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Informal Logic

First published Mon Nov 25, 1996; substantive revision Wed Mar 21, 2007

Informal logic is the attempt to develop a logic to assess, analyse and improve ordinary language (or "everyday") reasoning. It intersects with attempts to understand such reasoning from the point of view of philosophy, formal logic, cognitive psychology, and a range of other disciplines. Most of the work in informal logic focuses on the reasoning and argument (in the premise-conclusion sense) one finds in personal exchange, advertising, political debate, legal argument, and the social commentary that characterizes newspapers, television, the World Wide Web and other forms of mass media.

The development of informal logic is tied to educational goals: by the desire to develop ways of analysing ordinary reasoning which can inform general education. To this extent, the goals of informal logic intersect with those of the Critical Thinking Movement, which aims to inform and improve public reasoning, discussion and debate by promoting models of education which emphasize critical inquiry.

Informal logic is sometimes presented as a theoretical alternative to formal logic. This kind of characterization may reflect early battles in philosophy departments which debated, sometimes with acrimony, whether informal logic should be considered "real" logic. Today, informal logic enjoys a more conciliatory relationship with formal logic. Its attempt to understand informal reasoning is usually (but not always) couched in natural language, but research in informal logic sometimes employs formal methods and it remains an open question whether the accounts of argument in which informal logic specializes can in principle be formalized.

Some recent work in computational modelling attempts to implement informal logic models of natural-language reasoning. It suggests that defeasible (non-monotonic) logic, probability theory and other non-classical formal frameworks may be well suited to this task.

1. History

Informal logic is a recent discipline. It has some precedents in those nineteenth century works on Logic and Rhetoric which aim to raise general standards of reasoning through public education (see, e.g., Whatley [1830], [1844]). But informal logic is a child of the 1960s. It is ultimately rooted in its social and political movements, which were characterized by a call for an education more "relevant" to the issues of the day.

In logic, and especially the teaching of logic, this fostered the attempt to replace the artificial examples of good and bad argument that tended to characterize earlier logic texts (e.g., Copi [1957]) with instances of reasoning, argument and debate taken from newspapers, the mass media, advertisements and political campaigns (Kahane [1971] is a good example of this trend).

One significant impetus in the development of the informal logic and critical thinking movements was a 1980 California State University Executive Order that required that post secondary education include formal instruction in critical thinking. According to the order: "Instruction in critical thinking is to be designed to achieve an understanding of the relationship of language to logic, which should lead to the ability to analyze, criticize, and advocate ideas, to reason inductively and deductively and to reach factual or judgmental conclusions based on sound inferences drawn from unambiguous statements of knowledge or belief" (Dumke [1980], Executive Order 338).

In keeping with educational interests of this sort, the development of informal logic has been intertwined with pedagogical discussions of the ways in which students can best be taught to reason. These discussions are reflected in hundreds (perhaps thousands) of textbooks which have been used to teach informal logic to university and college students in Canada, the United States, the United Kingdom, and a constantly growing number of other countries.

The texts currently in use adopt a great variety of (sometimes conflicting) theoretical approaches. In some cases they are notable for their theoretical as well as their pedagogical innovations. Currently popular texts include Woods, Irvine and Walton [2004], Govier [2006], Groarke & Tindale [2004], Fisher [2001], Ruggiero [2003], Browne & Keeley [2003], and Richard & Elder [2002].

The theoretical interests that motivate informal logic are anticipated in Hamblin's Fallacies (Hamblin [1970]) and Toulmin's The Uses of Argument (Toulmin [1964]), but the discipline itself originated in North America in the 1970s. In many ways the work of Johnson and Blair led the way. Their Logical Self-Defense (Johnson and Blair [1977]) was an early attempt to teach the logic of informal reasoning, and their Informal Logic Newsletter (now the journal Informal Logic) established the discipline as a field for discussion, development and research.

Two signs of informal logic's development are the progress of the journal Informal Logic, which published its 25th volume in 2005, and the 2003 conference, "Informal Logic @ 25," which marked the 25th anniversary of the "First International Symposium on Informal Logic." The scholarly journals which have played a significant role in the rise of informal logic include Argumentation, Philosophy and Rhetoric, Argumentation and Advocacy (formerly the Journal of the American Forensic Association) and Teaching Philosophy. ProtoSociology published an important related volume on "Reasoning and Argumentation" in 1999.

Informal Logic is more than a quarter of a century old, but it can still be described as a discipline in its formative stages of development. One can point to a well recognized body of literature that informs discussions in the field, but there is no predominant approach that characterizes textbooks or the research literature. Instead, contributions to informal logic are frequently characterized by contrary assumptions about the goals and methods of informal logic; about the usefulness of fallacies and formal logic as a way to conceptualize ordinary argument; about the proper understanding of the relationship between inductive and "conductive" arguments (which offer a number of independent non-conclusive premises for a conclusion); about the usefulness of diagramming techniques; and about the appropriate role of theories of communication, and dialectical and dialogical considerations, in assessing arguments.

