Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Leibniz's Philosophy of Physics

1. There has been considerable debate over the exact date and extent of Leibniz's conversion to mechanism. See, for starters, Kabitz (1909, 51-53), Brown (1984, chapter 3), and Mercer (2001, 24-48). For further references see especially Mercer (2001, 26, fn. 11).

2. I.e. lower level liberal arts studies, traditionally consisting of grammar, rhetoric, and logic. Loemker reports that “The curriculum of the Nicolai School in Leipzig, while not conforming completely to the medieval trivium, still consisted of Latin and Greek, rhetoric, and logic, together with Scholastic theology” (L 660, fn. 2).

3. See, for example, his letters to his former instructor Jacob Thomasius of 26 September/6 October 1668 and 20/30 April 1669 (A II:i, no. 9 and 11). An English translation of the letter of 20/30 April 1669 can be found in L 93-103.

4. A.II.i 16/L 95

5. It should be noted that, for Leibniz, the adoption of mechanism was not tantamount to a wholesale repudiation of Aristotelian natural philosophy. Thus, for example, in a letter of 1669 to his former mentor Jacob Thomasius, Leibniz argues not only that “the reformed philosophy can be reconciled with Aristotle's and does not conflict with it” but, even more aggressively, that “the one … must be explained through the other … that the very views which the moderns are putting forth so pompously are derived from Aristotelian principles” (A.II.i 16/L 95; italics added). For more on Leibniz's conciliatory attitude towards Aristotelianism, see especially, Mercer (2001).

6. Recalling the theory of the TMA later in life, Leibniz writes:

… I showed that it ought to follow that the conatus of a body entering into a collision, however small it might be, would be impressed on the whole receiving body, however larger it might be, and thus, that the largest body at rest would be carried off by a colliding body however small it might be, without regarding it at all, since such a notion of matter contains not resistance to motion, but indifference. From this it follows that it would be no more difficult to put a large body into motion than a small one … (SD 19/AG 124)

7. This dating is based on a quotation attributed to Leibniz in FC, page LXIV, which reads, “Spinoza did not see the mistakes in Descartes's rules of motion; he was surprised when I began to show him that they violate the equality of cause and effect.” I first learned of the quotation from Garber (1998, 278). Garber reports that he has been unable to confirm the date in a more reliable source, and notes “there is some uncertainty that attaches to the dating” (Garber 1998, 339, fn. 25).

8. For discussion of the controversy, see especially Iltis (1979), Costabel (1973), and Laudan (1968).

9. See A VI.ii, 158.

10. For more on the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence, and further references, see especially Broad (1981) and Vailati (1997).

11. Indeed, Leibniz sometimes argues against atomism directly from the Principle of Sufficient Reason. In his Fourth Letter to Clark, for example, he first argues that there can be no sufficient reason for any ratio of void to matter other than 0:1, and then argues that “the case is the same with atoms: what reason can anyone assign for confining nature in the progression of subdivision?” (G VII.378/AG 332).

12. It is perhaps worth noting that since Leibniz maintains that true motion is grounded in forces, the same conclusion will not follow on his own account; even at an idealized instant the physical world for Leibniz could still enjoy a qualitative variety in virtue of a differential distribution of derivative forces.

13. Cf. “Nothing is really solid or fluid, absolutely speaking, and everything has a certain degree of solidity or fluidity; which term we apply to a thing derives from the predominant appearance it presents to our senses” (SD 51/AG 135).

14. See Descartes's Letter to More 15 April 1649/CSMK 372

15. See, for example, “Preliminary Specimen: On the Law of Nature Relating to the Power of Bodies” GM VI 287-92/AG 105-111 and “A Specimen of Dynamics” GM VI 234-254/AG 117-138.

16. It should be noted that Leibniz also attempts to prove the conservation of vis viva without the help of this obviously empirical principle. See, for example, “Preliminary Specimen: On the Law of Nature Relating to the Power of Bodies” GM VI 291-92/AG 110-111; “A Specimen of Dynamics, Part I, par. 15” GM VI 243-44/AG 127. For discussion see Garber (1998, 313f).

17. Given the controversy that erupted in the wake of Leibniz's argument, it may be worthwhile to make two brief remarks in connection with the conservation principles of Newtonian mechanics. First, the Cartesian quantity of motion is not a vector quantity – it doesn’t take account of the direction of the moving body – and therefore it must be distinguished from the Newtonian notion of momentum (mv). In fact, Leibniz accepts the conservation of momentum and thus must be understood only to be arguing against the non-vectorial quantity of motion. Second, although kinetic energy (1/2 mv2) is conserved only in elastic collisions, Leibniz maintains that, at root, all fundamental collisions are elastic, and that inelastic collisions must therefore be analyzed as collisions of composite, and ultimately elastic, bodies.

18. On this point, see especially Leibniz's De Arcanis motus et Mechanica ad puram Geometriam reducenda, edited by H. J. Hess, Studia Leibnittiana Supplementa – Leibniz à Paris 1672-1676, Les Sciences, volume XVII, Tome 1, 202-205.

