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Logic and Ontology

First published Mon Oct 4, 2004; substantive revision Wed Oct 13, 2004

A number of important philosophical problems are problems in the overlap of logic and ontology. Both logic and ontology are diverse fields within philosophy, and partly because of this there is not one single philosophical problem about the relation between logic and ontology. In this survey article we will first discuss what different philosophical projects are carried out under the headings of "logic" and "ontology" and then we will look at several areas where logic and ontology overlap.

1. Introduction

Both logic and ontology are important areas of philosophy covering large, diverse, and active research projects. These two areas overlap from time to time and problems or questions arise that concern both. This survey article is intended to discuss some of these areas of overlap. In particular, there is no single philosophical problem of the intersection of logic and ontology. This is partly so because the philosophical disciplines of logic and of ontology are themselves quite diverse and there is thus the possibility of many points of intersection. In the following we will first distinguish different philosophical projects that are covered under the terms ‘logic’ and ‘ontology’. We will then discuss a selection of problems that arise in the different areas of contact.

‘Logic’ and ‘ontology’ are big words in philosophy, and different philosophers have used them in different ways. Depending on what these philosophers mean by these words, and, of course, depending on the philosopher's views, sometimes there are striking claims to be found in the philosophical literature about their relationship. But when Hegel, for example, uses ‘logic’, or better ‘Logik’, he means something quite different than what is meant by the word in much of the contemporary philosophical scene. We will not be able to survey the history of the different conceptions of logic, or of ontology. Instead we will focus on the already very diverse debate in the more or less the 20th century English speaking philosophical tradition. Even with this restriction, ‘logic’ and ‘ontology’ are understood in different ways.

2. Logic

There are several quite different topics put under the heading of ‘logic’ in contemporary philosophy, and it is controversial how they relate to each other.

2.1. Different conceptions of logic

On the one hand, logic is the study of certain mathematical properties of artificial, formal languages. It is concerned with such languages as the first or second order predicate calculus, modal logics, the lambda calculus, categorial grammars, and so forth. The mathematical properties of these languages are studied in such subdisciplines of logic as proof theory or model theory. Much of the work done in this area these days is mathematically difficult, and it might not be immediately obvious why this is considered a part of philosophy. However, logic in this sense arose from within philosophy and the foundations of mathematics, and it is often seen as being of philosophical relevance, in particular in the philosophy of mathematics, and in its application to natural languages.

A second discipline, also called ‘logic’, deals with certain valid inferences and good reasoning based on them. It does not, however, cover good reasoning as a whole. That is the job of the theory of rationality. Rather it deals with inferences whose validity can be traced back to the formal features of the representations that are involved in that inference, be they linguistic, mental, or other representations. Some patterns of inference can be seen as valid by merely looking at the form of the representations that are involved in this inference. An inference is valid just in case the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion, or in other words that if the premises are true then the conclusion has to be true as well, or again in other words, if it can't be that the premises are true but the conclusion is false. An inference being formally valid can be understood as follows. In a system of representations, for example a language, it can be that some inferences are always valid as long as the representational or semantic features of certain parts of the representations are kept fixed, even if we abstract from or ignore the representational features of the other parts of the representations. So, for example, as long as we stick to English, and we keep the meanings of certain words like "some" and "all" fixed, certain patterns of inference, like some of Aristotle's syllogisms, are valid no matter what the meaning of the other words in the syllogism.[1] To call an inference formally valid is to assume that certain words have their meaning fixed, that we are within a fixed set of representations, and that we can ignore the meaning of the other words. The words that are kept fixed are the logical vocabulary, or logical constants, the others are the non-logical vocabulary. And when an inference is formally valid then the conclusion logically follows from the premises. This could be generalized for representations that are not linguistic, like graphic representations, though it would require a bit more work to do so. Logic is the study of such inferences, and certain related concepts and topics, like formal invalidity, proof, consistency, and so on. The central notion of logic in this sense is the notion of logical consequence. How this notion should be understood more precisely is presently widely debated, and a survey of these debates can be found in the entry on logical consequence.

A third conception of logic takes logic to be the study of special truths, or facts: the logical truths, or facts. In this sense logic could be understood as a science that aims to describe certain truths or facts, just as other sciences aim to describe other truths. The logical truths could be understood as the most general truths, ones that are contained in any other body of truths that any other science aims to describe. In this sense logic is different from biology, since it is more general, but it is also similar to biology in that it is a science that aims to capture a certain body of truths. This way of looking at logic is often associated with Frege.

This conception of logic can, however, be closely associated with the one that takes logic to be fundamentally about certain kinds of inferences and about logical consequence. A logical truth, on such an understanding, is simply one that is expressed by a representation which logically follows from no assumptions, i.e. which logically follows from an empty set of premises. Alternatively, a logical truth is one whose truth is guaranteed as long as the meaning of the logical constants is fixed, no matter what the meanings of the other parts in a representation are.

And there are other notions of ‘logic’ as well. One of them is historically prominent, but not very widely represented in the contemporary debate. We will briefly discuss it here nonetheless. According to this conception of logic, it is the study of the most general features of thoughts or judgments, or the form of thoughts or judgments. Logic thus understood will for example be concerned with the occurrence of subject and predicate structure that many judgments exhibit, and with other such general features of judgments. It will mostly be concerned with thoughts, and not directly with linguistic representations, though, of course, a proponent of this conception can claim that there is a very close connection between them. To talk about the form of a judgment will involve a subtle different notion of ‘form’ than to talk about the form of a linguistic representation. The form of a linguistic representation, basically, was what was left once we abstract from or ignore the representational features of everything except what we keep fixed, the logical constants. The form of a thought, on the other hand, is often understood as what is left over once we abstract from its content, that is, what it is about. We will briefly pursue the question below how these notions of form are related to each other. This conception of logic is associated with Kant. Kant distinguished different notions of logic (for example transcendental logic, general logic, etc.), but we won't be able to discuss these here. See the article on Kant for more.

