Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sat Oct 16, 2004

Mencius (fourth century B.C.) sought to defend the teachings of Confucius (sixth to fifth century B.C.) against other influential movements of thought, especially those associated with Mozi (fifth century B.C.) and Yang Zhu (fifth to fourth century B.C.). He is probably best known for the view that “human nature is good”, a view of human nature on the basis of which he defended the Confucian ideal and developed an account of the self-cultivation process. His view was subsequently challenged by Xunzi (third century B.C.), another major Confucian thinker, who defended the alternative view that “human nature is evil”.

Confucian thinkers of the Han (206 B.C – 220 A.D.) were influenced by the teachings of both, but by the late Tang (618–907), influential intellectuals such as Han Yu (768–824) came to regard Mencius as the true transmitter of Confucius' teachings. This view was shared by Confucian thinkers of the early Song (960–1279), and Zhu Xi (1130–1200) included the Mengzi (Mencius) as one of the Four Books, which became canonical texts of the Confucian tradition. Mencius came to be regarded as the greatest Confucian thinker after Confucius himself, and his teachings have been very influential on the development of Confucian thought in the Song, Ming (1368–1644), Qing (1644–1912), and up to modern times.

1. Background

Mencius lived in the fourth century B.C., during the Zhou dynasty (middle of eleventh century to 249 B.C.) and in the Warring States period, during which the Zhou king was weak and China was divided into different states with their own rulers, often waging war against each other. He is said to have studied under Confucius' grandson Zisi, and he traveled to different states in an attempt to convert their rulers, including King Xuan of Qi and King Hui of Liang. Our main access to Mencius's thinking is through the Mengzi (Mencius), probably compiled by his disciples or disciples of his disciples. The text was subsequently edited and shortened by Zhao Qi in the second century A.D., who also wrote a commentary on the text. This version of the text was used by subsequent scholars and is the version available to us nowadays.

The text makes reference to a number of key philosophical terms in early Chinese thought as well as to ideas associated with the teachings of Confucius (sixth to fifth century B.C.) as recorded in the Lunyu (Analects). Three important terms are tian (Heaven), ming (mandate, decree, destiny), and de (virtue, power). In early Zhou, tian, which literally referred to the skies above, was viewed as a personal entity responsible for various natural phenomena, having control over human affairs, and having emotions and the capacity to act. It was viewed as just and loving, and as the source of political authority. The king retains the authority to rule only if he retains tian ming, the mandate from tian to rule, and his retention of tian ming depends on his de. De referred to qualities such as generosity, self-sacrifice, humility, receptiveness to instruction, as well as to powers associated with these qualities, including a compulsion to respond on the part of the recipient of generous acts and a non-coercive power of attraction and transformation. The king continues to retain tian ming, the mandate to rule, only if he has de, which involves his caring for the people and properly fulfilling his responsibilities.

Later, tian also came to be viewed as the source of norms of conduct governing the relation between people. That one should behave in a certain manner is regarded as ming, namely, as something decreed by tian. Along with the increasing disorder and the resulting miseries in the middle Zhou period, there gradually emerged a sense of dissatisfaction with tian for allowing the miserable conditions to persist. While the traditional conception of a loving and just tian is still influential, texts from that period sometimes portray tian as assigning political authority independently of merit, and as the source of certain brute facts about changes in political fortune. Correspondingly, ming came to be used to refer not just to the basis of political authority or to norms of conduct, but also to certain brute facts that obtain independently of human effort, such as the end of one's life. These different dimensions of the use of tian and ming can be found in the Lunyu.