In a way that complicates the situation further, research in informal logic increasingly incorporates the approaches to argumentation found in cognate disciplines and fields like Speech Communication, Rhetoric, Linguistics, Artificial Intelligence, Cognitive Psychology and Computational Modelling. Looked at from this perspective, informal logic as a discipline is an integral part of a much broader multi-disciplinary attempt to develop an "argumentation theory" that can account for informal reasoning.

Informal logic's ties to argumentation theory broadly understood have been highlighted and nurtured in conferences and publications, most notably in six multi-disciplinary Amsterdam conferences (which have occurred at regular four-year intervals since 1986, coinciding with the last stages of the World Cup of soccer on each occasion: 1986, 1990, 1994, 1998, 2002, 2006). All were hosted by the International Society for the Study of Argumentation ("ISSA"). Other important initiatives include the First and Second Tokyo Conferences on Argumentation, held in 2000 and 2004, and the "Symposium on Argument and Computation" held in Perthshire, Scotland in 2000.

2. Deductivism and Beyond

The premises of a valid deductive argument guarantee the truth of the conclusion. If the premises are true, the conclusion cannot be false. Informal logic tends to categorize arguments in terms of a consequent distinction between "deductive" and "inductive" arguments (a distinction that Govier [1987] aptly calls "the great divide"). In contrast with valid deductive arguments, the premises of a good inductive argument render a conclusion only probable, leaving it possible that the premises are true and the conclusion false (identifying poor arguments as deductive or inductive is inherently problematic: perhaps it can best be said that poor deductive and inductive arguments are arguments that in some way approximate good deductive and inductive forms).

This does not mean that the conclusion of a deductive argument is necessarily or certainly true, as is often suggested. The conclusion of a deductive argument is certain only in circumstances in which the premises are certain. In informal reasoning, in which premises are usually probable or plausible rather than certain, deductive arguments often yield probable or plausible conclusions (as in: "Global warming is inevitable, and there is no point trying to prevent anything inevitable so there is no point trying to prevent global warming.") This means that one cannot render the deductive/inductive distinction as a simple distinction between arguments which have certain and probable conclusions.

Once one eliminates this confusion, the claim that many natural language arguments are deductive is relatively uncontroversial, but some informal logicians go even further. "Deductivism" is the view that all informal arguments should be understood as deductive arguments. Because they are not explicitly so, deductivism in informal logic manifests itself as "reconstructive deductivism," a theoretical approach which reconstructs natural language arguments in deductive forms. In cases where such arguments are not explicitly deductive, this is done by treating their assumptions as implicit premises which render the inference deductive.

Even paradigm cases of inductive generalization can in this way be interpreted as deductive arguments. The inductive generalization "This apple from the bowl was excellent, so all the apples in the bowl are excellent" can, for example, be treated as a deductive argument by assigning it the implicit premise "All the apples in the bowl are like this apple." Because every argument depends on an assumption of the form "If these premises are true, the conclusion is true," there is an "associated conditional" which can be added to any argument for the purposes of deductivist reconstruction.

Those who propound the deductivist stance argue that it eliminates the need to make the sometimes difficult decision whether a particular argument should be classified as deductive or inductive, that it greatly simplifies the structure of informal logic, and that it is useful to reconstruct the assumptions it recognizes as implicit premises (see Groarke [1999]). Those who argue against deductivism maintain that it artificially forces informal arguments to adhere to an overly restrictive model of argument that cannot capture the richness of ordinary reasoning (see Johnson [2000] and Godden [2004]).

Deductivists want a theory of argument that reduces the deductive/inductive distinction so that it assumes only one kind of argument. Most informal logicians (in part because they react against the deductive models in formal logic) adopt a model of argument which countenances deductive and inductive arguments. Some argue for a basic typology of argument which countenances other kinds of argument that need to be distinguished from inductive genralizations: most frequently, "conductive" and "abductive" arguments.

Conductive arguments provide an accumulation of non-decisive reasons in favour of a conclusion. Different pieces of evidence may each suggest (but not conclusively prove) that a defendant charged with murder is guilty. Taken summatively (the witness said he pulled the trigger, the ballistics report shows that the bullet came from a gun he owned, he was overheard saying he would "get" the victim, etc.) these different reasons may provide a strong (but not conclusive) conductive argument for this conclusion.

Abductive arguments are "inferences to the best explanation." They typically recognize some facts, point out that it is entailed by a certain hypothesis, and conclude that the hypothesis is true. Taken at face value, abductive arguments seem to be instances of the fallacy "affirming the consequence," but they still play a central role in medical, scientific and legal reasoning (see Walton [2004]).

