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Epistemic Logic

First published Wed Jan 4, 2006

Epistemic logic is the logic of knowledge and belief. It provides insight into the properties of individual knowers, has provided a means to model complicated scenarios involving groups of knowers and has improved our understanding of the dynamics of inquiry.

1. The Logic of Individual Knowers

Epistemic logic gets its start with the recognition that expressions like ‘knows that’ or ‘believes that’ have systematic properties that are amenable to formal study. In addition to its relevance for traditional philosophical problems, epistemic logic has many applications in computer science and economics. Examples range from robotics, network security and cryptography applications to the study of social and coalitional interactions of various kinds.

Modern treatments of the logic of knowledge and belief grow out of the work of a number of philosophers and logicians writing from 1948 through the 1950s. Rudolf Carnap, Jerzy Los, Arthur Prior, Nicholas Rescher, G.H. von Wright and others recognized that our discourse concerning knowledge and belief exhibits systematic features that admit of an axiomatic-deductive treatment. Among the many important papers that appeared in the 1950s, von Wright's seminal work (1951) is widely recognized as having initiated the formal study of epistemic logic as we know it today. Von Wright's insights were extended by Jaakko Hintikka in his book Knowledge and Belief: An Introduction to the Logic of the Two Notions (1962). In the 1980s and 1990s, epistemic logicians focused on the logical properties of systems containing groups of knowers and later still on the epistemic features of so-called "multi-modal" contexts.

While this article deals with modern developments, epistemic logic has a venerable history. In De Sophisiticis Elenchis as well as in the Prior and Posterior Analytics Aristotle mentions some aspects of the logic of knowledge and belief. In the medieval period, Buridan, Duns Scotus and Ockham extended Aristotle's insights in a series of detailed reflections whose themes and problems would be familiar to contemporary epistemic logicians (Boh 1993, Knuutila 1993).

Contemporary epistemic logic may appear quite technical and removed from traditional epistemological reflections. However, it assumes as its starting point some features of the logical behavior of epistemic concepts that are completely obvious. For instance, claiming to know p and q implies that you know q. Furthermore, most systems of epistemic logic begin with an assumption similar to G.E. Moore's intuitively obvious observation that one cannot coherently assert "p but I do not believe (know) p". Additional assumptions that serve as the basis for most epistemic logics include the recognition that knowledge implies veracity. If I know p then p must be the case. Thus, commonsense observations concerning the behavior of the term "knows that", have served as the starting point for later technical developments.

For the most part, epistemic logic focuses on propositional knowledge. Here, an agent or a group of agents bears the propositional attitude knowing towards some proposition. So, when one says: "Zoë knows that there is a chicken in the yard", one asserts that Zoë is the agent who bears the propositional attitude knowing towards the proposition expressed by "there is a chicken in the yard". Beyond straightforward propositional knowledge of this kind, epistemic logic also suggests ways to systematize the logic of questions and answers (Zoë knows why Murphy barked) and provides insight into the relationships between multiple modes of identification (Zoë knows that this man is the chief) and also perhaps even into questions of procedural "know-how". Epistemic logicians have found ways to formally treat a wide variety of knowledge claims in propositional terms.

Syntactically, the language of propositional epistemic logic is simply a matter of augmenting the language of propositional logic with a unary epistemic operator Kc such that

KcA   reads   "Agent c knows A

and similarly for belief

BcA   reads   "Agent c believes A

for some arbitrary proposition A.

Hintikka provided a semantic interpretation of epistemic and doxastic operators which we can present in terms of standard possible world semantics along the following lines (Hintikka 1962):

KcA: in all possible worlds compatible with what c knows, it is the case that A
BcA: in all possible worlds compatible with what c believes, it is the case that A

The basic assumption is that any ascription of propositional attitudes like knowledge and belief, involves dividing the set of possible worlds in two: Those worlds compatible with the attitude in question and those that are incompatible with it.