The Lunyu continues to view de as the basis for government; a king with de will have a transformative effect on the people, and will also be able to recognize and employ able and worthy officials in government. At the same time, the text also uses the term to refer to desirable qualities not just in the king but in people generally. In addition, it highlights three other key terms, ren, li, and yi. Ren is often translated as “benevolence” or “humaneness”, and is used by the text in a broader and a narrower sense. In the broader sense, it refers to an all-encompassing ideal for human beings that includes such desirable attributes as wisdom, courage, filial piety, conscientiousness, trustworthiness, or even caution in speech and the ability to endure adverse circumstances. In the narrower sense, it emphasizes affective concern for others, and on one occasion is explained in terms of love for fellow human beings. Li originally referred to rites of sacrifice, and later came to be used to refer to rules of conduct governing ceremonial behavior as well as behavior in other social contexts. As for yi, the earlier use of the character was often related to distancing oneself from disgrace, and the character probably had the meaning of a proper regard for oneself, involving such things as not brooking an insult. By the time of Confucius, it had come to be used more generally in connection with proper conduct. Yi is to a large extent determined by li, though a conception of yi is already emerging in the Lunyu that regards yi as underlying the observance of li and providing the basis for assessing and possibly departing from li.

Mozi (fifth century B.C.) opposed this emphasis on li, regarding as wasteful such Confucian practices as elaborate funerals, lengthy mourning, and musical activities. For him, something is yi if it brings profit or benefit, profit for Mozi having to do primarily with the material needs of the people. He defended the practice of indiscriminate concern for each as what brings profit, apparently opposing the Confucian idea that one should have special concern for and obligations to those closer to oneself. Even though people are not predisposed to have indiscriminate concern for others, one who sees the merit of this doctrine can, according to Mozi, bring about the appropriate restructuring of one's motivations to put the doctrine into practice. His contemporaries, such as Wumazi, believed that this restructuring of motivations is difficult to accomplish, and criticized his ideas as not practicable.

By contrast to the Moist school, the Yangist movement associated with Yang Zhu (fifth to fourth century B.C.) emphasized nourishing one's xing, a term often translated as “nature”. Earlier uses of the term referred to the direction of growth of a thing, and eventually the term came to also refer to needs and desires that a thing has or to certain tendencies characteristic of it. The Yangist conception of xing of human beings emphasizes biological life, including living a long life and satisfying one's basic desires. The Yangists advocated nourishing one's xing and avoiding political participation, which at that time often posed danger to oneself. While it is likely that the Yangists were not actually indifferent to others and to the political order, Mencius interpreted this Yangist position to be a form of selfish regard for oneself. For Mencius, just as the Moist doctrine of indiscriminate concern neglects one's parents by treating them as no different from others' parents, the Yangist position neglects one's ruler by advocating political withdrawal. From Mencius's perspective, these two positions together undermine the family and the state, the foundations of human society. Mencius saw his task as one of defending Confucius's teachings against the threat posed by these two opposing movements.

2. Ethical Ideal

Mencius elaborated on the Confucian ideal by highlighting four ethical attributes — ren (benevolence, humaneness), li (observance of rites), yi (propriety), and zhi (wisdom). While he retained the use of ren in the broader sense to refer to an all-encompassing ethical ideal, he used it more often in the narrower sense to emphasize affective concern. Ren in this narrower sense has to do with love or concern for others, and involves a reluctance to cause harm and the capacity to be moved by the suffering of others. The scope of such concern includes not just human beings but also certain kinds of animals, and there is a gradation in ren in that one has special concern for and obligations to those closer to oneself. Ren results from cultivating the special love for parents that everyone shares as an infant and the affective concern for others shown in the well-known Mencian example of our commiseration for the infant on the verge of falling into a well.

Besides using yi to refer to the propriety of conduct, Mencius also used it to refer to an ethical attribute that has to do with a proper regard for oneself and distancing oneself from disgrace. However, disgrace is no longer measured by ordinary social standards but has to do with one's falling below certain ethical standards. As an ethical attribute, yi has to do with a firm commitment to such standards. One regards what falls below such standards as potentially tainting oneself, and insists on distancing oneself from such occurrences even at the expense of death. One example is that of a beggar, who is starving to death, being given food in an abusive manner. The beggar would reject the food despite the resulting loss of life; according to Mencius, everyone shares responses of this kind, which provide the starting point for cultivating yi.