3. Fallacy Theory

Early work in informal logic does not favour a systematic attempt to assess the strength and properties of good deductive, inductive, conductive, etc. arguments. Instead, it favours fallacies as a tool in the analysis of informal reasoning. According to traditional accounts, a fallacy is a pattern of poor reasoning which appears to be (and in this sense mimics) a pattern of good reasoning (see Hansen [2002]). Such accounts are problematic, especially because it is difficult to identify when poor reasoning "appears" to be good. What "appears good" to one person may not appear so to another. In assessing ordinary arguments, most contemporary commentators avoid such issues by understanding fallacies more simply, as common patterns of poor reasoning which can usefully be identified in the evaluation of informal reasoning.

In its treatment of fallacies, informal logic has revived a tradition which can be traced to Aristotle. In the history of logic and philosophy, the significance of the fallacy tradition is reflected in the writings of figures as important as Locke, Whately, and Mill. Today, this tradition manifests itself in textbooks and websites which attempt to teach good informal reasoning by teaching students how to detect the standard fallacies.

Theoretical discussions of fallacies have failed to produce an agreed upon taxonomy of fallacies, but the set of fallacies discussed in informal logic contexts typically includes formal fallacies like affirming the consequent and denying the antecedent; and informal fallacies like ad hominem ("against the person"), slippery slope, "ad bacculum" ("appeal to force"), "ad misericordiam" ("appeal to pity"), "hasty generalization," and "two wrongs" (from "two wrongs make a right"). Some textbook authors use nomenclature designed to highlight the properties of particular kinds of fallacious arguments ("misleading vividness" designates vivid anecdotal evidence used as the basis of hasty generalizations, and so on.)

In the research literature, Woods and Walton have discussed the definition, analysis and assessment of a variety of fallacies in a series of articles and books, first as co-authors and then individually (see, e.g., Woods and Walton [1989]; Walton [1989]; Woods [1995]; Walton [1992; Walton [2000]). In a major contribution to argumentation theory, Van Eemeren and Grootendorst [1992] proposed a "pragma-dialectical" theory of fallacies which analyses fallacies as violations of the rules of critical discussion (discussion which aims to critically resolve a difference of opinion). A good representative collection of classical and contemporary essays on the fallacies is found in Hansen and Pinto [1995].

Some research in informal logic continues to focus on fallacies, and on the appropriate understanding of particular fallacies, but the field has evolved in different directions which place less emphasis on this kind of research. In some cases this has been because work on fallacies has led the way to other kinds of concerns. Informal logicians influenced by communication theory have, for example, construed fallacies as deviations from the implicit rules that govern various kinds of dialogical exchange, an approach which has ultimately made the study of these implicit rules, not fallacies, the basis of their account of argument.

In other contexts, fallacy theory has been criticized both because traditional fallacies are imprecise tools for understanding argument, and because a focus on them inevitably emphasizes poor reasoning rather than good argument. Hitchcock ([1995], 324) has suggested that the claim that we should teach good reasoning by fallacies is "like saying that the best way to teach somebody to play tennis without making the common mistakes … is to demonstrate these faults in action and get him to label and respond to them."

The problems with fallacy theory have been compounded by research which has identified many instances of traditional fallacies which appear to be reasonable patterns of interence in day to day contexts of argument. In such discussions, commentators point to examples like the following:

  1. Martin Luther King Jr., influenced by Gandhi, argued that we can justifiably break laws in a democratic country if our goal is change which has been unjustly obstructed. Such arguments play a central role in the American civil rights movement. They are not obviously fallacious, though they are a case of "two wrongs make a right," suggesting, as they do, that we can justifiably do something wrong (break a law) if we are responding to another wrong (i.e. some law, decision or policy that unjustly obstructs change).
  2. The argument that "The attempt to use military might to put an end to terrorism is wrong because it will take us down a slippery slope that will end in improper interference in the affairs of independent states" cannot be dismissed as a bad argument simply by saying that it is an instance of the fallacy slippery slope. If such a slippery slope is plausible, then the argument has some merit.
  3. The argument "No one with a history of heart disease should take up running, for running is a strenuous form of exercise, and no one with a history of heart disease should engage in strenuous exercise" is, like many informal arguments, deductively valid. In such cases, it is impossible for the conclusion of the argument to be false if the premises are true. Sometimes this relationship is described by saying that the premises of the argument already contain the conclusion; but this suggests that all deductive arguments commit the fallacy begging the question, which is usually said to occur when an argument assumes what it attempts to prove.
  4. The argument that we should not listen to the metaphysical arguments of someone who has accosted us, on the grounds that he is psychotically disturbed and doesn't know what he is taking about, is an instance of ad hominem, but it is not fallacious. Assuming these premises are true, this is eminently reasonable practical advice.