One important philosophical aspect of logic, at least in the senses that deal with logical consequence and the forms of judgements, is its normativity. Logic seems to give us a guide how we ought to reason, and how we ought to draw inferences from one representation to another. But it is not at all clear what guide it gives us, and how we should understand more precisely what norms logic puts on our reasoning. For example, logic does not put us under the norm "If you believe A and you believe if A then B then you ought to believe B." After all, it might be that I should not believe A and if A then B in the first place. So, in particular I shouldn't believe B. A reductio ad absurdum is a form of argument that illustrates this. It can be the consequences of my beliefs that lead me to abandon them. Logic might tell us at least this much, though: whatever reason I have for believing A and if A then B, it is a reason to believe B. See (Harman 1986) for more on the role of logic in reasoning.

And, of course, logic does not tell us how we ought to reason or infer in all particular cases. Logic does not deal with the particular cases, but only with the most generally valid forms of reasoning or inference, ones that are valid no matter what one reasons about. In this sense logic is often seen to be topic neutral. It applies no matter what one is thinking or reasoning about. And this neutrality, or complete generality of logic, together with its normativity, is often put as "logic is about how we ought to think if we are to think at all" or "logic is the science of the laws that we ought to follow in our thinking no matter what we think about". There are well known philosophical puzzles about normativity, and these apply to logic as well if it is normative. One is why it is that thinkers are under such norms. After all, why can't I think the way I prefer to think, without there being some norm that governs my thinking, whether I like it or not? Why is there an "ought" that comes with thinking as such, even if I don't want to think that way? One idea to answer this is to employ the notion of a ‘constitutive aim of belief’, the idea that belief as such aims at something: the truth. If so then maybe one could argue that by having beliefs I am under the norm that I ought to have true ones. And if one holds that one of the crucial features of logically valid inferences is that they preserve truth then one could argue that the logical laws are norms that apply to those who have beliefs. See (Velleman 2000) for more on the aim of belief. The normativity of logic will not be central for our discussion to follow, but the topic neutrality and generality will be.[2]

Overall, we can thus distinguish four notions of logic:

There is, of course, a question how these different conceptions of logic relate to each other. The details of there relationship invite many hard questions, but we should briefly look at this nonetheless.

2.2. How the different conceptions of logic are related to each other

How (L1) and (L2) relate to each other is subject of controversy. One straightforward, though controversial view, is the following. For any given system of representations, like sentences in a natural language, there is one and only one set of logical constants. Thus there will be one formal language that best models what logically valid inferences there are among these natural representations. This formal language will have a logical vocabulary that captures the inferential properties of the logical constants, and that models all other relevant features of the natural system of representation with non-logical vocabulary. One especially important system of representations is our natural language. Thus (L1) is the study of formal languages of which one is distinguished, and this one distinguished language nicely represents the fixed and non-fixed features of our natural language, through its logical and non-logical vocabulary. And validity in that formal language, a technical notion defined in the appropriate way for that formal language, nicely models logical validity or logical consequence in our natural language system of representations. Or so this view of the relationship between (L1) and (L2) holds.

This view of the relationship between (L1) and (L2), however, assumes that there is one and only one set of logical constants for each system of representations. A contrary view holds that which expressions are treated as logical constants is a matter of choice, with different choices serving different purposes. If we fix, say, ‘believes’ and ‘knows’ then we can see that ‘x believes that p’ is implied by ‘x knows that p’ (given widely held views about knowledge and belief). This does not mean that ‘believes’ is a logical constant in an absolute sense. Given other interests, other expressions can be treated as logical. According to this conception, different formal languages will be useful in modeling the inferences that are formally valid given different set of ‘logical constants’ or expressions whose meaning is kept fixed.

This debate thus concerns whether there is one and only one set of logical constants for a system of representations, and if so, which ones are the logical ones. We will not get into this debate here, but there is quite a large literature on what logical constants are, and how logic can be demarcated. For a general discussion and further references, see for example (Engel 1991). Some of the classic papers in this debate include (Hacking 1979), who defends a proof-theoretic way of distinguishing logical constants from other expressions. The leading idea here is that logical constants are those whose meaning can be given by proof-theoretic introduction and elimination rules. On the other hand, (Mauthner 1946), (van Benthem 1986), (van Benthem 1989), and (Tarski 1986), defend semantic ways to mark that difference. The leading idea here is that logical notions are ‘permutation invariant’. Since logic is supposed to be completely general and neutral with respect to what the representations are about, it should not matter to logic if we switch around the objects that these representations are about. So, logical notions are those that are invariant under permutations of the domain. (van Benthem 1989) gives a general formulation to this idea. See the article on logical constants for more.

The relationship between (L2) and (L3) was briefly addressed above. They seem to be closely related because a logical truth can be understood as one the follows from an empty set of premises, and A being a logical consequence of B can be understood as it being a logical truth that if A then B. There are some questions to be ironed out about how this is supposed to go more precisely. How should we understand cases of logical consequence from infinitely many premises? Are logical truths all finitely statable? But for our purposes we can say that they are rather closely related.

