#### Supplement to Deontic Logic

## A Bit More on Chisholm's Paradox

Recall the Chisholm quartet and its most natural symbolization in SDL:

(1) It ought to be that Jones goes to assist his neighbors.

(1′)OBg.

(2) It ought to be that if Jones goes, then he tells them he is coming.

(2′)OB(g→t).

(3) If Jones doesn't go, then he ought not tell them he is coming.

(3′) ~g→OB~t.

(4) Jones doesn't go.

(4′) ~g.

There is a general point to be made regarding the key inferences that
generate the paradox per the above symbolization. There is a sense in
which the inference from (1′) and (2′) to
**OB***t* and the inference from (3′) &
(4′) to **OB**~*t* involve
“detachment” of an obligation from a pair of premises, one
of which involves a deontic conditional in some way. Let us introduce
a bit of regimentation. Let

“OB(q/p)”

represent a shorthand for a conditional obligation or ought
statement like that in the natural language sentence, (3),
above.^{[1]}
So we will read **OB**(*q*/*p*) as
“if *p*, then it ought to be (or it is obligatory) that
*q*,” in the manner of (3) above. Suppose we also assume,
as almost all
have^{[2]}
that monadic obligations are disguised dyadic obligations, per the
following analysis:

OBp=_{df}OB(p/⊤).

With this in mind we distinguish between two relevant types of
“detachment
principles”^{[3]}
that we might ascribe to these iffy-‘ought’s:

Factual Detachment (FD):p&OB(q/p) .→OBq

Deontic Detachment (DD):OBp&OB(q/p). →OBq

*Factual detachment* tells us that from the fact that
*p*, and the deontic conditional to the effect that if
*p* then it ought to be that *q*, we can conclude that
it ought to be that *q*. *Deontic Detachment* in
contrast tells us that from the fact that it ought to be that
*p* and that if *p*, then it ought to be that
*q*, we can conclude that it ought to be that *q*. If we
interpret a deontic conditional as a material conditional with an
obligatory consequent (as in (3′) above), FD, but not DD is
supported. Conversely, if we interpret deontic conditionals as
obligatory material conditionals (as in (2′) above), DD, but not
FD is
supported.^{[4]}
Although we have shown earlier that neither of these interpretations
is acceptable, the contrast reveals a general problem. *Carte
blanche* endorsement of both types of detachment (without some
restriction) is not tenable, since it leads implausibly to the
conclusion that we are both obligated to tell (the neighbor we are
coming) and obligated to not tell. Thus researchers tended to divide
up over which principle of the two they endorsed (Loewer and Belzer
1983). The Factual Detachment camp typically endorsed the view that
the conditional in (3) in the Chisholm Quartet needs to be interpreted
as a non-material conditional, but otherwise things are as they seem
in (3): we have a conditional obligation that is a simple composite of
a non-deontic conditional and a pure unary deontic operator in the
consequent:

OB(q/p) =_{df}p⇒OBq, for some independent conditional.^{[5]}

Typically, the conditional was a non-classical conditional of the sort
made famous by Stalnaker and
Lewis.^{[6]}
It is then generally maintained that deontic detachment is flawed,
since the conditional obligations like those in (2) tell us only what
to do in ideal circumstances, but they do not necessarily provide
“cues”^{[7]}
for action *in the actual world*, where things are often
typically quite sub-ideal, as (4) combined with (1) indicates. Thus from
the fact that Jones ought to go and he ought to tell if he goes, it
doesn't follow that what he ought to *actually* do is
tell—that would be so only if it was also a fact that he goes to
their aid. At best, we can only say that he ought *ideally* to
go.

This suggestion seems a bit more difficult when we change the
conditional to something like “If Doe does kill his mother, then
it is obligatory that Doe kills her gently.” The idea that my
obligation to not kill my mother gently (say for an inheritance)
merely expresses an “ideal” obligation, but not an actual
obligation, given that I will kill her, seems hard to swallow. So this
case makes matters a bit harder for those favoring a factual
detachment approach for generating actual obligations. Similarly, it
would seem that if it is impermissible for me to kill my mother, then
it is impermissible for me to do so gently, or to do so while
dancing.^{[8]}
So *carte blanche* factual detachment seems to allow the mere
fact that I will take an action in the future (killing my mother) that
is horribly wrong and completely avoidable now to render obligatory
another horrible (but slightly less horrible) action in the future
(killing my mother gently). The latter action must be completely
avoidable if the former is, and the latter action is one that I would
*seem* to be equally obligated to not make.