Mencius continued to use li to refer to various rules of conduct in ceremonial and other kinds of social contexts, and in addition used it to refer to an ethical attribute having to do with the observance of li. This attribute involves a general disposition to follow the rules of li, as well as a mastery of the details of li that enables one to follow li with ease. It also involves one's observing li with the proper attitude and mental attention, such as reverence in interacting with others or sorrow in mourning, and one should be prepared to suspend or depart from rules of li in exigencies.

In early Chinese thought, xin, which refers to the physical heart, is regarded as the site of both cognitive and affective activities. It is translated sometimes as “heart”, sometimes as “mind”, and in recent literature often as “heart/mind” to highlight the different aspects of the activities of xin. Xin can form certain directions, which can take the form of long term goals in life or more specific intentions. The fourth ethical attribute, zhi, or wisdom, involves having proper directions of the heart/mind, which in turn requires an ability to assess situations without adhering to fixed rules of conduct. This discretionary judgement may lead one to deviate from established rules of li, and may also guide one's behavior in situations in which no general rule is applicable.

Besides the above four ethical attributes, Mencius also highlighted other desirable qualities such as a steadfastness of purpose that enables one to follow what is proper without being swayed by fear or uncertainty. He urged that one should cultivate oneself so that one follows what is proper and willingly accepts unfavorable conditions of life that are not within one's control or are of such a nature that altering them requires improper conduct. The point is sometimes put by saying that one should willingly accept ming, what is not within one's control, and according to Mencius, one should devote effort to ethical pursuits and not worry about these external conditions of life.

3. The Heart/Mind and Human Nature

For Mencius, the four ethical attributes, ren, yi, li, and zhi, result from our cultivating four kinds of predispositions of the heart/mind that everyone shares. These include commiseration, the sense of shame, a reverential attitude toward others, and the sense of right and wrong. He referred to these as the four ‘sprouts’ or ‘beginnings’, and regarded the four ethical attributes as growing from these predispositions in the way that a plant grows from a sprout. Besides commiseration and the sense of shame, he also regarded love for parents and obedience to elder brothers as the starting point for cultivating ren and yi respectively. His view that the heart/mind has these ethical predispositions provides the basis for his response to the Moist and the Yangist challenges.

Mozi did not believe that human beings have the appropriate predispositions to begin with, and thought that one could restructure one's motivations accordingly after endorsing the doctrine of indiscriminate concern. In the absence of such predispositions, the practice of indiscriminate concern seems humanly impossible, a point seized upon by Mozi's opponents. Mencius, on the other hand, held the view that human beings have ethical predispositions that relate to the ethical ideal in the way that a sprout relates to a full-grown plant. Such predispositions contain within them a direction of growth in the way that a sprout contains within it a certain direction of growth, and they also provide the appropriate emotional resources that one can draw on to achieve the ideal. In his debate with a contemporary Moist Yizi, Mencius put the point by saying that the ethical way of life has one root — both the validity of that way of life and the emotional resources required for living it have one root in the relevant predispositions.

Related points are made in Mencius's debate with another contemporary intellectual Gaozi. Mencius opposed Gaozi's view that yi (propriety) is external, and also opposed part of a maxim of Gaozi's that says: “what one does not get from words, do not seek in the heart/mind”. While the nature of these disagreements has been subject to different interpretations, it is likely that Mencius was again making similar points about the basis of our ethical life. For Gaozi, yi (propriety) is external in that one should seek it from ethical doctrines, and if one cannot obtain it from doctrines, there is no point in seeking it from within the heart/mind. By contrast, Mencius believed that the heart/mind already has ethical predispositions that point in an ethical direction. Accordingly, yi is internal in that our recognition of what is proper derives from these predispositions of the heart/mind rather than from external doctrines.

