Leibniz's settled view on the true standard of goodness [Gale, for example]. Others have argued that, in the end, the two standards are not exclusive of one another [See Rutherford, cc.2-3 and Rescher, c.1 for two very different ways of harmonizing 2) and 3)].

Whichever might be the case, if these are the standards by which one thinks God judges the world's goodness, it becomes much more difficult to defend the claim that this is not the best possible world. We can use standard 3) to illustrate. If God were to eliminate the Oklahoma City bombing, what would be required to do so? There are presumably a number of ways in which this might be done. The most obvious would involve miraculous intervention somewhere in the chain of events leading up to the explosion. God might miraculously prevent the explosives from detonating, or might make the entire truck and its contents vanish. But any sort of miraculous intervention will involve making the laws governing the phenomena more complex. As a result, Leibniz, and others who share this view of what world goodness consists in, such as Malebranche, think that miraculous intervention is generally repugnant and would require vastly outweighing goods in order for them to be permissible. [See Theodicy 129 (H192-3; G VI 182)].

In any case, Leibniz holds that we are simply unable to know how changing certain events would change the worlds capacity to meet the standards of goodness described in 2) and 3). As a result, we can never, with any confidence, make the claim that this world is not as good, all things considered, as some other world we might try to imagine. According to Leibniz, then, the underachiever problem cannot get off the ground unless the critic is able to defend the claim that this world is not the best possible world. While we might think such a defense would be easy to mount, our inability to know how changing certain events in the world would affect other events, and our inability to know how such changes would affect the true overall goodness of the world makes such a defense impossible for us.

3. The Holiness Problem

Far less scholarly attention has been devoted to Leibniz's treatment of the holiness problem, if only because this way of seeing the problem has only recently been recognized by Leibniz scholars. As mentioned above, the main problem here is that God's character seems to be stained by evil since God knowingly and causally contributes to the existence of everything in the world, and evil is one of those things. [For two recent treatments see Sleigh (1996) and Murray (2005)]
The standard solution adopted by medieval thinkers was to deny something the above argument affirms, namely, that evil is a "something." Evil, they claimed was not a positive reality, but a "privation" or "lack." As a result, evil has no more reality than the hole in the center of a donut. Making a donut does not require putting together two components, the cake and the hole. Instead, the cake is all that there is to the donut. The hole is just "privation of cake." Thus, it would be silly to say that making the donut requires something to cause the cake, and then something to cause the hole. Causing the cake causes the hole as a "by-product." Thus, we need not assume any additional cause for the hole beyond that assumed for the causing of the cake.

The upshot of our pastry analogy is simply this: since evil, like the hole, is merely a privation, it needs no cause on its own (or as the medievals, and Leibniz, liked to say, it needs no "cause per se "). Thus, God is not a "knowing causal contributor to evil" since evil per se has no cause at all. But since God does not contribute to evil, God cannot be implicated in the evil. Thus, the holiness problem evaporates.

Early in his career Leibniz, like many seventeenth century figures, scoffed at this solution. In a short piece entitled "The Author of Sin," Leibniz explains why he thinks the privation response to the holiness problem fails. Since, Leibniz argues, God is the author of all that is real and positive in the world, God is, by extension, "author" of all of its privations, "It is a manifest illusion to hold that God is not the author of sin because there is no such thing as an author of a privation, even though he can be called the author of everything which is real and positive in the sinful act." [A.6.3.150]

The reason, says Leibniz, can be gleaned from an example. Consider a painter who creates two paintings, one a small scale version of the other. The details of the pictures are identical in every respect, only the scale is different. It would be absurd, Leibniz remarks,

. . . to say that the painter is the author of all that is real in the two paintings, without however being the author of what is lacking or the disproportion between the larger and the smaller painting. . . . In effect, what is lacking is nothing more than a simple result of an infallible consequence of that which is positive, without any need for a distinct author [of that which is lacking] [A.6.3.151]

Thus, even if it is true that evil is a privation, this does not have as a consequence that God is not the author of sin. Since what is positively willed by God is a sufficient condition for the evil state of affairs obtaining, willing what is positive makes God the author of that which is privative as well [A similar early critique is found at A.6.3.544].