The relationship between (L2) and (L4) on the other hand raises some questions. For one, of course, there is an issue about what it means to say that judgments have a form, and whether they do in the relevant sense. But one way in which this question could be understood directly ties it to (L2). If thoughts, and thus judgments, are realized by minds having a certain relation to mental representations, and if these representations are themselves structured like a language, with a "syntax" and a "semantics" (properly understood), then the form of a judgment could be understood just like the form of a sentence. Such a view of thoughts is commonly called the Language of Thought hypothesis, and if it is correct then in the language of thought there might be logical and non-logical vocabulary. The form of a judgment could be understood along the lines we understood the form of a linguistic representation when we talked about formally valid inferences. Thus the relationship between (L2) and (L4) is rather direct. On both conceptions of logic we deal with logical constants, the difference is that one deals with a system of mental representations, the other with a system of linguistic representations. Both, presumably, would deal with corresponding sets of logical constants. Even though mental and linguistic representations form different sets of representations, since they are closely connected with each other, for every logical constant in one of these sets of representations there will be another one of the corresponding syntactic type and with the same content, or at least a corresponding inferential role.

But this conception of their relationship assumes that the "general features of judgments" or "forms of judgment" which (L4) is concerned with deal with something like the logical constants in the language of thought. Here the judgment as a mental act is assumed to operate on a mental representation that itself has syntactic structure. And the form of the judgment was understood as the form of the representation that represents the content of the judgment, whereby form of the representation was understood along the lines of (L2), involving logical constants. But what if we can't understand "form of judgment" or "form of thought" that way? One way this could fail is if the language of thought hypothesis itself fails, and if mental states do not involve representations that have something like a syntactic form. The question then becomes, first how should we understand ‘form of judgement’ more precisely, and secondly, how does logic, as the discipline concerned with forms of judgments in the sense of (L4), relate to (L2)?

One way to answer the first question is to understand "form of judgment" as not being concerned with the representation that might be involved in a judgment, but rather with the content of the judgment, i.e. with what the judgment is representing to be the case. Contents of judgments can be seen as propositions, and these can be understood as entities that are structured, for example Russellian propositions. Such propositions are ordered sets whose members are objects and properties. How such a conception of (L4) relates to (L2) will in part depend how one thinks of the logical constants in Russellian propositions. If they are higher order properties or functions that are members of these propositions alongside other objects and properties then presumably the logical constants have content. But this seems to be in conflict with and understanding of (L4) as being concerned with the form that is left once we abstract from all content. If would seem that on such an understanding of (L4) one can't closely associate ‘form of judgment’, understood as what's left once we abstract from all content of the judgment, with logical constants if the latter have content.

Another way to understand "form" as being concerned with what the judgment is about, rather than the judgment itself, is to think of what it is about, the world, itself as having a form. In this sense we associate "form" neither with the representation that is involved in the judgment, nor with the proposition which is its content, but rather with the world that is judged about. On such a conception the world itself has a form or basic structure. (L4) would be concerned with this structure. How (L4) relates to (L2) is then a somewhat tricky question. One way, again, could be that the logical constants that (L2) is concerned with correspond to the structure of what a representation in which they occur is about, but don't contribute to the content of that representation. This again seems incompatible with the logical constants themselves having content. So, whether one associates from of judgment with the ‘syntactic’ structure a representation that is involved in the judgment, or with the content of that representation, or with the structure of what the representation is about, the relationship between (L4) and (L2) will in part depend on whether one thinks the logical constants themselves contribute to content. If they do, and if form is contrasted with content, then a close association seems impossible. If the logical constants don't have content, then if might be possible.

Finally, the relationship between (L1) and (L4) either comes down to the same as that between (L1) and (L2), if we understand ‘form of thought’ analogous to ‘form of representation’. If not, then it will again depend on how (L4) is understood more precisely.

Thus there are many ways in which (L1), (L2), (L3), and (L4) are connected, and many in which they are quite different.

3. Ontology

3.1. Different conceptions of ontology

As a first approximation, ontology is the study of what there is. Many classical philosophical problems are problems in ontology, like the question whether or not there is a god, or the problem of the existence of universals. These are all problems in ontology in the sense that they deal with whether or not a certain thing, or more broadly entity, exists. But ontology is usually also taken to encompass problems about the most general features and relations of the entities which do exist. There are also a number of classic philosophical problems that are problems in ontology understood this way. For example the problem how a universal relates to a particular that has it (assuming there are universals and particulars), or the problem how an event like John eating a cookie relate to the particulars John and the cookie, and the relation of eating, assuming there are events, particulars and relations. These kinds of problems quickly turn into metaphysics more generally, which is the philosophical discipline that encompasses ontology as one of its parts. The borders here are a little fussy. But we have at least two parts to the overall philosophical project of ontology: first, say what there is, what exists, what the stuff is reality is made out off, secondly, say what the most general features and relations of these things are.

This way of looking at ontology comes with two sets of problems which leads to the philosophical discipline of ontology being more complex than just answering the above questions. The first set of problems is that it isn't clear how to approach answering these questions. This leads to the debate about ontological commitment. The second set of problems is that it isn't so clear what these questions really are. This leads to the philosophical debate about meta-ontology. Lets look at them in turn.

One of the troubles with ontology is that it not only isn't clear what there is, it also isn't so clear how to settle questions about what there is, at least not for the kinds of things that have traditionally been of special interest to philosophers: numbers, properties, god, etc. Ontology is thus a philosophical discipline that encompasses besides the study of what there is and the study of the general features of what there is also the study of what is involved in settling questions about what there is in general, especially for the philosophically tricky cases. How we can find out what there is isn't an easy question to answer. It seems simple enough for regular objects that we can perceive with our eyes, like my house keys, but how should we decide it for such things as, say, numbers or properties? One first step to making progress on this question is to see if what we believe already rationally settles this question. That is to say, given that we have certain beliefs, do these beliefs already bring with them a rational commitment to an answer to such questions as ‘Are there numbers?’ If our beliefs bring with them a rational commitment to an answer to an ontological question about the existence of certain entities then we can say that we are committed to the existence of these entities. What precisely is required for such a commitment to occur is subject to debate, a debate we will look at momentarily. To find out what one is commited to with a particular set of beliefs, or acceptance of a particular theory of the world, is part of the larger discipline of ontology.