In the wake of examples of this sort, attempts to retain fallacies as the focus of informal logic have, at the very least, been forced to note that there are in which arguments have the form of traditional fallacies, but cannot be rejected as fallacious.

Most informal logicians still maintain that some fallacies (such as equivocation and false dilemma) merit pedagogical and theoretical attention. At the same time, the problems with fallacy theory have convinced many that theories of informal logic should focus, not on fallacies, but on general criteria for good reasoning (premise acceptability and relevance, etc.). The latter is often manifest in the study of forms of good argument (usually termed "argument schema") which set standards for particular kinds of good reasoning.

Grennan [1997]has proposed an approach to informal reasoning which proposes logical adequacy and pragmatic adequacy as the key criteria for judging and evaluating everyday inferences. He attempts to build an account of informal logic that extends beyond fallacies and deductive forms of reasoning by identifying good patterns of reasoning used in successful everyday contexts. Groarke & Tindale [2003] attempt to use traditional fallacies as a way to define good argument schema by treating ad hominem, guilt by association, appeals to ignorance, two wrongs reasoning, etc. as inherently good arguments — and by treating fallacious instances of them as deviations from an (essentially good) form.

Other authors do not go this far, but most approaches to informal logic have placed less emphasis on the traditional fallacies, and more emphasis on the identification of good appeals to authority, good arguments by analogy, on other argument schema, and on the construction of good arguments.

4. Rhetoric

Informal logic's attempt to identify general criteria for good reasoning, and its attempt to define positive argument schema that specify particular forms of good reasoning, can in some ways be compared to the approach to argument implicit in classical formal logic. The latter emphasizes general criteria for good argument (validity, soundness) and deductive argument schema which are usually encapsulated in rules of inference like modus ponens ("Affirming the Antecedent"), double negation, modus tollens ("Denying the Consequent"), etc.

The comparison between formal and informal logic is particularly apt when one considers non-fallacy approaches to ordinary reasoning, though there are ways in which even these approaches set an agenda different from that of classical formal logic. Because the goal of informal is an understanding of the dynamics of ordinary argument, informal logicians are interested in any aspects of it that contribute to its success (measured in terms of true, plausible or persuasive conclusions). In many cases, this has meant that informal logicians emphasize aspects of argument that have not traditionally been recognized by classical logic.

Classical logic understands a good argument as a "sound" argument: as a valid argument with true premises. This is a conception of good argument which can be applied to many instances of ordinary argument. Informal logicians have debated the extent to which everyday arguments can be understood as deductive arguments, but even if one ignores this issue, there are problems with the notion that good arguments are arguments which have true premises. Truth is a notion which seems ill suited to many informal contexts, which are characterized by hypothetical and uncertain beliefs, by deep disagreements about what is true and false, by ethical and aesthetic claims which are not easily categorized as true or false, and by variable contexts in which particular assumptions may be accepted, rejected or reversed.

Rhetoric has traditionally paid more attention to this aspect of argument than logic, recognizing that an arguer who hopes to persuade an audience of a conclusion must recognize and respect the attitudes of the audience he or she addresses. Even if premises are true, they will not convince an audience who (wrong headedly) rejects them. This is a tremendously important aspect of ordinary reasoning and debate, where successful arguers pick premises that match the pathos of their audience.

Because the goal of ordinary argument is persuasion, these aspects of argument must play a crucial role in any attempt to understand it. Tindale [1999, 2004] has developed an approach to informal logic which therefore borrows from traditional rhetoric, considering and evaluating arguments from this point of view. Such an approach emphasizes the three components of persuasive argument proposed in Aristotelean rhetoric: pathos (the convictions of the audience to whom an argument is addressed), logos (the logic of the argument), and ethos (the character of the arguer).

One aspect of this tripartite conception which has been acknowledged but remains unexplored is the role that character (ethos) plays in determining whether an argument is convincing. From this point of view, one of the goals of argument must be a style of argument which convinces an audience that one is credible and trustworthy. It is possible that this criterion for convincing argument may to some extent bridge the traditional gap between logic and argument, for arguers who indulge in frequent insult, exaggeration and other questionable tactics may be likely to undermine their own credibility.

The influence of rhetoric on the development of argumentation theory is also seen in recent discussions of "strategic maneouvring," understood as the attempt to rhetorically influence the outcome of a dispute (see Tindale [2004], ch. 1; and Eemeren & Houtlosser [2002]). In discussions of strategic maneouvring, rhetorical considerations are brought to bear in three ways: (i) through topical potential (the way the topic is framed and presented); (ii) through audience demands (creating communion with the audience); and (iii) through presentational devices (the best figure or scheme to achieve one's ends).