Thus, in his early years Leibniz looks to develop a different strategy. In the Philosopher's Confession , his most significant treatise on evil aside for the Theodicy , Leibniz claims that God wills everything in the world, though his will with respect to goods in the world is decretory , while his will respect to evils is merely permissive . Further, Leibniz argues, permissive willing of evils is morally permissible as long as the permitting the evil is a necessary condition for meeting one's outweighing obligations.

It is important to note here that Leibniz does not think that the permission of evil is morally permissible because allowing the evil brings about a greater good not otherwise attainable . To put the matter this way leaves God, according to Leibniz, in the position of violating the Biblical injunction "not to do evil that good may come" [Causa Dei 36 (S 121; G VI 444)]. Thus, Leibniz casts permission in such a way that the resultant evil is a necessary consequence of God's performing his duty (namely, to create the best world). As a result, Leibniz characterizes (morally permissible) permission as follows:

P permits E iff:
  1. P fails to will that E
  2. P fails to will that not-E
  3. P brings it about that state of affairs S obtains by willing that S obtains
  4. If S obtains then E obtains
  5. P knows that 4)
  6. P believes that it is P's duty to will S and that the good of performing one's duty outweighs the evil entailed by E's obtaining

[This account is distilled from A.6.3.129-131]

This, Leibniz believes, resolves any holiness problem that might arise in so far as God is considered as creator of the cosmos. However, from the time that Leibniz composed the Philosopher's Confession until at least the mid-1680's, Leibniz grew increasingly concerned that a tension might arise in his account when applied to the holiness problem considered as a problem for concurrence . Recall that traditional theists held that God was not only creator and conserver of all created things, but that in addition God acted as concurrent cause of every act of a created substance.

There were heated debates in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries concerning the nature of divine concurrence. And much of the dispute focused on the way in which God concurred with the free acts of creatures. This was an especially pressing problem for the obvious reason that positing too close of a connection between God and the creature in cases where moral evils are committed runs the risk of implicating God in the evil, thus raising the holiness problem all over again. This debate often focused on a certain type of proposition and on what made this type of proposition true. The type of proposition in question are called "conditional future contingents" and they are propositions of the form:

If agent, S, were in circumstances, C, and time, t, S would freely chose to f.

These propositions were particularly important in discussions of philosophical theology in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries because God's having knowledge of token propositions of this type was regarded as essential for God exercising providential control over the activities of free beings in creation. In order to be able to providentially superintend the activities of free beings in the created world, God must know how each such being will choose to act in each circumstance in which they will be found. If God did not know what Eve would choose when confronted by the serpent, or what I would choose when confronted with the tuna sandwich, God could not know, in advance, how the order of events would unfold in the universe he deigns to create.

But how does God know whether or not a token proposition of this type is true? Speaking generally, disputants in this period held that there were only two answers. God either knows that a token proposition of this type is true because God wills it to be true, or because something independent of God's will makes it true, and God, being omniscient, thereby knows it. In keeping with recent tradition, we will call the first view the "postvolitional view" (since the truth of the proposition is determined only "after" God wills it) and the latter view the "prevolitional" view (since the propositions has truth independently of what God wills). In his early years, Leibniz seemed inclined to adopt the postvolitional answer. So, take the token proposition:

If Peter were accused of consorting with Christ immediately after the crucifixion, Peter would deny Christ.

The early Leibniz would have held that this proposition, and others of this type, is true because God decrees that it is, that is, he decrees that Peter will deny under these circumstances [See C 26-7 and Gr 312-3]. Furthermore, those who held this view generally held that it was through divine concurrence that God makes the proposition true in the actual world. So, by causally influencing Peter at the moment of decision, God brings it about that Peter denies in these circumstances.