Besides it not being so clear what it is to commit yourself to an answer to an ontological question, it also isn't so clear what an ontological question really is, and thus what it is that ontology is supposed to accomplish. To figure this out is the task of meta-ontology, which strictly speaking is not part of ontology construed narrowly, but the study of what ontology is. However, like most philosophical disciplines, ontology more broadly construed contains its own meta-study, and thus meta-ontology is part of ontology, more broadly construed. Nonetheless it is helpful to separate it out as a special part of ontology. Many of the philosophically most fundamental questions about ontology really are meta-ontological questions. Meta-ontology has not been too popular in the last couple of decades, partly because one meta-ontological view, the one often associated with Quine, has been accepted as the correct one, but this acceptance has been challenged in recent years. One motivation for the study of meta-ontology is simply the question what question ontology aims to answer. Take the case of numbers, for example. What is the question that we should aim to answer in ontology if we want to find out if there are numbers, that is, if reality contains numbers besides whatever else it is made up from? This way of putting it suggest an easy answer: ‘Are there numbers?’ But this question seems like an easy one to answer. An answer to it is implied, it seems, by trivial mathematics, say that the number 7 is less than the number 8. If the latter, then there is a number which is less than 8, namely 7, and thus there is at least one number. Can ontology be that easy? The study of meta-ontology will have to determine, amongst others, if ‘Are there numbers?’ really is the question that the discipline of ontology is supposed to answer, and more generally, what ontology is supposed to do. We will pursue these questions below.

The larger discipline of ontology can thus be seen as having four parts:

3.2. How the different conceptions of ontology are related to each other

The relationship between these four seems rather straightforward. (O4) will have to say how the other three are supposed to be understood. If (O1) has the result that the beliefs we share commit us to a certain kind of entity then this requires us either to accept an answer to a question about what there is in the sense of (O2) or to revise our beliefs. If we accept that there is such an entity in (O2) then this invites questions in (O3) about its nature and the general relations it has to other things we also accept. On the other hand, investigations in (O3) into the nature of entities that we are not committed to and that we have no reason to believe exist would seem like a rather speculative project, though, of course, it could still be fun and interesting.

4. Areas of overlap

The debates about logic and ontology overlap at various places. Given the division of ontology into (O1) - (O4), and the division of logic into (L1) - (L4) we can look at several areas of overlap. In the following we will discuss some paradigmatic debates on the relationship between logic and ontology, divided up by areas of overlap.

4.1. Formal languages and ontological commitment. (L1) meets (O1) and (O4)

Suppose we have a set of beliefs, and we wonder what the answer to the ontological question ‘Are there numbers?’ is, assuming (O4) tells us this is an ontological question. One strategy to see whether our beliefs already commit us to an answer of this question is as follows: first, write out all those beliefs in a public language, like English. This by itself might not seem to help much, since if it wasn't clear what my beliefs commit me to, why would it help to look at what acceptance of what these sentences say commit me to? But now, secondly, write these sentences in what is often called ‘canonical notation’. Canonical notation can be understood as a formal or semi-formal language that brings out the true underlying structure, or ‘logical form’ of a natural language sentence. In particular, such a canonical notation will make explicit which quantifiers do occur in these sentences, what their scope is, and the like. This is where formal languages come into the picture. After that, and thirdly, look at the variables that are bound by these quantifiers.[3] What values do they have to have in order for these sentences all to be true? If the answer is that the variables have to have numbers as their values, then you are committed to numbers. If not then you aren't committed to numbers. The latter doesn't mean that there are no numbers, of course, just as you being committed to them doesn't mean that there are numbers. But if your beliefs are all true then there have to be numbers, if you are committed to numbers. Or so this strategy goes.

All this might seem a lot of extra work for little. What do we really gain from these ‘canonical notations’ in determining ontological commitment? One attempt to answer this, which partly motivates the above way of doing things, is based on the following consideration: We might wonder why we should think that quantifiers are of great importance for making ontological commitments explicit. After all, if I accept the apparently trivial mathematical fact that there is a number between 6 and 8, does this already commit me to an answer to the ontological question whether there are numbers out there, as part of reality? The above strategy tries to make explicit that and why it in fact does commit me to such an answer. This is so since natural language quantifiers are fully captured by their formal analogues in canonical notation, and the latter make ontological commitments obvious because of their semantics. Such formal quantifiers are given what is called an ‘objectual semantics’. This is to say that a particular quantified statement ‘∃xFx’ is true just in case there is an object in the domain of quantification that, when assigned as the value of the variable ‘x’, satisfies the open formula ‘Fx’. This makes obvious that the truth of a quantified statement is ontologically relevant, and in fact ideally suited to make ontological commitment explicit, since we need entities to assign as the values of the variables. Thus (L1) is tied to (O1). The philosopher most closely associated with this way of determining ontological commitment, and with the meta-ontological view on which it is based, is Quine, in particular his (Quine 1948). See also van (Inwagen 1998) for a presentation sympathetic to Quine.

The above account of ontological commitment has been criticized from a variety of different angles. One criticism focuses on the semantics that is given for quantifiers in the formal language that is used as the canonical notation of the natural language representations of the contents of beliefs. The above, objectual semantics is not the only one that can be given to quantifiers. One widely discussed alternative is the so-called ‘substitutional semantics’. According to it we do not assign entities as values of variables. Rather, a particular quantified statement ‘∃xFx’ is true just in case there is a term in the language that when substituted for ‘x’ in ‘Fx’ has a true sentence as its result. Thus, ‘∃xFx’ is true just in case there is an instance ‘Ft’ which is true, for ‘t’ a term in the language in question, substituted for all (free) occurrences of ‘x’ in ‘Fx’. The substitutional semantics for the quantifiers has often been used to argue that there are ontologically innocent uses of quantifiers, and that what quantified statements we accept does not directly reveal ontological commitment. (Gottlieb 1980) provides more details on substitutional quantification, and an attempt to use it in the philosophy of mathematics. Earlier work was done by Ruth Marcus, and is reprinted in (Marcus 1993).