5. Dialectics

Another aspect of ordinary argument which extends the scope of informal logic beyond that of classical logic is dialectical. Traditionally, dialectics understands argument as a kind of exchange — the exchange of propositions (theses) and counter-propositions. This approach understands argument in the broader context of debate and dispute. In contemporary argumentation theory, the most influential school of dialectics is "pragma-dialectics," sometimes known as "the Amsterdam School." It understands argumentation as a means of resolving a difference of opinion.

One of the outcomes of work in Dialectics has been a better understanding of the distinction between different kinds of "dialogue" in which reasoning may be embedded. This is a key component of ordinary exchange because different argumentative norms and expectations are tied to contexts of negotiation, debate, critical discussion, persuasion, inquiry, command, and so on. Dialogue systems attempt to provide models for and rules to guide rational discourse in these types of interactive reasoning.

Such an approach shows that rationality (and good reasoning) has a broader range of application than persuasion or argument narrowly conceived. And that the study of its application can play an important role in understanding question and response reasoning, and command and response reasoning. The former is highly relevant to the analysis of fallacies such as the loaded question fallacy (see Walton 1997).

Question and response reasoning is, it turns out, highly relevant to persuasive dialogue and to the analysis of fallacies such as the loaded question fallacy.

I think it very important to mention work concerning questions, and maybe concerning commands and promises.The point is that critical thinking and informal logic in some forms take account of non-argumentative but good reasoning.

Within informal logic, Johnson [2000] has argued that dialectical obligations are a key component of ordinary argument. They encompass an arguer's obligation to respond to (and anticipate) objections that might be raised by others engaged in the dispute in which the arguer participates. To emphasize this point, Johnson distinguishes between the "illative" core of an argument and its "dialectical" tier. The illative core is the set of premises offered in support of the conclusion, the dialectical tier consists of alternative points of view, likely objections to the conclusion and the premises and whatever assumptions characterize debate about the conclusion. According to Johnson, traditional logic has focused too much on the illative core, though a rational arguer must pay as much attention to its dialectical tier.

In his account, Johnson claims that all genuine arguments are dialectical and must discharge dialectical obligations. On this account, a simple giving of reasons for some conclusion can be classified only as a "proto-argument." Other authors (e.g., Govier [1999] and Hitchcock [2003]) have taken issue with the extent of the emphasis this places on dialectical obligations, though they agree that some accounting of the dialectical aspects of argument must play a role in the attempt to establish a broad understanding of informal argument, and must, therefore, be included within informal logic.

6. The Components of Informal Logic

As a field of study and research, informal logic now embraces a complex attempt to understand the nature and assessment of informal arguments. Though any list of informal logic issues cannot be definitive, the present state of the discipline suggests that a comprehensive theory of informal logic will have to include:

  1. an explanation of the rules of communication which argumentative exchange depends upon;
  2. a distinction between different kinds of dialogue in which argument may occur, and the ways in which they determine appropriate and inappropriate moves in argument (e.g. the difference between scientific discussion and the negotiation that characterizes collective bargaining);
  3. an account of logical consequence, which explains when it can be said (and what it means to say) that one sentence is a logical consequence of another;
  4. general criteria for good argument, which may be associated with a theory of logical consequence, and which specify general criteria for deductive, inductive, and conductive arguments;
  5. definitions of positive argument schema which define good patterns of reasoning (reasonable appeals to authority, reasonable attacks against the person; etc.);
  6. some theoretical account of fallacies and the role they can (and cannot) play in understanding and assessing informal arguments;
  7. an account of the role that audience (pathos) and ethos and other rhetorical notions should play in analysing and assessing argument;
  8. an explanation of the dialectical obligations that attach to arguments in particular kinds of contexts.

The issues and debates which now characterize research in informal logic can be understood in terms of these components of a theory of argument. Some of them have been the focus of extensive discussion. Others have received less attention. Often these discussions are informed by case studies of particular examples of informal reasoning (presidential debates, advertising campaigns, political controversies, and so on). Some authors emphasize the dialectical aspects of argument, others emphasize traditional logical components, and others emphasize rhetorical concerns.

7. Extending "Argument"

In keeping with informal logic's willingness to extend the study of argument, one feature of current work in informal logic is an attempt to broaden the traditonal definition of argument. One significant move in this direction is Gilbert [1997], which propounds a theory of "coalescent argument." According to his account, arguments encapsulate clusters of attitudes, beliefs, feelings and intuitions which characterize an arguer. Argumentative exchange aims to identify the points of agreement that characterize different (and possibly opposed) arguers, thereby bringing about the "coalescence" of their points of view.

The coalescence Gilbert makes the goal of argument can be brought about, not only by reasons in the traditional sense, but also by emotional or physical means (and sometimes more effectively in this way). Gilbert therefore countenances forms of argument that are essentially emotional, intuitive ("kisceral") and physical ("visceral") rather than logical. According to his account, a hug, a forlorn look, or tears may count as argument.