The main alternative camp represented conditional obligations via
dyadic non-composite obligation operators modeled syntactically on
conditional probability. They rejected the idea that
**OB**(*q*/*p*) =_{df}
*p* ⇒ **OB***q*, for some independent
conditional. In a sense, on this view, deontic conditionals are viewed
as idioms: the meaning of the compound is not a straightforward
function of the meaning of the parts. The underlying intuition
regarding the Chisholm example is that even if it might be true that
we will violate some obligation, that doesn't get us off the hook from
obligations that derive from the original one that we will violate. If
I must go help and I must inform my neighbors that I'm coming, if I do
go help, then I must inform them, and the fact that I will in fact
violate the primary obligation does not block the derivative
obligation anymore than it does the primary one itself.

One early semantic picture for the latter camp was that a sentence of
the form **OB**(*q*/*p*) is true at a world
*i* iff the *i*-best *p*-worlds are all
*q*-worlds. **OB***q* is then true iff
**OB**(*q*/*T*), and so iff all the
unqualifiedly *i*-best worlds are *q*-worlds (Hansson
1969). Note that this weds preference-based semantic orderings with
dyadic conditional
obligations.^{[9]}
This reflects a widespread trend. Factual detachment does not work in
this case, since even if our world is an I-don't-go-help-world, and
the best among the I-don't-go-help-worlds are I-don't-call-worlds, it
does not follow that the *unqualifiedly* best worlds are
I-don't-call-worlds. In fact, in this example, these folks would
maintain, the unqualifiedly best worlds are both I-go worlds and
I-call worlds, and the fact that I won't do what I'm supposed to do
won't change that.

But one is compelled to ask those in the Deontic Detachment Camp: what then is the point of such apparent conditionals if we can't ever detach them from their apparent antecedents, and how are these conditionals related to regular ones? This seems to be the central challenge for this camp. Thus they often endorse a restricted form of factual detachment, of which the following is a representative instance:

Restricted Factual Detachment: □p&OB(q/p) .→OBq.

Here □*p* might mean various things, for example that
*p* is physically unalterable or necessary as of this moment in
history.^{[10]}
Only if *p* is settled true in some sense, can we conclude
from **OB**(*q*/*p*) that
**OB***q*. This certainly helps, but it still
leaves us with a bit of a puzzle about why this apparent composite of
a conditional and a deontic operator is actually some sort of
primitive idiom involving a modal notion.

So it seems like we are left with a dilemma: either (1) you allow
factual detachment and get the consequences earlier noted to the
effect that simply because someone will act like a louse, he is
obligated to do slightly mitigating louse-like things, or (2) instead
you claim that “if *p*, then ought *q*” is
really an idiom, and the meaning of the whole is not a function of the
meaning of its conditional and deontic parts. Each seems to be a
conclusion one would otherwise prefer to avoid.

There have been many attempts to try to solve Chisholm's problem by
carefully distinguishing the times of the
obligations.^{[11]}
This was fueled in part by shifts in the examples, in particular to
examples where the candidate “derived” obligations were
clearly things to be done *after* the primary obligation was either
fulfilled or violated (called “forward” versions of
CTDs). This made the ploy of differentiating the times and doing
careful bookkeeping about just which things were obligatory at which
times promising. However, Chisholm's own example is most plausibly
interpreted as either a case where the obligation to go help and the
perhaps-derivable obligation to tell are *simultaneous* (called
“parallel” versions), or where telling is even something
to be done *before* you go (called “backward”
versions).^{[12]}
It is easy to imagine that the way to tell the neighbors that you
will help might be to phone, and that would typically take place
before you left to actually help. (For younger readers: there were no
cell phones back in 1964, and phones were attached to boxes in houses
by yard-length coiled cords.) Concerns to coordinate aid, or to
assure those stressed that aid is coming, often favor giving
*advanced* notice.

Alternatively, it was suggested that carefully attending to the action
or agential components of the example and distinguishing those from
the circumstances or propositional components would dissolve the
puzzle.^{[13]}
However, the phenomena invoked in the Chisholm example appear to be
too general for that. Consider the following non-agential minor
variant of an example (say of possible norms for a residential
neighborhood) introduced in Prakken and Sergot 1996:

(1) It ought to be the case that there are no dogs.

(2) It ought to be the case that if there are no dogs, then there are no warning signs.

(3) If there are dogs, then it ought to be the case that there are warning signs.

(4) There are dogs.

Here we seem to have the same essentially puzzling phenomena present in Chisholm's original example, yet there is no apparent reference to actions above at all; instead the reference seems to be to states of affairs only. (Notice also that there is no issue of different times either for the presence/absence of dogs and the presence/absence of signs.)

Thus, it looks like tinkering with the temporal or action aspects of the Chisholm-style examples (however much time and action are important elsewhere to deontic logic) merely postpones the inevitable. So far, this problem appears to be not easy to convincingly solve.

A formal sketch of a sample system favoring factual detachment can be easily found in chapter 10 of Chellas 1980, which is widely available. A system that favors deontic detachment over factual detachment is quickly sketched here. The main source is Goble 2003 (but cf. van Fraassen 1972).

Here, we assume a classical propositional language now extended with a
dyadic construction, **OB**( / ), taken as primitive. A
monadic **OB** operator is then defined in the manner
mentioned above:

OBp=_{df}OB(p/T).

We can define an ordering relation between propositions as follows:

p≥q=_{df}~OB(~p/p∨q).

This says that *p* is ranked as at least as high as *q*
iff it is not obligatory that ~*p* on the condition that either
*p* or
*q*.^{[14]}

An axiom system that is a natural dyadic correlate to SDL follows:

A1: All instances of PC tautologies (TAUT) A2: OB(p→q/r) → (OB(p/r) →OB(q/r)( OB-CK)A3: OB(p/q) → ~OB(~p/q)( OB-CNC)A4: OB(T/T)( OB-CN)A5: OB(q/p) →OB(q&p/p)( OB-CO&)A6: ( p≥q) &q≥r) →p≥r(Trans) R1: If ⊢ pand ⊢p→qthen ⊢q(MP) R2: If ⊢ p↔qthen ⊢OB(r/p) ↔OB(r/q)( OB-CRE)R3: If ⊢ p→qthen ⊢OB(p/r) →OB(q/r)( OB-CRM)

A1-A4 and R1-R3 are conditional analogues of formulas or rules we have seen before in discussing axiomatizations of SDL itself. A5 and A6 are needed to generate a complete system relative to an ordering semantics of the following sort (merely sketched here).

Assume we have a set of worlds and a set of ordering relations,
*P*_{i}, for each world, *i*, where
*j**P*_{i}*k* is to be
interpreted as saying that relative to *i*'s normative
standards, *j* is at least as good as *k*. Assume also
that all of the ordering relations are non-empty: for each world
*i*, there is a world *k* and a world *m* such
that *kP*_{i}*m*. Call this structure a
“preference frame.” For any preference relation in a
preference frame, let *F*(*P*_{i})
represent the field of that relation: the set of all worlds that
appear in some ordered pair constituting the relation,
*P*_{i}. As usual, a model on a frame is an
assignment to each propositional variable of a set of worlds (those
where it will be deemed true). We then define the basic dyadic
operator's truth-condition as follows:

M⊨_{i}OB(q/p) iff there is ajinF(P_{i}) such thatM⊨_{j}p&qand for eachksuch thatkP_{i}j, ifM⊨_{k}p, thenM⊨_{k}q.

That is, at *i*, it is obligatory that *q* given
*p* iff there is some world *j* in the field of the
*i*'s preference relation where both *p* and *q*
are true, and for every world ranked at least as high *j*, if
*p* is true at that world, then so is *q*.

Call a preference frame standard iff all the preference relations in it are connected (and thus reflexive) and transitive relative to their fields:

For eachi-relative preference relation,P_{i},(1) ifjandkare inF(P_{i}), then eitherjP_{i}korkP_{i}j(connectedness).

(2) ifj,k, andmare inF(P_{i}), then ifjP_{i}kandkP_{i}m, thenjP_{i}m(transitivity).

Goble 2003 shows that the axiom system for dyadic obligation above is sound and complete for the set of standard preference frames. It is also easy to derive SDL using the above dyadic axiom system and the definition given for the monadic obligation operator. Goble's paper contains a number of other such results, for both monadic and dyadic systems, including generalizations that allow for conflicting obligations.