Another objection to the above account of determining ontological commitment goes further and questions the use of a canonical notation, and of formal tools in general. It states that if the ontological question about numbers simply is the question ‘Are there numbers?’ then all that matters for ontological commitment is whether or not what we accept implies ‘There are numbers’. In particular, it is irrelevant what the semantics for quantifiers in a formal language is, in particular, whether it is objectual or substitutional. What ontological commitment comes down to can be determined at the level of ordinary English. Formal tools are of no or at best limited importance. Ontological commitment can thus according to this line of thought be formulated simply as follows: you are committed to numbers if what you believe implies that there are numbers. Notwithstanding the debate between the substitutional and objectual semantics, we do not need any formal tools to spell out the semantics of quantifiers. All that matters is that a certain quantified statement ‘There are Fs’ is implied by what we believe for us to be committed to Fs. What does not matter is whether the semantics of the quantifier in “There are Fs” (assuming it contains a quantifier[4]) is objectual or substitutional.[4]

However, even if one agrees that what matters for ontological commitment is whether or not what one believes implies that there are Fs, for a certain kind of thing F, there might still be room for formal tools. First of all, it isn't clear what implies what. Whether or not a set of statements that express my beliefs imply that there are entities of a certain kind might not be obvious, and might even be controversial. Formal methods can be useful in determining what implies what. On the other hand, even though formal methods can be useful in determining what implies what, it is not clear which formal tools are the right ones for modeling a natural system of representations. It might seem that to determine which are the right formal tools we already need to know what the implicational relations are between the natural representations that we attempt to model, at least in basic cases. This could mean that formal tools are only of limited use for deciding controversial cases of implication.

But then, again, it has been argued that often it is not at all clear which statements really involve quantifiers at a more fundamental level of analysis, or logical form. Russell famously argued, in (Russell 1905), that "the King of France" is a quantified expression, even though it appears to be a referring expression on the face of it, a claim now widely accepted. And Davidson argued, in (Davidson 1967), that ‘action sentences’ like "Fred buttered the toast" involve quantification over events in the logical form, though not on the surface, a claim that is more controversial. One might argue in light of these debates that which sentences involve quantification over what can't be finally settled until we have a formal semantics of all of our natural language, and that this formal semantics will give us the ultimate answer to what we are quantifying over. But then again, how are we to tell that the formal semantics proposed is correct, if we don't know the inferential relations in our own language?

One further use that formal tools could have besides all the above is to make ambiguities and different ‘readings’ explicit, and to model their respective inferential behavior. For example, formal tools are especially useful to make scope ambiguities explicit, since different scope readings of one and the same natural language sentence can be represented with different formal sentences which themselves have no scope ambiguities. This use of formal tools is not restricted to ontology, but applies to any debates where ambiguities can be a hindrance. It does help in ontology, though, if some of the relevant expressions in ontological debates, like the quantifiers themselves, exhibit such different readings. Then formal tools will be most useful to make this explicit. Whether or not quantifiers indeed do have different readings is a question that will not be solved with formal tools, but if they do then these tools will be most useful in specifying what these readings are. For a proposal of this latter kind, see (Hofweber 2000) and (Hofweber 2005). One consequence of this is a meta-ontology different from Quine's, as we will discuss below.

4.2. Is logic neutral about what there is? (L2) meets (O2)

Logically valid inferences are those that are guaranteed to be valid by their form. And above we spelled this out as follows: an inference is valid by its form if as long as we fix the meaning of certain special expressions, the logical constants, we can ignore the meaning of the other expressions in the statements involved in the inference, and we are always guaranteed the the inference is valid, no matter what the meaning of the other expressions is, as long as the whole is meaningful. A logical truth can be understood as a statement whose truth is guaranteed as long as the meanings of the logical constants are fixed, no matter what the meaning of the other expressions is. Alternatively, a logical truth is one that is a logical consequence from no assumptions, i.e. an empty set of premises.

Do logical truths entail the existence of any entities, or is their truth independent of what exists? There are some well known considerations that seem to support the view that logic should be neutral with respect to what there is. On the other hand, there are also some well known arguments to the contrary. In this section we will survey some of this debate.

If logical truth are ones whose truth is guaranteed as long as the meaning of the logical constants is kept fixed then logical truths are good candidates for being analytic truths. Can analytic truths imply the existence of any entities? This is an old debate, often conducted using "conceptual truths" instead of "analytic truths". The most prominent debate of this kind is the debate about the ontological argument for the existence of god. Many philosophers have maintained that there can be no conceptual contradiction in denying the existence of particular entities, and thus there can be no proof of their existence with conceptual truths alone. In particular, an ontological argument for the existence of god is impossible. A famous discussion to this effect is Kant's discussion of the ontological argument in (Kant 1781/7), namely (KrV A592/B620 ff.) On the other hand, many other philosophers have maintained that such an ontological argument is possible, and they have made a variety of different proposals how it can go. We will not discuss the ontological argument here, however, it is discussed in detail in different formulations in the article on ontological arguments in this encyclopedia.

Whatever one says about the possibility of proving the existence of an object purely with conceptual truths, many philosophers have maintained that at least logic has to be neutral about what there is. One of the reasons for this insistence is the idea that logic is topic neutral, or purely general. The logical truths are the ones that hold no matter what the representations are about, and thus they hold in any domain. In particular, they hold in an empty domain, one where there is nothing at all. And if that is true then logical truths can't imply that anything exists. But that argument might be turned around by a believer in logical objects, objects whose existence is implied by logic alone. If it is granted that logical truths have to hold in any domain, then any domain has to contain the logical objects. Thus for a believer in logical objects there can be no empty domain.