Mencius also opposed Gaozi's view that there is neither good nor bad in the xing (nature) of human beings and that one should derive yi (propriety) from doctrines and reshape oneself accordingly. For Gaozi, xing has to do primarily with eating and having sex, the two activities that give life to human beings, both within the individual and from generation to generation. Mencius, on the other hand, characterized xing in terms of the ethical predispositions of the heart/mind, and for him xing is good as these predispositions already point in an ethical direction. The task of self-cultivation is not to reshape but to nourish one's predispositions.

The Yangists construed xing in biological terms, and regarded xing as the proper direction of development for human beings. Gaozi's position endorses the biological conception of xing but rejects the idea that we should follow xing; instead, we should derive yi from doctrines and reshape ourselves accordingly. Mencius agreed with the Yangists in viewing xing as the proper direction of development, but he rejected the biological conception of xing. Instead, xing for him is constituted by the ethical direction implicit in the predispositions of the heart/mind. Such predispositions have their source in tian, and so one also serves tian by nourishing and cultivating these predispositions. Mencius did not deny that human beings have biological tendencies, but held that the ethical predispositions of the heart/mind have priority over these other tendencies and should more properly be viewed as the content of xing. Examples like the beggar who declined food given with abuse, at the expense of loss of life, show that human beings do share this sense of priority of ethical propriety over even life itself.

4. Self-Cultivation and the Political Order

Although the heart/mind has the relevant ethical predispositions, they need to be nourished for them to grow and flourish. One should direct attention to and seek yi under their guidance, and should act accordingly till one can do so with ease and takes joy in so acting. At the same time, just as one should avoid injury to a plant in order to allow it to grow, we also need to attend to the various factors that can potentially harm one's ethical development. Mencius on several occasions highlighted the senses as something that can lead one astray. The senses operate automatically — when they come into contact with their ideal objects, they are pulled along by these objects and have neither the capacity to reflect on the propriety of the course of action nor the capacity to refrain from being pulled along. By contrast, the heart/mind has the capacity to reflect on what is proper, and has the capacity to halt any course of action it regards as improper. The heart/mind should do so under the guidance of its ethical predispositions, and should constantly exercise these capacities to ensure that one progresses in an ethical direction.

There are other factors that can interfere with one's ethical development. One may be led astray by erroneous ethical doctrines, such as the teachings of the Moist and the Yangist, and Mencius explicitly stated that he saw one of his main tasks as that of combating such doctrines. One may also be led astray by certain forms of problematic desires. For example, in a series of dialogues between Mencius and King Xuan of the state of Qi, the king referred to his great desire to expand territories and even to his feverish desires for wealth, women, and display of valor. These desires not only led the king to harsh policies, but also led him to engage in rationalizations about how he lacked the ability to be caring toward his people. Mencius's response was to try to steer the king toward seeing that a more caring policy toward the people is not only not incompatible with the king's desires, but actually enables their attainment in a higher form.

Like Confucius, Mencius regarded the transformative power of a cultivated person as the ideal basis for government. In addition, he spelled out more explicitly the idea that order in society depends on proper attitudes within the family, which in turn depends on cultivating oneself. Also, he made explicit the point that gaining the heart/mind of the people is the basis for legitimate government, as it is the response of the people that reveals who has the authority from tian to take up the position of king. Only the ruler who practices ren government can draw the allegiance of the people, and such a ruler will become invincible, not in the sense of superior military strength, but in the sense of being without opposition. A ren ruler enjoys the allegiance of the people and is unlikely to confront any hostilities; even if a few seek to oppose him, the opposition can easily be defeated with the support of the people. This idea provides one example of how Mencius would try to convince a ruler that his initial desire (viz., being invincible in the sense of superior military strength) can be accomplished in a higher form (viz., being invincible in the sense of being without opposition) through the practice of ren government.


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