Gilbert's many examples convincingly show that actions of this sort can play a decisive role convincing an audience of a particular conclusion. It is less clear that this requires the radical re-conception of argument his analysis proposes. Instead of moving in this direction, one might account for many of the moves that he classifies as arguments as non-verbal means of communicating propositions which function as premises in a relatively standard sense.

When a student (to take one of Gilbert's examples) cries in a professor's office in order to convey the importance he attaches to an A grade in a course, this might be understood as a non-verbal way of communicating the enthymematic argument "I will be terribly upset if I do not receive an A in this course; you should act in a way that doesn't leave me terribly upset; so you should give me an A grade." While it must be granted that this must be classified as an "emotional argument," it is not clear that it needs to be assessed by fundamentally different criteria than those that apply to other arguments. One might instead proceed in the standard way, by judging whether the premises are plausible or not, and whether they entail or make probable the conclusion.

Whatever criteria for assessment one applies, Gilbert's examples show that realms of argument exist outside the verbal (typically written) arguments that were the initial focus of studies in informal logic. One finds another attempt to recognize such arguments is studies of "visual argument." In a manner that might be compared to the attempt, by some authors, to expand formal logic to allow for non-verbal visual deductions (see Barwise and Etchemendy [1998]), they analyze and assess visual persuasion in a manner similar to the way in which informal logic understands and assesses verbal arguments (see Birdsell and Groarke [1996, 2007], Collins and Schmid [1999], Lunsford, Ruszkiewicz and Walters [2001], Groarke [2002], Shelley [2003]).

Such studies suggest that many images function as a means of conveying premises and conclusions which can be understood and evaluated as visual arguments. A growing interest in such images is motivated by the prevalence of visual images in contemporary advertising, art, design, television, the world wide web, political commentary, and so on. Looked at from this point of view, the study of visual arguments is motivated by the same desire that has motivated the development of informal logic: i.e. the desire to have some means for understanding and assessing the informal argument which surrounds us.

Theoretical debates about visual arguments revolve around the question whether and to what extent it is possible to understand visual statements in a manner that treats them as a visual analogue of verbal propositions. While many examples seem to show that some visuals can be usefully understood and analyzed as arguments, a more detailed account of visual argument must be built upon a more detailed account of visual meaning and visual propositions.

Though it does not involve a redefinition of argument, a third attempt to extend the reach of informal logic is found in computational modeling. Its study of interactions between agents in multi-agent systems and its attempt to mimic or assist human reasoning initiatives is now informed by informal logic models of argument. Computational applications include systems that reason about medical decisions, the law, chemical properties and complex systems (see, e.g., Carbogim et al. [2000]; Prakken and Vreeswijk [2001];Reed [1997]; Reed and Long [1998]; Reed and Walton [2001]). Verheij [1999] has developed systems of automated argument assistance which function as computational aids that can assist in the generation of an argument (see his Automated Argument Assistance web site in Other Internet Resources below). Reed and Norman [2003] have published a pioneering collection of essays which attempt to look at "argument machines" and how they can be conceptualized and developed.

Insofar as informal logic remains an attempt to develop a logic that can be used in everyday reasoning, it and computational modelling will remain separate theoretical endeavours. That said, both depend on an understanding of the way that informal reasoning works and should be assessed. This makes collaboration fruitful. In the long run, it may be the formal modelling this inspires which may reestablish stronger links between formal and informal logic (links that will depend on more sophisticated logics than classical logic, which are more sensitive to the different facets of ordinary reasoning). The results may foster the development of informal logic within a more integrated logic (or argumentation theory) that recognizes the differences between formal and informal logic, but recognizes an overarching model of reasoning that can explain both endeavours.

8. New Horizons: Assessing Informal Logic

As informal logic has matured as a discipline, sceptics have raised questions about the fundamental assumptions it depends on. Some commentators have asked what empirical evidence there is to show that the teaching of informal logic actually improves reasoning skills. In answer to this question, others have begun to empirically study the effects of teaching informal logic, and the effects that accrue from competing approaches to the discipline is most effective in this context. Empirical studies of this sort have been hampered by questions raised about the adequacy of the tests standardly used to measure informal reasoning skills, but are currently underway (see Sobocan & Groarke [2007] for a collection of articles on this topic).

The assumptions of informal logic are being emprically tested in another way by commentators who study argument "corpora" — very large collections of argument drawn from natural language discourse. Jorgenson, Kock and Rorbech [1991] studied a series of 37 one-hour televised debates from Danish public TV which featured well-known public figures arguing for and against current policy proposal. A representative audience of 100 voters voted before and after the debate, in an attempt to statistically establish what moves and properties are likely to win votes in a representative audience. These conclusions were then compared with commonly held notions about "proper" or "valid" argumentation. Other studies of much larger corpora (very large data bases, randomly selected written texts, whole libraries, etc.) are in the works.

9. Example: Ad Hominem

As informal logic emphasizes the analysis and assessment of real arguments, the issues and approaches it encompasses can best be illustrated with examples. Consider, as a first instance, a comment taken from a Danish television debate over the question whether the Danish church should be separate from the Danish state (Jorgensen [1995], 369). At one point in this debate, the debater arguing against the separation of church and state declares to the audience that "My opponent wants to sever the Danish church from the state for his own personal sake. His motion is an attempt to take over the church and further his ecumenical theology by his usual mafia methods."

We can plausibly understand this remark as a simple argument that contains one premise and an implicit (sometimes called a "missing" or "hidden") conclusion. The premise (P) is the claim that "My opponent wishes to sever the Danish church from the state for the sake of his personal interests (in order to take it over and further his ecumenical theology by his usual mafia methods)." The implied conclusion (C) is the implicit claim that "We should (therefore) reject his motion to separate the Danish church and state."

Looked at from the point of view of the fallacy approach to informal logic, this is a classic case of ad hominem. Kahane [1995, 65], for example, describes ad hominem as a fallacy that occurs when an arguer is guilty "of attacking his opponent rather than his opponent's evidence and arguments." In this case, the debater in question attacks the motivation and the character of the person promoting a separate Danish church instead of showing what is wrong with his evidence for the claim that this is a good idea. On these grounds, the proposed reasoning is fallacious.

Though dialogical approaches to argument assume a different theoretical structure than fallacy theory, they invite a very similar analysis of this example. According to Van Eemeren and Grootendorst [1992], an instance of ad hominem is a violation of the first rule for critical discussion, which maintains that "Parties [to a dispute] must not prevent each other from advancing standpoints or casting doubts on arguments." Different kinds of ad hominem (abusive, tu quoque, and circumstantial ad hominem) are different violations of this rule. In this case, it suffices to say that the debater's attack on his opponent can be seen as an illegitimate attempt to deny him his right to make a case for his position.

Other approaches to informal logic are characterized by a more sympathetic attitude to ad hominem arguments which accepts that criticisms of an arguer (as opposed to their position) can be appropriate. One may, for example, reasonably cast doubt on an arguer's reasoning by pointing out that the arguer lacks the requisite knowledge to make appropriate judgments in the area in question, or by pointing out that the arguer has a vested interest. Such appeals play an important role in ordinary language reasoning, which typically occurs in contexts in which time constraints make it impossible to analyse carefully all the arguments presented, forcing us to decide which ones we pay attention to, often by relying on an assessment of the arguer.

Though this approach to ad hominem (which does not reject ad hominem arguments outright) makes ad hominem a form of reasoning which is acceptable in principle, it does not save the example in question, for this is a case in which the ad hominem is not founded on a credible criticism of the arguer. Instead, it relies on little more than insult. At best, one could claim that it forwards a heavy-handed and unsubstantiated charge of vested interest against the debater who advocates the separation of the Danish church and state. This is a charge which is particularly inappropriate in a debate which is designed as an opportunity to discuss the merits and demerits of the separation (and not the character of the debaters).

Another approach to ad hominem arguments which allows for ad hominem reasoning analyzes them from a rhetorical point of view, understanding them in terms of Aristotle's suggestion that the ethos of a speaker plays a crucial role in determining whether an argument is persuasive or not. According to this account, an ad hominem argument may be an effective (and from a rhetorical point of view, acceptable) attack on the ethos of an arguer, but not in the case in question, for it is not a credible attack. Indeed, one might argue that the intemperate nature of this particular ad hominem undermines, not the ethos of the person attacked, but the ethos of the speaker who has presented it.

10. Example: A Visual Argument

An example which can illustrate how the techniques of informal logic apply to visual images is found in the glossy advertisement for vodka reproduced below (it is a concocted example but one which has close affinities to actual advertisements). Under the title "Just Add Vodka" it features a bottle of vodka pouring its contents onto a sleepy hamlet. The time of day (dusk), the lack of activity, and the isolated lights at the borders of the image suggest a humdrum hamlet where there is nothing to do. This inactivity is further highlighted by the sharp contrast between the hamlet and the bustling city scape that has sprung up where the vodka splashes to the ground below. Unlike the hamlet, the latter boasts skyscrapers, lights, nightclubs, restaurants and an exciting nightlife.

vodka print ad

Understood literally, the image in question makes no sense. Bottles of vodka are not so absurdly large, and do not pour their contents on to sleepy villages. If they did the result would not be a Manhattan-like street scape.

The image must, in view of such considerations, not be understood literally, but as a visual metaphor. In this case, the message is clearly one of transformation, the vodka acting as the catalyst for the change. The message of the advertisement might be summarized as a visual proposition which can be paraphrased as the claim that "Vodka can transform a sleepy life into one full of cosmopolitan excitement." In the context of argumentation, one might usefully express this proposition as the conditional "If you add vodka to your life, your sleepy life will be transformed into a life of cosmopolitan excitement." It is appropriate to understand the proposition argumentatively, for in the context of an advertisement, this conditional is being offered as a reason (premise) for the implicit conclusion that "You should add vodka to your life (i.e. you should purchase vodka)."

This interpretation of the images suggests that it forwards a visual argument which contains a premise and conclusion that can be paraphrased as follows:

Premise 1: If you add vodka to your life, your sleepy life will be transformed into a life of cosmopolitan excitement.

Implicit Premise 2: A life of cosmopolitan excitement is desirable.

Conclusion: You should add vodka to your life (i.e. purchase vodka).

Once this implicit argument is recognized, it can be assessed in the way that we assess verbal arguments. An analysis of the argument may also wish to analyse its use of colours, its aesthetic qualities, etc., but not in a way that denies this core argument.

This approach to the image allows a more critical assessment of the image because it provides a basis for a critical rejection of the argument it presents. To begin with, it is obvious that premise 1 can be questioned, for one might question the claim that the consumption of vodka produces an exciting cosmopolitan life (it may instead produce alcohol-related problems).

Having recognized premises 1 and 2 and the conclusion, we can go further, and recognize the argument as an instance of a variant of the affirming the consequent fallacy, though a normative variant which points out that "If X then Y" and "Y is desirable" do not allow one to conclude that "X is desirable." The unacceptability of such arguments might be demonstrated with many examples, as with the argument "If all sex acts were eliminated, we would eliminate sexually transmitted diseases. The elimination of sexually transmitted disease is desirable. Therefore the elimination of all sex acts is desirable."

Insofar as the visual argument in the image can be recognized in this way as an analogue of verbal arguments, it can be understood as a visual argument which can be assessed and evaluated using the concepts and the tools of informal logic. In this way, the evaluation of the meaning of an image can be made a matter of systematic examination and critical inquiry which goes beyond aesthetic assessment. One might, therefore, argue that the image is an impressive one from an aesthetic point of view, but still criticize it as an image which conveys a fallacious argument with questionable premises and debatable assumptions. It is in this way that analyses of visual argument allow informal logic to promote a more critical approach to visual as well as verbal argument.

11. Informal Logic and Philosophy

Philosophy and philosophers continue to play the defining role in the evolution of informal logic, though they have increasingly incorporated developments in cognate disciplines such as Communication Studies, Rhetoric and Artificial Intelligence. Within writings on informal logic, one may distinguish two distinct attitudes to philosophical considerations. On the one hand, the work of some commentators suggests that philosophy is the core element of informal logic. The paradigm example of such a view is found in Johnson [2000], who argues that a comprehensive account of argument must be built upon a philosophical account of rationality.

An alternative view suggests that informal logic's relationship to philosophy is more comparable to the relationship that exists between formal logic and the philosophy of logic. According to this view, informal logic may (at least in many instances) be developed independently of philosophical considerations. According to this approach, the development of the means to analyse and assess ordinary argument can take place independently of a consideration of many of the philosophical questions which might be raised about its ultimate justification and its philosophical implications (see Groarke [2001]). Such a view suggests that we should distinguish between informal logic and the philosophy of informal logic, separating the development of our understanding of day-to-day reasoning from the attempt to provide a philosophical account of it.

However one understands the role of philosophy within informal logic, informal logic has ties to a variety of other philosophical endeavours which extend beyond its immediate concerns. The natural connections between informal logic and epistemology are evident in Goldman [1999], who attempts to defend an account of knowledge and the acquisition of knowledge which situates knowledge within social interactions that take place within interpersonal exchange and knowledge institutions. This allows him to evaluate social practices in terms of their veritistic value (i.e., their tendency to produce states like knowledge, error and ignorance). In the process, his account devotes considerable attention to the practice of argumentation, and the constraints which make it a practice which is to be valued because it produces positive veritistic results. In doing so, he draws on work in informal logic and reflects its interest in both monological and dialogical argumentation, and in a broad understanding of argument that incorporates rhetorical and dialectical responsibilities.

In this and other ways, informal logic's attempt to model informal reasoning reflects, and has important implications for, philosophical concerns about the nature of rationality, the nature of the mind and its processes, the standards of good reasoning, the value of logic and rhetoric, and the social, political and epistemological role of reasoning and argument. In many ways, the discussion of informal logic's ties to philosophy of mind, ethics and epistemology, has just begun. A more extensive exploration of these ties is likely to be one significant aspect of research in informal logic in the future.


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Aristotle, General Topics: rhetoric | logic: classical | logical consequence