There is a close relationship between this debate and a common criticism that standard formal logics (in the sense of (L1)) won't be able to capture the logical truths (in the sense of (L2)). It is the debate about the status of the empty domain in the semantics of first and second order logical systems.

It is a logical truth in (standard) first order logic that something exists, i.e., ‘∃x x=x’. Similarly, it is a logical truth in (standard versions of) second order logic that ‘∃Fx(Fx ∨ ¬Fx)’. These are existentially quantified statements. Thus, one might argue, logic is not neutral with respect to what there is. There are logical truths that state that something exist. However, it would be premature to conclude that logic is not neutral about what there is, simply because there are logical truths in (standard) first or second order logic which are existential statements. If we look more closely how it comes about that these existential statements are logical truths in these logical systems we see that it is only so because, by definition, a model for (standard) first order logic has to have a non-empty domain. It is possible to allow for models with an empty domain as well (where nothing exists), but models with an empty domain are excluded, again, by definition from the (standard) semantics in first order logic. Thus (standard) first order logic is sometimes called the logic of first order models with a non-empty domain. If we allow an empty domain as well we will need different axioms or rules of inference to have a sound proof system, but this can be done. Thus even though there are formal logical systems, in the sense of (L1) in which there are logical truths that are existential statements, this does not answer the question whether or not there are logical truths, in the sense of (L2), that are existential statements. The question rather is which formal system, in the sense of (L1), best captures the logical truths, in the sense of (L2). So, even if we agree that a first order logical system is a good formal system to represent logical inferences, should be adopt the axioms and rules for models with or without an empty domain?

A related debate is the debate about free logic. Free logics are formal systems that drop the assumption made in standard first and higher order logic that every closed term denotes an object in the domain of the model. Free logic allows for terms that denote nothing, and in free logic certain rules about the inferential interaction between quantifiers and terms have to be modified. Whether free or un-free (standard) logic is the better formal model for natural language logical inference is a further question. For more discussion of logic with an empty domain see (Quine 1954) and (Williamson 1999). For a sound and complete proof system for logic with an empty domain, see (Tennant 1990). For a survey article on free logic, see (Lambert 2001).

A particularly important and pressing case of the ontological implications of logic are logicist programs in the philosophy of mathematics, in particular Frege's conception of logical objects and his philosophy of arithmetic. Frege and neo-Fregeans following him believe that arithmetic is logic (plus definitions) and that numbers are objects whose existence is implied by arithmetic. Thus in particular, logic implies the existence of certain objects, and numbers are among them. Frege's position has been criticized as being untenable since logic has to be neutral about what there is. Thus mathematics, or even a part thereof, can't be both logic and about objects. The inconsistency of Frege's original formulation of his position sometimes has been taken to show this, but since consistent formulations of Frege's philosophy of arithmetic have surfaced this last point is moot. Frege's argument for numbers as objects and arithmetic as logic is probably the best known argument for logic implying the existence of entities. It has been very carefully investigated in recent years, but whether or not it succeeds is controversial. Followers of Frege defend it as the solution to major problems in the philosophy of mathematics; their critics find the argument flawed or even just a cheap trick that is obviously going nowhere. We will not discuss the details here, but a detailed presentation of the argument can be found in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy article Frege's philosophy of arithmetic as well as (Rosen 1993), which gives a clear and readable presentation of the main argument of (Wright 1983), which in turn is partially responsible for a revival of Fregean ideas along these lines. Frege's own version is in his classic (Frege 1884). A discussion of recent attempts to revive Frege can be found in (Hale and Wright 2001), (Boolos 1998) and (Fine 2002). A discussion of Frege's and Kant's conceptions of logic is in (MacFarlane 2002) which also contains many historical references.

4.3. Formal ontology. (L1) meets (O2) and (O3)

Formal ontologies are theories that attempt to give precise mathematical formulations of the properties and relations of certain entities. Such theories usually propose axioms about these entities in question, spelled out in some formal language based on some system of formal logic. Formal ontology can been seen as coming in three kinds, depending on their philosophical ambition. Let's call them representational, descriptive, and systematic. We will in this section briefly discuss what philosophers, and others, have hoped to do with such formal ontologies.

A formal ontology is a mathematical theory of certain entities, formulated in a formal, artificial language, which in turn is based on some logical system like first order logic, or some form of the lambda calculus, or the like. Such a formal ontology will specify axioms about what entities of this kind there are, what their relations among each other are, and so on. Formal ontologies could also only have axioms that state how the things the theory is about, whatever they may be, relate to each other, but no axioms that state that certain things exist. For example, a formal ontology of events won't say which events there are. That is an empirical question. But it might say under what operations events are closed under, and what structure all the events there are exhibit. Similarly for formal ontologies of the part-whole relation, and others. See (Simons 1987) for a well known book on various formal versions of mereology, the study of parts and wholes.

Formal ontologies can be useful in a variety of different ways. One contemporary use is as a framework to represent information in an especially useful way. Information represented in a particular formal ontology can be more easily accessible to automated information processing, and how best to do this is an active area of research in computer science. The use of the formal ontology here is representational. It is a framework to represent information, and as such it can be representationally successful whether or not the formal theory used in fact truly describes a domain of entities. So, a formal ontology of states of affairs, lets say, can be most useful to represent information that might otherwise be represented in plain English, and this can be so whether or not there indeed are any states of affairs in the world. Such uses of formal ontologies are thus representational.