The set of worlds accessible to an agent depends on his or her informational resources at that instant. It is possible to capture this dependency by introducing a relation of accessibility, R, on the set of possible worlds. To express the idea that for agent c, the world w′ is compatible with his information state, or accessible from the possible world w which c is currently in, it is required that R holds between w and w′. This relation is written Rww′ and reads “world w′ is accessible from w”. The world w′ is said to be an epistemic or doxastic alternative to world w for agent c, depending on whether knowledge or belief is the considered attitude. Given the above semantical interpretation, if a proposition A is true in all worlds which agent c considers possible then c knows A.

A possible world semantics for a propositional epistemic logic with a single agent c then consists of a frame F which in turn is a pair <W,Rc> such that W is a non-empty set of possible worlds and Rc is a binary accessibility relation (relative to agent c) over W. A model M for an epistemic system consists of a frame and a denotation function φ assigning sets of worlds to atomic propositional formulas. Propositions are taken to be sets of possible worlds; namely the set of possible worlds in which they are true. Let atom be the set of atomic propositional formulae, then φ : atom mapsto P(W), where P denotes the powerset operation. The model M = <W,Rc,φ> is called a Kripke-model and the resulting semantics Kripke-semantics (Kripke 1963): An atomic propositional formula, a, is said to be true in a world w in M (written M,wa) iff w is in the set of possible worlds assigned to a, i.e., M,wa iff w ∈ φ(a) for all aatom . The formula KcA is true in an world w (i.e., M,wKcA) iff ∀w′∈W, if Rcww′, then M,w′ ⊨ A. The semantics for the Boolean connectives follow the usual recursive recipe. A modal formula is said to be valid in a frame iff the formula is true for all possible assignments in all worlds in the frame.

Similar semantics may be formulated for the belief operator. Since a belief is not necessarily true but rather probably true, possibly true, or likely to be true, we must modify our approach to the semantics of belief appropriately. For instance, belief may be modeled by assigning a sufficiently high degree of probability to the proposition in question and determining the doxastic alternatives accordingly. The truth-conditions for the doxastic operator are defined in a way similar to that of the knowledge operator and the model may also be expanded to accommodate the two operators simultaneously.

An important feature of possible world semantics is that many common epistemic axioms correspond to algebraic properties of the frame in the following sense: A modal axiom is valid in a frame if and only if the accessibility relation satisfies some algebraic condition. For example, the axiom expressing the veridicality property that if a proposition is known by c, then A is true,

(1) KcAA,

is valid in all frames in which the accessibility relation is reflexive in the sense that ∀wW : Rww. Every possible world is accessible from itself. Similarly if the accessibility relation satisfies the condition that ∀ w, w′, w″ ∈ W : Rww′ ∧ Rww″ → Rww″ then the axiom reflecting the idea that the agent knows that he knows A if he does,

(2) KcAKcKcA,

is valid in all transitive frames. Other axioms of epistemic import require yet other relational properties to be met in order to be valid in all frames.

A nomenclature due to Lemmon (1977) and later refined by Bull and Segerberg (1984) is helpful while cataloguing the axioms typically considered interesting for epistemic logic (Table 1):
K Kc(AA′) → (KcAKcA′)
D KcA → ¬Kc¬A
4 KcAKcKcA
5 ¬KcAKc¬KcA
.2 ¬Kc¬KcAKc¬Kc¬A
.3 Kc(KcAKcA′) ∨ Kc(KcA′ → KcA)
.4 A → (¬Kc¬KcAKcA)

Table 1: Common Epistemic Axioms

These axioms in proper combinations make up epistemic modal systems of varying strength depending on the modal formulas valid in the respective systems given the algebraic properties assumed for the accessibility relation.

Although the axiom K by itself constitutes the system K, the weakest system of epistemic interest is usually considered to be system T. [Note: The reader should take care to distinguish the epistemic operator K, the modal axiom K and the system of axioms K in what follows. Similarly, we distinguish the axiom T from the system T.] The system T includes the axioms T and K as valid axioms. Additional modal strength may be obtained by extending T with other axioms drawn from the above pool altering the frame semantics to validate the additional axioms. By way of example, while KcAA is valid in system T, KcAA, KcAKcKcA and ¬KcAKc¬KcA are all valid in S5 but not in T. System T has a reflexive accessibility relation, S5 has an equivalence relation of accessibility. The arrows in Table 2 symbolize that the system to which the arrow is pointing is included in the system from which the arrow originates and hence reflect relative strength. Then S5 is the strongest and S4 the weakest of the ones listed.

Epistemic Systems
KT4 S4
KT4 + .2 S4.2
KT4 + .3 S4.3
KT4 + .4 S4.4
KT5 S5

Table 2: Relative Strength of Epistemic Systems Between S4 and S5

One of the important tasks of epistemic logic is to catalogue all sound and complete systems of such logics in order to allow us to pick the most ‘appropriate’ ones. The logics range from S4 over the intermediate systems S4.2S4.4 to S5. By way of example, Hintikka settled for S4 (1962), Kutschera argued for S4.4 (1976), Lenzen suggested S4.2 (1978), van der Hoek has proposed to strengthen knowledge according to system S4.3 (1996). van Ditmarsch, van der Hoek and Kooi together with Fagin, Halpern, Moses and Vardi (Fagin et al. 1995) and others assume knowledge to be S5 valid. Similar completeness cataloguing is available for belief where axiom T is dropped and usually replaced by D (to avoid the condition of truth for belief but retain consistency among beliefs) yieding systems like KD4KD45 for belief. This also paves the way for combining epistemic and doxastic systems and for studying the interplay between knowledge and belief (see Voorbraak 1993). Care should be taken however not to collapse knowledge and belief in the combined systems as have been noted by Lenzen (1978) and Stalnaker (1996), among others.

A particularly malignant philosophical problem for epistemic logic is related to closure properties. Axiom K, can under certain circumstances be generalized to a closure property for an agent's knowledge which is implausibly strong — logical omniscience:

Whenever an agent c knows all of the formulas in a set Γ and A follows logically from Γ, then c also knows A.

In particular, c knows all theorems (letting Γ = ø), and he knows all logical consequences of any formula which he knows (letting Γ consist of a single formula). There are various ways of dealing with logical omniscience. Some of the first proposals for solving the problem of logical omniscience introduce semantical entities which explain why the agent appears to be, but in fact is not really guilty of logical omniscience. These entities were called ‘impossible possible worlds’ by Hintikka (1975). The basic idea is that an agent may mistakenly count among the worlds consistent with his or her knowledge, some worlds containing logical contradictions. The mistake is simply a product of limited resources; the agent may not be in a position to detect the contradiction and may erroneously count them as genuine possibilities. Similar entities called ‘seemingly possible’ worlds are introduced by Rantala (1975) in his urn-model analysis of logical omniscience. Allowing impossible possible worlds or seemingly possible worlds in which the semantic valuation of the formulas is arbitrary to a certain extent provides a way of making the appearance of logical omniscience less threatening. After all, on any realistic account of epistemic agency, the agent is likely to consider (albeit inadvertantly) worlds in which the laws of logic do not hold. Since no real epistemic principles hold broadly enough to encompass impossible and seemingly possible worlds, some conditions must be applied to epistemic models such that they cohere with epistemic principles.

Computer scientists have proposed that what is being modelled in epistemic logic is not knowledge simpliciter but a related concept which is immune to logical omniscience. The epistemic operator KcA should be read as ‘agent c knows implicitly A’, ‘A follows from c's knowledge’, ‘A is agent c's possible knowledge’, etc. Propositional attitudes like these should replace the usual ‘agent c knows A’. While there exists some variation, the locutions all suggest modeling implicit knowledge or what is implicitly represented in an agent's information state rather than explicit knowledge (Fagin et al. 1995, and others). The agents neither have to compute knowledge nor can they be held responsible for answering queries based on their knowledge under the implicit understanding of knowledge. Logical omniscience is an epistemological condition for implicit knowledge, but the agent may actually fail to realize this condition.