This view obviously faces a number of difficulties. For our purposes, the most pressing one is that it seems to undercut Leibniz's solution to the holiness problem based on permission. For if the above proposition is true because God wills that it is, then it appears that God wills that Peter sin, and if he wills that Peter sin, he cannot merely permit it, in light of condition 1) of the definition of permission. As a result, it appears that Leibniz must surrender his initial answer to the question "what makes conditional future contingents true?" and adopt the alternative answer.

There are troubles here as well, however. What does it mean to say that the truth of the proposition is determined independently of God's will? Defenders of this view usually held that the human will was entirely free from any determining cause whatsoever. In choosing one alternative over another, nothing could be regarded as "determining" or "causing" the choice, else it would not be free. Thus, for those who defended this view, the answer to the question "what makes conditional future contingents true?" must be "nothing." For if something made it true, then that thing would be determining the choice, and the choice could then not be free.

In light of his commitment to the Principle of Sufficient Reason, however, Leibniz could not support such a view. Does Leibniz, then, have answer to this question that will rescue him from the holiness problem? Scholars disagree about this. Some have held that Leibniz is obliged to hold the postvolitional view in spite of the troubles it raises for him [See Davidson, Sleigh (1995)(1996)]. Others have held that Leibniz tried to forge a third alternative in order to avoid this seemingly intractable dilemma [See Murray (2005); for an alternative to Murray (2005) see Cover and Hawthorne (2000)]. I will close with a look at this latter suggestion.

According to Leibniz, free choice in humans is brought about through the activity of the human intellect and the human will working in concert with one another. The intellect deliberates about alternatives and selects the one that it perceives to be the best all things considered. The intellect then represents this alternative to the will as the one that is best to pursue. The will, which for Leibniz is a faculty characterized by "appetite for the good," then chooses that alternative which is represented to it as containing the most good. [Theodicy , 311 (H314; G VI 300-1).]

On this picture, it appears that there are two ways in which I might exercise "control" over my acts of will. First, I might be able to control what appears to me to be the best all things considered. That is, I might control the process of deliberation. Second, I might be able to control the will's choosing that alternative which is presented to it by the intellect as representing the greatest good at that time. There are places where Leibniz seems to accept each of these possibilities. In some passages he argues that by engaging in moral therapy of certain sorts I can control which things appear to me good, and thus control the outcome of my deliberations. In other passages, he seems to say that while the will does "infallibly" choose that which the intellect deems to be best, the will retains the power to resist since the intellect does not "cause" the will to choose as it does. [Concerning the first strategy see, for example, Reflections on Hobbes , 5 (H396-7; G VI 391-1). For more on this aspect of Leibniz's view of freedom see Seidler (1985). Concerning the second strategy see, for example Theodicy 282 (H298-300; G VI 284-5).]

Difficulties arise in following through on either suggestion. Consider the first. How might I go about engaging in "moral therapy"? First, I would have to choose to do something to begin to bring about a change in how I see things. But of course, I can only make a choice to do this if I first deliberate about it and see that making this change is the best thing to be done. So, did I have control over this process of "coming to see that a change is the best thing to be done"? It looks as if I have control here only if I have control over the actions that led to my coming to see things this way in the first place. Do I have control over these actions? If the answer is yes, it is only because I had control over my prior deliberations, and it looks as if this will lead us back in the chain of explanation to certain very early formative stages of my moral and intellectual life, stages over which it is hard to believe I had any control. Thus, this route seems hard to sustain.

Let us consider the second alternative then, according to which I have control because the will is never "causally determined" to choose that which the intellect deems to be best in those circumstances. Leibniz held that the will was not causally determined in the act of choice but merely "morally necessitated." Scholars disagree about exactly how we should understand this phrase. Some think it just means "causally necessitated." But if this is right, it appears that God, who establishes the laws of nature, determines how creatures act, and this leads us back to the suggestion that Leibniz was a postvolitionalist in these matters. As we noted above, this is a troubling position for Leibniz to adopt since it seems to undermine his response to the holiness problem. [For various positions on the nature of "moral necessity" see Adams, pp.21-2, Sleigh (2000), Murray (1995), pp.95-102, and (1996), esp. Section IV].