A different philosophical use of a formal ontology is one that aims to be descriptive. A descriptive formal ontology aims to correctly describe a certain domain of entities. Take common conceptions of set theory as one example. Many people take set theory to aim at correctly describing a domain of entities, the pure sets. This is, of course, a controversial claim in the philosophy of set theory, but if it is correct then set theory could be seen as a descriptive formal ontology of pure sets. It would imply that among incompatible formal theories of sets only one could be correct. If set theory were merely representational then both of the incompatible theories could be equally useful as representational tools, though probably for different representational tasks.

Finally, formal ontologies have been proposed as systematic theories of what there is, with some restrictions. Hardly anyone would claim that there can be a simple formal theory that correctly states what concrete physical objects there are. There does not seem to be a simple principle that determines whether there are an even or odd number of mice at a particular time. But maybe this apparent randomness only holds for concrete physical objects. It might not hold for abstract objects, which according to many exist not contingently, but necessarily if at all. Maybe a systematic, simple formal theory is possible of all abstract objects. Such a systematic formal ontology will most commonly have one kind of entities which are the primary subject of the theory, and a variety of different notions of reduction that specify how other (abstract) objects really are entities of this special kind. A simple view of this kind would be one according to which all abstract objects are sets, and numbers, properties, etc. are really special kinds of sets. However, more sophisticated versions of systematic formal ontologies have been developed. An ambitious systematic formal ontology can be found in (Zalta 1983) and (Zalta 1999, in the Other Internet Resources).

Representational formal ontologies, somewhat paradoxically, are independent of any strictly ontological issues. Their success or failure is independent of what there is. Descriptive formal ontologies are just like representational ones, except with the ambition of describing a domain of entities. Systematic formal ontologies go further in not only describing one domain, but in relating all entities (of a certain kind) to each other, often with particular notions of reduction. These theories seem to be the most ambitious. Their motivation comes from an attempt to find a simple and systematic theory of all, say, abstract entities, and they can rely on the paradigm of aiming for simplicity in the physical sciences as a guide. They, just like descriptive theories, will have to have as their starting point a reasonable degree of certainty that we indeed are ontologically commitment to the entities they aim to capture. Without that these enterprises seem to have little attraction. But even if the latter philosophical ambitions fail, a formal ontology can still be a most useful representational tool.

4.4. Carnap's rejection of ontology. (L1) meets (O4) and (the end of?) (O2)

One interesting view about the relationship between formal languages, ontology, and meta-ontology is the one developed by Carnap in the first half of the 20th century, and which is one of the starting points of the contemporary debate in ontology, leading to the well-known exchange between Carnap and Quine, to be discussed below. According to Carnap one crucial project in philosophy is to develop frameworks that can be used by the scientists to formulate theories of the word. Such frameworks are formal languages that have a clearly defined relationship to experience or empirical evidence as part of their semantics. For Carnap it was a matter of usefulness and practicality which one of these frameworks will be selected by the scientists to formulate their theories in, and there is no one correct framework that truly mirrors the world as it is in itself. The adoption of one framework rather than another is thus a practical question.

Carnap distinguished two kinds of questions that can be asked about what there is. One are the so-called ‘internal questions’, questions like ‘Are there infinitely many prime numbers?’ These questions make sense once a framework that contains talk about numbers has been adopted. Such questions vary in degree of difficulty. Some are very hard, like ‘Are there infinitely many twin prime numbers?’, some are of medium difficulty, like ‘Are there infinitely many prime numbers?’, some are easy like ‘Are there prime numbers?’, and some are completely trivial, like ‘Are there numbers?’. Internal questions are thus questions that can be asked once a framework that allows talk about certain things has been adopted, and general internal questions, like ‘Are there numbers?’ are completely trivial since once the framework of talk about numbers has been adopted the question if there are any is settled within that framework.

But since the internal general questions are completely trivial they can't be what the philosophers and metaphysicians are after when they ask the ontological question ‘Are there numbers?’ The philosophers aim to ask a difficult and deep question, not a trivial one. What the philosophers aim to ask, according to Carnap, is not a question internal to the framework, but external to it. They aim to ask whether the framework correctly corresponds to reality, whether or not there really are numbers. However, the words used in the question ‘Are there numbers?’ only have meaning within the framework of talk about numbers, and thus if they are meaningful at all they form an internal question, with a trivial answer. The external questions that the metaphysician tries to ask are meaningless. Ontology, the philosophical discipline that tries to answer hard questions about what there really is is based on a mistake. The question it tries to answer are meaningless questions, and this enterprise should be abandoned. The words ‘Are there numbers?’ thus can be used in two ways: as an internal question, in which case the answer is trivially ‘yes’, but this has nothing to do with metaphysics or ontology, or as an external question, which is the one the philosophers are trying to ask, but which is meaningless. Philosophers should thus not be concerned with (O2), which is a discipline that tries to answer meaningless questions, but with (L1), which is a discipline that, in part, develops frameworks for science to use to formulate and answer real questions. Or so Carnap's project. Carnap's ideas about ontology and meta-ontology are developed in his classic essay (Carnap 1956). A nice summary of Carnap's views can be found in his intellectual autobiography (Carnap 1963).