2. Groups of Knowers

Single-agent systems may be extended to groups or multi-agent systems. Following the standard treatment provided by Fagin, Halpern, Moses and Vardi (Fagin et al. 1995) we can syntactically augment the language of propositional logic with n knowledge operators, one for each agent involved in the group of agents under consideration. The primary difference between the semantics given for a mono-agent and a multi-agent semantics is roughly that n accessibility relations are introduced. A modal system for n agents is obtained by joining together n modal logics where for simplicity it may be assumed that the agents are homogenous in the sense that they may all be described by the same logical system. An epistemic logic for n agents consists of n copies of a certain modal logic. In such an extended epistemic logic it is possible to express that some agent in the group knows a certain fact, that an agent knows that another agent knows a fact etc. It is possible to develop the logic even further: Not only may an agent know that another agent knows a fact, but they may all know this fact simultaneously. From here it is possible to express that everyone knows that everyone knows that everyone knows, that…. That it is common knowledge.

As Lewis noted in his book Convention (1969) a convention requires common knowledge among the agents that observe it. A variety of norms, social and linguistic practices, agent interactions and games presuppose common knowledge (Aumann 1994). A relatively simple way of defining common knowledge is not to partition the group of agents into subsets with different common ‘knowledges’ but only to define common knowledge for the entire group of agents. Once multiple agents have been added to the syntax, the language is augmented with an additional operator c. CA is then interpreted as ‘It is common knowledge among the agents that A’. Well-formed formulas follow the standard recursive recipe with a few, but obvious, modifications taking into account the multiple agents. An auxiliary operator E is also introduced such that EA means ‘Everyone knows that A’. EA is defined as the conjunction K1AK2A ∧ … ∧ KnA.

To semantically interpret n knowledge operators, binary accessibility relations Rn are defined over the set of possible worlds W. A special accessibility relation, R°, is introduced to interpret the operator of common knowledge. The relation must be flexible enough to express the relationship between individual and common knowledge. The idea is to let the accessibility relation for c be the transitive closure of the union of the accessibility relations corresponding to the singular knowledge operators. The model M for an epistemic system with n agents and common knowledge is accordingly a structure M = <W,R1,R2,…,Rn,R°,φ>, where W is a non-empty space of possible worlds, R1,R2,…,Rn,R° are accessibility relations over W for which R° = (R1R2 ∪ … ∪ Rn) and φ again is the denotation function assigning worlds to atomic propositional formula φ : atom mapsto P(W). The semantics for the Boolean connectives remain intact. The formula KiA is true in a world w, i.e., M,wKiA iff ∀w′∈W : if Riww′, then M,w′ ⊨ A. The formula CA is true in a world w, i.e., M,wCA iff R°ww′ implies M,w′ ⊨ A. Varying the properties of the accessibility relations R1,R2,…,Rn, as described above results in different epistemic logics. For instance system K with common knowledge is determined by all frames, while system S4 with common knowledge is determined by all reflexive and transitive frames. Similar results can be obtained for the remaining epistemic logics (Fagin et al. 1995).

3. Active Agenthood

A significant difference between alethic and epistemic logic is the introduction of the agent c to the syntax. But what role does the agent play in epistemic logic? At the early stages in the development of the logic they primarily served as indices on the accessibility relation between possible worlds. However, there is nothing particularly epistemic about being an index, and epistemic logicians soon began recognizing the central role of the agent much more explicitly. An agent may have knowledge which is S4.3 valid thereby obtaining a certain epistemic strength. An important set of questions seem to be how the agent has to behave in order to gain the epistemic strength that he has. To make epistemic logic pertinent to epistemology, computer science, artificial intelligence and cognitive psychology the activity of agents must be included in our formal considerations. The original symbolic notation of a knowing agent also suggests this: An agent term should be inside the scope of the knowledge operator — not outside as Hintikka notes (1998). Inquiring agents are agents who read data, change their minds, interact or have common knowledge, act according to strategies and play games, have memory and act upon it, follow various methodological rules, expand, contract or revise their knowledge bases, etc. all in the pursuit of knowledge. Inquiring agents are active agents (Hendricks 2003).

Game theory is about strategies for winning games in the context of other agents. Game theory has therefore played a prominent role in reflections on epistemic agency (the study of the behavior of interactive epistemic agents). Aumann, van Benthem, Brandenburger, Fagin, Halpern, Keisler, Moses, Stalnaker, Vardi and others have demonstrated how logical epistemology uncovers important features of agent rationality showing how game theory adds to the general understanding of notions like knowledge, belief and belief revision.[1] Baltag, Moss, Solecki combine epistemic logic with belief revision theory to study actions and belief updates in games (Baltag et al. 1999).

Mixing the theory of belief change and epistemic logic furnishes an illustrative example of active agents. The idea dates back to the mid 1990s. Alchourrón, Gärdenfors and Makinson's seminal belief revision theory (AGM) from the 1980s is a theory about the rational change of beliefs for expansions, contractions and revisions in light of new (possibly conflicting) evidence (Alchourrón 1985, Gärdenfors 1988). In 1994, de Rijke showed that the AGM-axioms governing expansion and revision may be translated into the object language of dynamic modal logic (de Rijke 1994). At about the same time, Segerberg demonstrated how the entire theory of belief revision could be formulated in modal logic.

Segerberg merged the static first generation doxastic logic with the dynamics of belief change into ‘dynamic doxastic logic’ (Segerberg 1995). Doxastic operators in the logic of belief like BcA may be captured by AGM in the sense that ‘A is in c's belief-set T’, or ¬Bc¬A becomes ‘¬A is not in c's belief-set T’. Similarly for other combinations of the belief operator with negation. An immediate difference between the two perspectives is that while AGM can express dynamic operations on belief-sets like expansions (‘A is in c's belief-set T expanded by D’, i.e., AT+D), revisions (‘A is in c's belief-set T revised by D’, i.e., AT*D), and contractions (‘A is in c's belief-set T contracted by D’, i.e. ATD), no such dynamics are immediately expressible in the standard language of doxastic logic. On the other hand, action languages include operators like [ν] and <ν> which are prefixed to a well-formed formula A. On Segerberg's interpretation, [ν]A (<ν>A) mean that ‘after every (some) way of performing action ν it is the case that A’. By introducing three new operators [+], [*], and [−] into the doxastic language, the three dynamic operations on belief-sets may be rendered as [+D]BcA, [*D]BcA and [−D]BcA.

After revising the original belief revision theory such that changes of beliefs happen in ‘hypertheories’ or concentric spheres enumerated according to entrencement Segerberg (1999a, 199b) has provided several axiomatizations of the dynamic doxastic logic together with soundness and completeness results. The dynamic doxastic logic paradigm may also be extended to iterated belief revision as studied by Lindstrøm and Rabinowicz (1997) and accommodate various forms of agent introspection. A related approach drawn up by van Ditmarsch, van der Hoek and Kooi's new ‘dynamic epistemic logic’ studies how information changes and how actions with epistemic impact on agents may be modelled (Hoek et al. 2003, Ditmarsch et al. 2006).

Active agenthood is also realizable directly on the agent level. One may also choose to endow the agents with epistemic capacities facilitating special epistemic behaviors. Fagin, Halpern, Moses and Vardi have for instance considered ‘perfect recall’ (Fagin et al. 1995): interacting agents' knowledge in the dynamic system may increase as time goes by but the agents may still store old information. The agent's current local state is an encoding of all events that have happened so far in the run. Perfect recall is in turn an epistemic recommendation telling the agent to remember his earlier epistemic states.

There are other structural properties of agents being studied in the literature of dynamic epistemic logics. In an epistemic logic suited for modeling various games of imperfect information van Benthem refers to such properties as ‘styles of playing’ (van Benthem 2000). Properties like ‘bounded memory’, various ‘mechanisms for information updates’ and ‘uniform strategies’, infallibility, consistency etc. have been investigated. Agents as explcitly learning mechanims are also integral parts of Kelly's (1996) computational epistemology and a related approach called modal operator epistemology (Hendricks 2001, 2003).

Researchers in artificial intelligence have additionally been trying to describe and specify the behaviour of intelligent/rational agents by extensions of epistemic of logic by augmenting logics of time, action and belief with modalities for desires and intentions (see Meyer 2003), in particular, his discussion of the BDI-framework of Rao and Georgeff in Section 5.2).

4. Multi-Modalities

When epistemic logic was still in its infancy, Dana Scott noted:

Here is what I consider one of the biggest mistakes of all in modal logic: concentration on a system with just one modal operator. The only way to have any philosophically significant results in deontic logic or epistemic logic is to combine these operators with: Tense operators (otherwise how can you formulate principles of change?); the logical operators (otherwise how can you compare the relative with the absolute?); the operators like historical or physical necessity (otherwise how can you relate the agent to his environment?); and so on and so on. (Scott 1970, 143)

Nowadays, there are various ways in which multi-modalities may be realized in epistemic logic. One standard way is to follow Fagin et al. (1995). in reinterpreting agents and possible worlds relative to systems of agents.[2]

In a system of agents each individual agent is considered to be in some ‘local state’. The whole system — as the sum of the local agents and other envrionmental features — is accordingly in some `global state'. The dynamics may be modeled by defining what is referred to as a ‘run’ over the system which is a function from time to global states. The run may be construed as an account of the behavior of the system for possible executions. Pairs of runs and times give rise to `points'. For every time, the system is in some global state as a function of the particular time. The system may be thought of as a series of runs rather than agents. In this case, what is being modeled are the possible behaviors of the system over a collection of executions. A system of this kind defines a Kripke-structure with an equivalence relation over points. The accessibility relation is specified with respect to possible points such that some point w′ is accessible from the current point w if the agent is in the same local state at w and w′. Knowledge is defined with respect to the agents' local state. Truth of a formula is given with respect to a point. If truth is relative to a point then there is a question of when which opens up for the introduction of temporal operators. One may for instance define a universal future-tense operator such that a formula is true relative to the current point and all later points. The mixture of epistemic and temporal operators can handle claims about the temporal development of knowledge in the system.

5. Epistemic Logic and Epistemology

Generally speaking, contemporary epistemology is organized around two major goals: (1) The long-standing goal of providing a definition of knowledge and simultaneously responding to the challenge of skepticism, and (2) The goal of modeling the dynamics of epistemic and doxastic states. The first of these goals has, for the most part, been a concern of philosophers who rely on thought experiments, traditional conceptual analysis or intuitions-based methods of various kinds. By contrast, philosophers working with epistemic logic have pursued the second goal. The apparent divergence of both enterprises can be reconciled to some extent once one recognizes that both goals relate to a third, and possibly more general problem, namely (3) the problem of understanding the rationality of inquiry. This problem is of equal importance to both epistemic logicians and traditional epistemologists. Dynamical treatments of epistemic logic and insights into the logic of inquiry from epistemic logicians speak directly to this third, unifying goal. In recent decades, it is precisely the dynamical model of knowledge and inquiry that has concerned philosophically-inclined epistemic logicians. For a systematic treatment of the interplay between epistemology and epistemic logic we refer to Hendricks and Symons 2006.


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