19. It should be noted that for metaphysical reasons, Leibniz denies that, strictly speaking, forces are ever transferred from one created entity to another. Thus, for example, he writes:

It should be known, however, that forces do not cross from body into body, since any body whatever already has in itself the force that it exerts, even if it does not show it or convert it into motion of the whole prior to a new modification. For example, when a ball that is at rest is struck by another, it is moved by an implanted force, namely by elastic force, without which there would be no collision. Moreover, the Elastic force in the body arises from an internal motion invisible to us. And the Entelechy itself is modified corresponding to these mechanical or derivative [forces]. Therefore it can be said that force is already present in every body, and it is determined only by modification. (LW 131/Adams (1994, 383)

20. Leibniz clearly takes his infinitesimal calculus to relate vis viva and vis mortua. It is not so clear, however, whether he thinks the two quantities are related by, as it were, a single or a double integration. The passage quoted just above in the main text suggests that dead force is related to living force by a single integration so that if dead force were as x, living force would be as ∫xdx (or, put conversely, that dead force is related to living force as its first derivative). As Westfall (1971) notes, however, Leibniz sometimes suggests that the move from dead force to living force requires an integration twice over. Thus, for example, in a letter to De Volder, Leibniz writes “Hence according to the analogy of geometry or of analysis, solicitation [i.e. dead forces] are as dx, velocities as x and [living] forces as xx or ∫xdx” (or, put conversely, that dead force is related to living force as its second derivative) (G II.154-156). For further discussion, see especially Westfall (1971, 298f).

21. That is, if we take dead force to be equal to be the derivative of the body's velocity with respect to time multiplied by its mass, i.e. dead force = mass (dv/dt).

22. For discussion of Descartes's treatment of the laws of motion, see especially Garber 1992, Chapters 7 and 9.

23. See, for example, letter to Malebranche July 1687:

When the difference between two instances in a given series or that which is presupposed can be diminished until it becomes smaller than any given quantity whatever, the corresponding difference in what is sought or in their results must of necessity also be diminished or become less than any given quantity whatever. Or to put it more commonly, when two instances or data approach each other continuously, so that one at last passes over into the other, it is necessary for the consequences or results (or the unknown) to do so also (G. III, 51/L. 351).

24. By the time Leibniz introduced the principle of continuity, the defects of Descartes's collision rules were already widely acknowledge, even by his staunchest defenders.

25. Leibniz may have followed Huygens in measuring the velocity of the bodies relative to their common center of gravity, but any inertial reference frame will do.

26. For more on this argument, see Dynamica GM VI.495; for a brief discussion see Garber 1998, 316-317, 350-51 fn. 124.

27. It is rather difficult to say whether or not Leibniz actually is committed to this denial. Certainly, he would have denied that if we consider the motion of the train as merely a change of relative position, then there is no saying whether or not the train is accelerating independently of an arbitrarily chosen frame of reference. But, as soon as we add that we feel the jerk of the train as it accelerates, or feel ourselves pressed up against its walls, Leibniz might insist that we have moved from kinematics to dynamics. Cf. A VI.iv.2019. For helpful discussion of this point, see especially Lodge 2003.

28. The text in the original language can be found in Louis Couturat, Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz, Paris 1903, 590.

29. In his critical notes on Descartes's Principles, Leibniz writes:

If motion is nothing but the change of contact or of immediate vicinity, it follows that we can never define which thing is moved. For just as the same phenomena may be interpreted by different hypotheses in astronomy, so it will always be possible to attribute the real motion to either one or the other of the two bodies which change their mutual vicinity or position. Hence, since one of them is arbitrarily chosen to be at rest or moving at a given rate in a given line, we may define geometrically what motion or rest is to be ascribed to the other, so as to produce the given phenomena. Hence if there is nothing more in motion than this reciprocal change, it follows that there is no reason in nature to ascribe motion to one thing rather than to others. The consequence of this will be that there is no real motion. (GP IV.369/L 393)

30. This section is especially indebted to the elegant discussion in Broad 1981.

31. For a helpful discussion of Newton's view and argument, see especially Rynasiewicz 1995a and 1995b.

32. Isaac Newton, 1952 [1730] Opticks or A Treatise on the Reflections, Refractions, Inflections and Colours of Light, (New York: Dover) Query 28, 31.

33. Similarly, Leibniz writes:

I shall give another instance of this. God's immensity makes him actually present in all spaces. But now if God is in space, how can it be said that space is in God, or that it is a property of God? We have often heard that a property is in its subject; but we never heard that a subject is in its property. In like manner, God exists in all time. How then can time be in God; and how can it be a property of God? These are perpetual alloglossies [i.e. verbal oddities]. (Fifth Paper, paragraph 45; G VII.399/Alexander 68)

34. On the doctrine of imaginary space, see Grant (1981), especially Chapter 6.