Carnap's rejection of ontology, and metaphysics more generally, has been widely criticized from a number of different angles. One common criticism is that it relies on a too simplistic conception of natural language that ties it too closely to science or to evidence and verification. In particular, Carnap's more general rejection of metaphysics used a verificationist conception of meaning, which is widely seen as too simplistic. Carnap's rejection of ontology has been criticized most prominently by Quine, and the debate between Carnap and Quine on ontology is a classic in this field. Quine rejected Carnap's conception that when a scientists are faced with data that don't fit their theory they have two choices. First they could change the theory, but stay in the same framework. Secondly, they could move to a different framework, and formulate a new theory within that framework. These two moves for Carnap are substantially different. Quine would want to see them as fundamentally similar. In particular, Quine rejects the idea that there could be truths which are the trivial internal statements, like "There are numbers", whose truth is a given once the framework of numbers has been adopted. Such truths would be analytic truths, and Quine is well known for thinking that the distinction between analytic and synthetic truths is untenable. Thus Carnap's distinction between internal and external questions is to be rejected alongside with the rejection of the distinction between analytic and synthetic truths. On the other hand, Quine and Carnap agree that ontology in the traditional philosophical sense is to be rejected. Traditionally ontology has been an armchair, a priori investigation into the fundamental building blocks of reality. As such it is completely separated from science. Quine rejects this approach to ontology since he holds that there can't be such an investigation into reality that is completely separate and prior to the rest of inquiry. See his (Quine 1951). See (Yablo 1998) for more on the debate between Quine and Carnap, which contains many references to the relevant passages. The view on ontological commitment discussed in section 4.1., which is usually attributed to Quine, was developed as a reaction to Carnap's position discussed in this section. Simply put, Quine's view is that to see what we are committed to we have to see what our best overall theory of the world quantifies over. In particular, we look at our best overall scientific theory of the word, which contains physics and the rest.

Carnap's arguments for the rejection of ontology are presently widely rejected. However, some philosophers have recently attempted to revive some parts or others of Carnap's ideas. Yablo has argued that an internal-external distinction could be understood along the lines of the fictional-literal distinction. And, he argues in (Yablo 1998), since there is no fact about this distinction, ontology, in the sense of (O2), rests on a mistake and is to be rejected, as Carnap did. On the other hand, Hofweber has argued that an internal-external distinction with many of the features that Carnap wanted can be defended using facts about natural language, but that such a distinction will not lead to a rejection of ontology, in the sense of (O2). See (Hofweber 2000) and (Hofweber 2005). Putnam, for example in (Putnam 1987), has developed a view that revives some of the pragmatic aspects of Carnap's view. See (Sosa 1993) for a critical discussion of Putnam's view, and (Sosa 1999) for a related, positive proposal.

4.5. The structure of thought and the structure of reality. (L4) meets (O3)

One way to understand logic is as the study of the most general forms of thought or judgment, what we called (L4). One way to understand ontology is as the study of the most general features of what there is, our (O3). Now, there is a striking similarity between the most general forms of thought and the most general features of what there is. Take one example. Many thoughts have a subject of which they predicate something. What there is contains individuals that have properties. It seems that there is the same structure in thought as well as in reality. And similarly for other structural features. Does this matching between thought and the world ask for a substantial philosophical explanation? Is it a deep philosophical puzzle?

There might be a number of philosophical problems in the neighborhood of this issue. One is epistemic, connected to the question whether or not logic is a priori, or rather a general but still empirical discipline. We will not address this question here. Another is to ask for an explanation of the structural similarity between the general features of thought and the general features of reality. We will focus on this question. And we will take the subject-predicate structure of though, and the object-property structure of reality as our example.

If there is an explanation of this similarity to be given it seems it could go in one of two ways: either the structure of thought explains the structure of reality, or the other way round. An explanation of the latter kind, where the structure of reality explains that of thought, could go as follows: the world has a certain basic structure, being constituted by objects which have properties, which other objects can have as well. To properly represent a world like this the creatures from which we evolved had to develop minds that mirror this structure. Those who developed a different kind of mind died out. Therefore we have a mind whose thoughts have a structure which mirrors the structure of the world.

This kind of an explanation is a nice try, but it is rather speculative. After all, why should we think that only the right kind of structure of thoughts helps with survival? If reality really contains no objects and properties, but say only a large amount of stuff, how would that shorten our survival? Of course, if there are no objects then all our thoughts about objects would presumably be false, and thus we face the question whether truth is beneficial for survival, or something else might do just as well.

On the other hand, one could argue that the structure of thought explains the structure of the world, which would most likely be an idealist route of sorts. The most famous way to do something like this is Kant's in the Critique of Pure Reason (Kant 1781/7). We won't be able to discuss it here in any detail. This strategy for explaining the similarity has the problem of explaining how there can be a world that exists independently of us, and will continue to exist after we have died, but nonetheless the structure of this world is explained by the structure of our minds. Maybe this route could only be taken if one denies that the world exists independently of us, or maybe one could make this tension go away. In addition one would have to say how the structure of thought explains the structure of reality.

But maybe there is not much to explain here. Maybe reality does not have anything like a structure that mirrors the structure of our thoughts, at least not understood a certain way. One might hold that the truth of the thought "John smokes" does not require a world split up into objects and properties, it only requires a smoking John. And all that is required for that is a world that contains John, but not also another thing, the property of smoking. Such a view would be broadly nominalistic about properties, and it is rather controversial.

Another way in which there might be nothing to explain is connected to philosophical debates about truth. If a correspondence theory of truth is correct, and if thus for a sentence to be truth it has to correspond to the world in a way that mirrors the structure and matches parts of the sentence properly with parts of the world, then the structure of a true sentence would have to be mirrored in the world. But if, on the other extreme, a coherence theory of truth is correct then the truth of a sentence does not require a structural correspondence to the world, but merely a coherence with other sentences. For more on truth see (Künne 2003).

Whether or not there is substantial metaphysical puzzle about the correspondence of the structure thoughts and the structure of reality will itself depend on certain controversial philosophical topics. And if there is, it might be quite trivial to solve or a tough nut to crack.

5. Conclusion

With the many conceptions of logic and the many different philosophical projects under the heading of ontology, there are many problems that are in the intersection of these areas. We have touched on several above, but there are also many others. The references and links below provide more in depth discussions of these topics.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Carnap, Rudolf | Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | logic: free | logical consequence | logical constants | ontological arguments | ontology and ontological commitment


Thanks to two anonymous referees for their suggestions, in particular to one of them for two sets of detailed and helpful comments. Thanks also to Rafael Laboissiere for reporting several typos.