Others have held that moral necessity is a philosophical novelty, invented to explain the unique relationship between intellect and will. On this view, the will infallibly follows the outcome of deliberation, without being causally necessitated by it. Leibniz sometimes hints at this reading such as in the following example he borrows from Pierre Nicole:

It is considered impossible that a wise and serious magistrate, who has not taken leave of his senses, should publicly commit some outrageous action, as it would be, for instance, to run about the streets in order to make people laugh [Theodicy 282 (H299; G VI 284)]

Here, the wise magistrate is not causally determined to refrain from streaking to make people laugh. Instead, he just considers it so unseemly that "he can't bring himself to do it." Something about his psychological constitution prevents him from seeing this as a live option for him, even though there is surely some sense in which he could do it nonetheless.

If we allow Leibniz to locate control over actions in the fact that the will is only morally necessitated by the intellect, is there a way for him to avoid the postvolitional/ prevolitional dilemma discussed earlier? It is not clear. One would have to say that the will infallibly choosing in accordance with the deliverances of deliberation is a fact, the truth of which is independent of God's will , while also saying that the deliverances of deliberation provide a sufficient reason for the wills choice. If this can be done, Leibniz may have a way of avoiding the difficulty posed by conditional future contingents.

However we might think these questions should be resolved, Leibniz himself seemed to think that the prevolitional route is the one to take. This seems relatively clear in light of the fact that from the mid-1680's onward, Leibniz consistently uses language which implies that God merely "discovers" how free human beings would act if created. [See, for example, Gr 227, 232, AG 32, and C 23-4]. It is not something that God makes so. In these later works, Leibniz speaks of these truths about how human beings will act as "limitations" which prevent God from making them, and the world that contains them, more perfect. In the end, it is these limitations, Leibniz argues, which prevents there being a better world than the actual one [On the notion of "limitations" see AG 60-2, 11,Theodicy 20 (H86-7; G VI 114-5), Causa Dei 69-71 (S 128-30; 457-8)]. If this is right, then we might think that the permission strategy will work as a solution to the holiness problem both when it comes to considering God as creator and as concurrent cause of all effects in the cosmos.

It is interesting to note that, for reasons still not clear, Leibniz comes to favor, in later life, the scholastic "privation" view he rejected in his youth. [See, for example, Theodicy 20, 30, 153 (respectively, H86-7, 91-2, 219-20; G VI 114-5, 119-20, 201]. The role that this revived position is supposed to play for Leibniz in his later writings awaits further scholarly investigation.

The issues that arise in thinking about Leibniz's views on the problem of evil are vigorously discussed among contemporary Leibniz scholars and philosophers of religion. It is clear that his thinking about evil impacts, and is impacted by, some of the most centrally important components of his philosophical and theological system. Because of this, scholars have found inquiry into this feature of Leibniz's philosophy a particularly rewarding route for discovering some of the deeper motivations standing behind some of Leibniz's more puzzling philosophical views. Yet because this topic represents such an active area of current Leibniz scholarship, it is clear that any conclusions we might draw on his views are, for now, preliminary and subject to revision.


Primary Sources

[A] Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe . Darmstadt and Berlin: Berlin Academy, 1923-. Cited by series, volume, and page.
[AG] Philosophical Essays. Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber (eds. and trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
[C] Louis Couturat (ed.), Opuscules et Fragments Inédits de Leibniz. Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1966.
[G] Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875-1890. Cited by volume and page.
[Gr] Textes Inédits. Edited by Gaston Grua. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1948.
[H] Theodicy. Edited by Austin Farrer and translated by E.M. Huggard. New Haven: Yale UP, 1952.
[MP] Mary Morris and G.H.R. Parkinson (eds. and trans.), Leibniz-Philosophical Writings, London: J.M. Dent and Sons, 1973.
[R] G.W. Leibniz, Political Writings. Patrick Riley (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
[S] Paul Schrecker and Anne Martin Schrecker (eds. and trans.), Leibniz: Monadology and Other Philosophical Essays, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1965.

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

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Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm