Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Mental Illness

First published Fri Nov 30, 2001; substantive revision Mon Sep 19, 2005

Psychiatry involves theories of the mind, theories of the causes of mental disorders, classification schemes for those disorders, research about the disorders, proven treatments and research into new treatments, and a number of professions whose job it is to work with or on behalf of people with mental disorders. The philosophical study of psychiatry discusses conceptual, ethical, metaphysical, social, and epistemological issues that arise in all these aspects of psychiatry Central to this study is the nature of mental illness.

The connection between philosophical issues in the study and treatment of mental illness and these other areas of philosophy is in many cases obvious. For example, it takes little thought to see how the question of when and how people with mental disorders are responsible for their actions is connected with the insanity defense in law, and the more general debate over the justification of punishment. Similarly, it is clear how studying the historical growth of the idea of madness and changes in the way societies treat those they classify as mad helps us assess claims that psychiatry today is a form of social control, and further, whether social control is a legitimate function for psychiatry.

The philosophical investigation of the nature of mental illness is therefore relevant to many other areas of philosophy. While there is no sharp divide between the philosophical discussion of the nature of mental illness and the wider philosophical discussion of psychiatry, we can focus on three major issues that have preoccupied the philosophical literature.

1. Does Mental Illness Exist

The English-speaking world has not always used medical language to describe the behavior we now label as symptomatic of mental illness or mental disorder. Descriptions were sometimes framed in quite different terms, such as possession. What we now call mental illness was not always treated as a medical problem. Non-English-speaking nations in the West have had changes in their linguistic usage and their treatment of the mentally ill roughly parallel to Anglophone countries. Anthropological work in non-Western cultures suggests that there are many cases of behavior that psychiatry would classify as symptomatic of mental disorder, which are not seen within their own cultures as signs of mental illness. Indeed, other cultures may not even have a concept of mental illness that corresponds even approximately to the Western concept.

The mainstream view in the West is that the changes in our description and treatment of mental illness are a result of our increasing knowledge and greater conceptual sophistication. On this view, we have conquered our former ignorance and now know that mental illness exists, even though there is a great deal of further research to be done on the causes and treatment of mental illness. However, there are some thinkers who have challenged this mainstream view. Some have argued for a relativist view, that the reality of mental illness is not an absolute transcultural fact. The relativist view would have to be that statements about the existence of mental illness can be true in some cultures and false in other cultures.

A more extreme view is that there is no such thing as mental illness in any culture, and that there could not be, because the very notion of mental illness is based on a fundamental mistake or set of mistakes. This sort of view is most closely associated with the psychiatrist Thomas Szasz. It is this view that we will focus on here.

There are many arguments in the voluminous work of Szasz, and it is not easy to always keep them separated. One critic of Szasz separates out at least six main arguments against the existence of mental illness within his work. (Reznek, 1991, Chapter 5).

Sometimes he has compared psychiatry to alchemy or astrology (1974, pp. 1-2), and says they are all pseudo-sciences. On this criticism, it seems that the reason that mental illness does not exist is the same sort of reason that phlogiston or astral influences do not exist: it is an empirical mistake caused by flawed methodology. The continued belief in mental illness by psychiatrists is the result of dogmatism and a pseudoscientific approach using ad hoc defenses of their main claims. He also accuses psychiatrists of secrecy and obfuscation.

However, it seems that his most fundamental criticism is not of the scientific methodology of psychiatry, but of its concepts. His claim is that the concept of mental illness is based on a confusion.

[The belief in mental illness] rests on a serious, albeit simple, error: it rests on mistaking or confusing what is real with what is imitation; literal meaning with metaphorical meaning; medicine with morals. (Ibid, p. x.)

Ssasz says that there cannot be mental illness, literally speaking, because it is no more than a metaphor. He argues that by definition, "disease means bodily disease." (Ibid, p. 74), and further, the mind is not literally part of the body.

Szasz's critique of the foundations of psychiatry has attracted a great deal of attention from supporters and detractors. It has generated debate over the following issues:

  1. Is it true that disease, by definition, must refer to bodily disease?
  2. Is it true that the mind is not literally part of the body? Couldn't the mind be identified with the brain or the neural system?
  3. Is it true that that medicine is, intrinsically, not about the moral evaluation of behavior, even if it might be used instrumentally as part of a moral evaluation?
  4. Is it true that psychiatry is founded on pseudoscience?

Szasz's position has not gained any widespread credence. Given the progress of neuroscience and our increasing ability to affect emotions, thought, and behavior through medication, psychiatry has if anything gained in scientific credibility in the thirty years since Szasz first proposed his critique.

Few of Szasz's supporters have been willing to take as extreme position as him. Critics of psychiatry have been more focused on particular purported mental illnesses, such as alcoholism, psychopathy, multiple personality disorder, rather than the whole category of mental illness. There is still vigorous debate over the reality of such mental disorders. This debate has turned more on empirical issues than the more philosophical claims of Szasz.

2. Is There an Objective Way to Classify Mental Illnesses?

While Szasz's approach is of more historical importance than of current relevance to philosophy of psychiatry, there is vigorous ongoing debate concerning the way that mental illnesses should be classified. There are two aspects to this: what conditions get classified as mental illneses rather than normal conditions, and, among those conditions we agree are mental illnesses, how they are grouped together into different kinds. Controversial diagnostic categories have included homosexuality, psychopathy and personality disorders, attention deficit hyperactivity disorder, and dysthymia. The unitary nature of schizophrenia has come under special scrutiny, as has the unitary nature of autism. This debate spans both empirical and philosophical issues, and it is the former aspect, and the distinction between normality and psychopathology, that has gained the most philosophical scrutiny. The primary questions of concern are:

  1. Will it be possible in the future to classify mental illnesses according to their causes, as we do in much of the rest of medicine?
  2. Given that we currently classify most mental illnesses according to their symptoms rather than their causes, is there any reason to think that our current diagnostic categories (e.g., schizophrenia, depresssion, manic depression, anxiety disorders) correspond with natural kinds?
  3. Is it possible for our current classification scheme in psychiatry to be in any important sense "atheoretical" and independent of any particular theories of the etiology of mental disorders?
  4. Is it possible for any classification scheme of mental illnesses to be purely scientific, and is it possible for a classification scheme to be independent of values -- or to ask the reverse, do our classification schemes in psychiatry always rest on some non-scientific conception of what should count as a normal life?

This last question can be extended to all illnesses, and not just psychiatric classification. It is in psychiatry, though, that there is most reason to worry that values enter into the classification scheme, and that there is concern that the profession might be medicalizing what should be seen as normal conditions.

Before we discuss the main approaches here, we should note a couple of points. First, the concepts of disease, illness, abnormality, malady, disorder and malfunction are closely related, but they are not the same. Much careful work has been done trying to find if one of these is more basic than any of the others, or if some of these concepts can be completely analyzed in terms of the others. For our purposes here, we shall gloss over the differences between these concepts. For the most part, we will simply refer to the concept of illness.

Second, even if we could find an uncontroversial general criterion of illness, we would still need to do some work to find a criterion of mental illness. This might seem a simple task, since mental illnesses would simply be those that are illnesses of the mind. But often neurological disorders such as Alzheimer's are not classified with mental illnesses, and there is even resistance from some to classifying them in wider categories such as mental disorder. That seems to be due to the belief that neurological disorders are physical disorders resulting from identifiable damage to the neural system. As we become increasingly able to identify the brain dysfunctions associated with mental disorders, it may well be that the distinction between neurological disorders and mental illnesses starts to fade, as might the professional distinction between neurologists and psychiatrists. It may turn out that a defense of psychiatry does not need to find a clear conceptual distinction between the mental and the physical. Certainly, so far the main debate about finding a criterion of illness has not paid much attention to the problem of finding a criterion of "mental".

A main approach to psychiatric classification is the "medical model". This holds that psychiatric classification is capable of being both scientific and objective. The best-known defender of such an approach is Christopher Boorse, in a series of influential papers. At the other end of the spectrum are theories that psychiatric classification depends solely on the whim or values of those doing the classification, that there is nothing objective about it at all, and that there are no facts about what is normal. These subjective theories are generally proposed in a spirit of criticizing or undermining psychiatry, and are often very sympathetic to the Szaszian view that there is really no such thing as mental illness, and so there could not be a legitimate objective classification of different kinds of mental illness. Often the suggestion that goes with these views is that classification schemes are created to suit the needs of those in power. This view has not often been argued for explicitly, but is at least implicit in the work of Szasz, and it may be implicitly in the work of sociological theorists Peter Sedwick and Thomas Scheff. (See Reznek, 1991, Chapters 6 and 7). Some have suggested that this view underlies the historical analysis of Michel Foucault. As for its plausibility, the view that the classification is totally subjective or arbitrary stands or falls with antirealism about mental illness, and it has not received much support in the last twenty years.

A middle range of views, sometimes called "mixed" (e.g., Wakefield 1992) hold that diagnostic categories do match real mental illnesses and that there are facts about the world that determine what should be labeled as a mental disorder, but that at the same time, there is an irreducible element of value or normativity in deciding psychiatric categories.

Most debate on classification has been between different versions of mixed models, and with some debate between mixed models and of the medical model. The medical model says that whether a particular condition is normal or abnormal is simply for science to say. It does not pretend that science has provided all the answers and it may concede that there is a great deal more research to be done. It might even concede that we will never be able to collect enough evidence to discover whether a particular condition is abnormal or not: it would conclude in such a case that we cannot know the truth.

It would be highly implausible for a defender of the medical model to insist that values never in fact enter into the psychiatric taxonomy -- a brief study of the history of various categories show that empirical research and neutral scientific facts are certainly not the only things that have been taken into consideration in classification schemes. The medical model claims (a) that it is possible to have a value-neutral classification scheme and (b) it is best to use a value-neutral classification scheme.

In justifying part (b) of their claim, some defenders of the medical model might claim we can discover a conceptual truth of the form:

a disease/illness/malady/disorder/malfunction is a condition that ...

where the ellipsis is filled by some clause such as "reduces the lifespan of the organism," "reduces the productivity of the organism," or "reduces the ability of the genes of the organism to reproduce themselves." However, such an approach is highly problematic because it is very difficult to establish non-trivial conceptual truths about controversial concepts, and it seems clear that our actual usage for the last few centuries of words like disease, illness, or malady do no correspond well with such purported definitions. They are either too broad, too narrow, or both.

An alternative approach to defending (b) is to argue that medicine, and psychiatry especially, should be value-neutral and so its classification scheme should be value-neutral. Note, of course, that there are obvious ways in which we want medicine to not be neutral: for example, it should not be neutral about saving lives or improving health. So we need to be careful about the way in which we want medicine to be neutral. The most appealing interpretation of the idea that medicine, and psychiatry, should be value-neutral is that it should rise above political fighting, and that it should not be influenced by prejudice. However, it is an open question whether being value-neutral and being unbiased are the same. When it comes to deciding what conditions should count as illness, one could be unbiased but nevertheless adopt a view laden with normative assumptions, or so at least many would argue.

The best way to explain the idea that taking a value-laden stance is not necessarily to be biased is to examine the criticisms of claim (a) above, from theorists who argue that psychiatry and the rest of medicine are inevitably normative. Most such theorists do not infer from this that medicine is always biased; instead, their view is that the nature of psychiatric classification requires that some assumptions are made about what counts as health and what counts as illness, and that these assumptions are not purely scientific. They generally go on to suggest that since medicine and psychiatry in particular have to make such assumptions, it should be as open and honest about it as possible, so that debates about certain categories of psychopathology are not based on a misunderstanding of the kind of enterprise involved. Often they suggest that in a democracy, there should be public debate about what values should be at the heart of medicine and psychiatry.

Those who argue that classification is necessarily value-laden rarely rest their argument on the claim that all science is value-laden, or even more controversially, that all science is subjective. For the sake of argument, it is possible for all sides of the debate to concede that we can know facts about the causes and consequences of the conditions we label as illnesses, and that these facts are entirely value-neutral. (There are of course some who would dispute the possibility of there being, or our knowing, any value-neutral facts, but this is an extreme view, and it does not single out medical classification as an interesting and unusual case of value-ladenness. So we will set it aside.)

We now can ask why those who think that psychiatric classification must be value-laden think so, and how those who think it can be value-neutral propose to find such a classification.

If a theory can, by itself, provide us with a way of demarcating human health from pathology, then the theory must, on its own, have some account of what healthy function is, and what should count as a malfunction of a human being. Those who believe in value-neutral classification generally argue that "health" can be defined scientifically, and thus without value-laden assumptions. Those who disagree think that the criteria used to define "health" are always value-laden, even if they are also based in scientific understanding.

Thus Boorse, who argues for the value-neutral view of classification, suggests that evolutionary theory can tell us what conditions are healthy. In one paper, he gives the following definition of health:

An organism is healthy at any moment in proportion as it is not diseased; and a disease is a type of internal state of the organism which:

  • interferes with the performance of some natural function -- i.e., some species-typical contribution to survival and reproduction -- characteristic of the organism's age; and
  • is not simply in the nature of the species, i.e. is either atypical of the species or, if typical, mainly due to environmental causes. (Boorse, 1976, page 62.)

This purported definition has received a great deal of critical discussion. Without setting out all the details of that discussion, we can at least explain the opposing view. There are several possible points to make; here are three:

(C1) In much of medicine, and especially psychiatry, we do not know with any certainty what is evolutionarily natural, because our scientific studies are still in their early stages, and it can be very difficult to find data that will settle scientific controversies. The most promising scientific theory is evolutionary psychology, but this is extremely programmatic. For many conditions, such as homosexual behavior or mild depression, it is not clear whether these conditions help or hinder the continuance of the species (or the continuance of whatever set of genes the theory says is fundamental). Therefore the idea of settling the debates of what should count as illnesses with science is at best a proposal for a distant future time. It is likely that many of the scientific questions will never receive satisfactory answers, in which case we will never be able to use science completely to determine our answers.

(C2) More fundamentally, even were we to have a complete theory of evolutionary psychology, it would still be controversial whether to use such a theory in determining whether particular conditions are normal or abnormal. That is to say, many dispute whether medicine should base its view of naturalness on conditions that help the promotion of the species. For instance, many would claim that medicine is far more individualistic these days, and that we are more concerned with what hinders a particular individual, whether or not it helps the rest of the species, or would have helped the species in times when we were developing evolutionarily. There are two points here: first, that evolutionary psychology does not provide the only possible model of health and illness, and second, that given a choice between two or more models, we have to employ values in making that choice. Thus, even if we adopt evolutionary psychology as the theory to determine what is health and what is illness, this choice is not one based on purely objective scientific criteria, but rather is normatively loaded. For example, Boorse's evolutionary approach uses illness to mean an internal condition that interferes with a natural function that promotes the continuation of the species, but in deciding between this and an alternative approach, we have to ask whether this model of illness is the best one for us. No value-neutral scientific experiment or theory can answer that question, and we have to bring values into our considerations.

(C3) What's more, the answers that evolutionary psychology seems to suggest on controversial cases often don't match with our contemporary practice, and there is serious doubt that a model of health provided by evolutionary psychology is really the one that we should adopt.

Mixed models

Even if the medical model of illness is wrong, it may only require a small modification in order to become acceptable. This is what has been argued by Jerome Wakefield in a number of influential publications. Wakefield attempts to keep the concept of a natural function, and the concept of dysfunction, central in our understanding of mental disorder. Further, he proposes that evolutionary psychology can explicate which conditions are functional and which are dysfunctional. He suggests that dysfunction is a purely factual scientific concept. So some conditions, even though they may be judged negatively, will not count as disorders because they are not dysfunctions, and are not caused by dysfunctions. For example, some have claimed that children who masturbate have "childhood masturbation disorder." Wakefield says that there is no such disorder, and whatever one's values, such behavior could never count as a disorder because it is not unnatural according to the scientific theory of evolutionary psychology.

However, he concedes that some values must enter in to our decision of what conditions are mental disorders: he argues that some dysfunctions are not judged negatively, and so do not need to be classified as disorders. For example, even if evolutionary theory could show that homosexuality was unnatural, we might not classify homosexuality as a disorder because we might decide that it is not harmful. Our society may have changed so much since the times when our natures were formed that even if a person lacks certain abilities, for example, to be a hunter, and was evolutionarily speaking unnatural, we could agree that the ability to be a hunter is no longer necessary in our society, and so lacking hunter abilities does not mean one has a disorder. Further, some deficits may make us less than perfect, but still we would not judge that we are so lacking as to have a disorder.

This leads Wakefield to the following analysis of a disorder:

A condition is a disorder if and only if (a) the condition causes some harm or deprivation of benefit to the person as judged by the standards of the person's culture (the value criterion), and (b) the condition results from the inability of some internal mechanism to perform its natural function, wherein a natural function is an effect that is part of the evolutionary explanation of the existence and structure of the mechanism (the explanatory criterion). (Wakefield, 1992, in Edwards, 1997, pp. 87-8)

This analysis is still subject to criticisms C1 and C2 that we set out above. It is less clear that C3 applies to it, since Wakefield's allowing considerations of value to enter in helps the model to better match our intuitions and existing practice.

A different mixed model comes from Culver and Gert (1982, p. 81). This too has been influential.

A person has a malady if and only if he has a condition, other than his rational beliefs and desires, such that he is suffering, or at increased risk of suffering, an evil (death, pain, disability, loss of freedom or opportunity, or loss of pleasure) in the absence of a distinct sustaining cause.

This model includes a role for objective fact both in the chance of death, pain, etc., and also in determining whether a condition that is caused by a distinct sustaining cause. For example, it would seem that being homosexual can often cause a person to be unhappy, but in at least many and probably most instances, the reason for this is societal prejudice against homosexuals, which would count as a distinct sustaining cause. So this model would not necessarily entail that homosexuality is a malady, even if the condition makes people unhappy. On the other hand, the model makes it inevitable that values also enter into the determination of what counts as a malady, most obviously in the decision of which beliefs and desires are rational, and which are irrational.

Furthermore, while in a great many cases, it may simply be an empirical issue whether a person is suffering a disability, loss of opportunity or loss of pleasure, there are at least some cases where values can enter into determining what counts as disability, etc. This is clearest in cases where pragmatic considerations (for example, whether a managed care company should provide funding for treatment) require that a definite decision be made about whether a condition is a malady or not, but where it is debatable whether the condition really is a disability or a significant loss of opportunity. Recent debates over the use of medication for erectile dysfunction have vividly illustrated this for physical disorders; if a man has a condition that means that he is only able to have sex twice a week without taking medication, does that mean he has a disability? It is hard to see how one could provide an answer to this question without making assumptions about what is normal. Also, in recent years some advocates for the deaf have argued that deafness is not a disability, but is rather simply a difference from people who can hear; this too suggests that values can enter into our understanding of what counts as disability. In the realm of mental health, it can be argued that whether a person has lost freedom, for example in the controversial category of substance dependence, different observers may agree on the empirical facts concerning a person who takes drugs, but may still disagree whether she has a disability, and even whether she has diminished freedom; the difference can depend on what normative assumptions are made. For a different example, we can consider a case where a person who in her teen years experienced productive and pleasurable hypomanic episodes, but who by her twenties no longer has such episodes, has undergone a change that should count as a disability or a loss of opportunity. The approach of Culver and Gert does not rely on evolutionary psychology, and so avoids the problems set out in (C1) and (C2) above. If the preceding argument is correct, however, and the criteria for what count as an evil can depend on normative assumptions, then Culver and Gert's general definition of malady suffers from a problem of circularity.

Multiple Personality

There have been many other proposals for how to provide criteria of mental illness. We do not have the space to discuss them all in this section. Furthermore, there have been many contested mental disorders, such as schizophrenia, autism, addiction, homosexuality, attention deficit hyperactivity disorder, oppositional defiant disorder, antisocial personality disorder, and dysthymia. We do not have space to discuss them all, and indeed, the attention these conditions have received has rarely been from philosophers but from other psychiatric critics with different backgrounds.

We will discuss one condition that has gained philosophical scrutiny, that of multiple personality. Philosophers have been particularly interested in this phenomenon because it raises important issues of the understanding of the unity of consciousness and it may be an important test case for various theories of personal identity, maybe providing a counterexample to any theory that implies that there can no more than one person "in" one body. But in order to discuss these aspects of the phenomenon, philosophers have had to first address what the phenomenon really is. In particular, various skeptics have argued that there is no such thing as multiple personality, or that it is in some way artificial or inauthentic.

In order to introduce the interesting philosophical work on the reality of multiple personality, it is necessary to give a very brief sketch of what it is taken to be.

In multiple personality, it seems that there are at least two distinct personalities within one person. These personalities, or "alters," apparently have profoundly different voices, speech patterns, self-descriptions, memories, character traits, beliefs, desires, and levels of education. Different alters within one body can describe themselves as being of different ages, genders, ethnicities, skin color, height, weight, and eye color. Different alters within one body can fail to be aware of each other, but there can be interaction between them. Sometimes awareness is one-directional: A is aware of the thoughts and actions of B without B being aware of A. Sometimes one alter can directly interfere with the thoughts or actions of another alter. Or so they claim. The number of people diagnosed with multiple personality has varied greatly over time and place: it was first described in the nineteenth century, especially in France and the USA; and after it seemed to become almost non-existent in the first half of the twentieth century, it grew again in the second half, especially in the USA.

There has been a great deal of empirical and methodological debate about the causes and the treatment of multiple personality. It seems that it is linked with childhood abuse, and it may be that splitting into two, or dissociating, is a way of coping with a traumatic experience while it is happening or after it is over. It is also linked with another controversial phenomenon, hypnotism. People who are highly hypnotizable seem to be especially prone to becoming multiple personalities. Sometimes hypnotism has been used by therapists as a way to discover "hidden" personalities.

Skeptics have raised different sorts of objections to multiple personality. Their objections are of several different kinds; here are three.

(S1) Some have claimed that multiple personality does not exist at all, and it is a hoax by patients and therapists seeking attention or money, or hoping to use it as an excuse for criminal behavior.

(S2) Some have claimed that multiple personality is not really a separate phenomenon, but rather is a unusual form of other mental disorders, such as manic depression, schizophrenia, or borderline personality disorder. This raises a taxonomic issue of when a condition should be classified as an atypical form of a known mental disorder rather than as an instance of a separate, independent mental disorder.

(S3) Some have claimed that multiple personality, while a separate disorder, is caused not by traumatic childhood experiences but rather by overenthusiastic and irresponsible therapists. Vulnerable patients have been encouraged to believe that they have been abused as children. The treatment they have then received from therapists, especially hypnotism, has not discovered, but rather created separate personalities.

All of this so far is mostly an empirical matter, depending on a careful scrutiny of the existing data, careful thought about our present taxonomic categories, and probably pointing to further possible research. By far the most sophisticated philosophical work on the reality of multiple personality has been by Ian Hacking, in a series of papers and books since the mid 1980s. Hacking combines careful historical research, an understanding of statistical methods and scientific research, and a grasp of philosophical debates about realism, truth, and nominalism. He addresses the approach of the social sciences, and in particular the claim that psychiatric phenomena are socially constructed. This seems to amount to the claim that while in some sense there might always have been multiple personalities, it is a socially constructed phenomenon in the sense that we have started to bring certain concepts and patterns of ideas to bear on the phenomenon, and that a number of political and social factors are what has led us to frame our thought in this way. This view denies that a label such as multiple personality picks out a natural kind of people.

Hacking does not seem sympathetic to skeptics of the variety (S1) and (S2). In some of his work he seems quite sympathetic to (S3) and also to some of the insights of social constructionism. But he goes beyond most simple forms of social constructionism, and introduces the idea that the people classified by social categories will themselves be affected by the classification. So the issue is more than simply a matter of discussing what concepts we use in framing psychopathology.

People of these kinds can become aware that they are classified as such. They can make tacit or even explicit choices, adapt or adopt ways of living so as to fit or get away from the classification applied to them. These very choices, adaptations, or adoptions have consequences for the group, for the kind of people that is invoked. The result may be particularly strong interactions. What was known about people of a kind may become false because people of that kind have changed in virtue of what they believe about themselves. I have called this phenomenon the looping effects of human kinds. (Hacking, 1999, p. 34).

Hacking has suggested that once we understand these interactions between our categories and the people categorized, we should stop wanting a simple yes or no answer to the question "is multiple personality real?" He argues that there has been a great deal of confusion in debate between the sides often labeled as constructionists and realists, not just about multiple personality, but a whole range of phenomena and categories, including subatomic particles, childhood, emotions, and women refugees. He argues that a central assumption for anyone who argues that X is socially constructed is

[0] In the present state of affairs, X is taken for granted; X appears to be inevitable.

Those who argue for some forms of social construction of X argue that it is not in fact inevitable, and could be different. Some are content to be purely descriptive about this, while others, taking a stronger position against X, argue that we should construct our categories differently and do away with X, or at least view the category of X with some suspicion and recognize its contingency.

Even though Hacking finds the language of "social construction" mostly unhelpful, he views dissociation and multiple personality with some suspicion. He calls it an example of an interactive kind, created by looping effects, and he explicitly hopes that the category dies away (Hacking 1998, p. 100). He further argues that it is problematic to use cases of multiple personality and dissociation to draw conclusions about the fundamental nature of the mind or personal identity. "Multiple personality teaches nothing about ’the self’ except that it is an idea that can be exploited for many ends." (Ibid, p. 96).

Hacking has provided us with the most detailed and careful philosophical approach to addressing issues in classification of mental disorders. His work is bound to be influential.

3. When are People with Mental Illnesses Responsible for Symptomatic Behavior?

There are philosophical positions that say that people are never responsible for their behavior, because their behavior is always determined. There are also some philosophers, such as the early Sartre, who have made statements that seem to imply that people are always responsible for their behavior, or at least all their intentional actions. (See the entry on free will.) These are, however, extreme positions, and a far more widespread view is that of common sense: people are normally responsible for their behavior, but there are sometimes circumstances that provide them with an excuse. There is still considerable debate as to what makes a good excuse. In past decades some sociological analyses have led to suggestions that some people turn to crime, for instance, because of poverty or discrimination, and that this provides some excuse for the criminal behavior. In more recent decades, such views have received less support. However, there is still considerable support for the idea that people with mental illnesses are not fully responsible for those actions symptomatic of their illness. To what extent people are responsible, and which mental illnesses provide excuses, are issues still very much up for debate.

Three mental illnesses that have received attention from philosophers and psychiatric theorists on the issue of responsibility are schizophrenia, psychopathy, and alcoholism. There are of course many other mental illnesses where the issue of responsibility arises: obvious examples are depression, obsessive-compulsive disorder, manic episodes, paraphilias, and borderline personality disorder. Despite the fact that the various theories of the etiology and nature of these disorders are very suggestive of ways to understand the responsibility of those with the disorders for their symptomatic behavior, these and other mental disorders have received surprisingly little discussion from philosophers vis-à-vis responsibility for action. So we will focus on the disorders that have been discussed.


One of the most typical symptoms of schizophrenia is the suffering of delusions. When people with schizophrenia are suffering extreme and pervasive delusions, they do not understand what they are doing. It is no simple matter to define a delusion, and it is highly problematic to simply equate it with a false belief, but it is safe to say that paradigm cases of delusion imply a significant lack of, or distortion in, understanding of one's situation. In paranoid schizophrenia, for example, patients tend to interpret what other people say with what might be called a hermeneutics of fear and suspicion, and in extreme cases, will have elaborate and fixed fantastic theories about ways in which others are aiming to harm them.

It should be emphasized that schizophrenia causes far more than cognitive distortions. It is a disorder that causes great emotional problems as well, and these often contribute to the bizarre behavior of schizophrenics. Nevertheless, it is the distortions in belief and reasoning that provide the clearest excuse and make it plausible that often schizophrenics are not responsible for their behavior.

It is this sort of case that is central to the insanity defense in the law, and which has received considerable discussion by philosophers and psychiatrists interested in the justification of punishment. There are many different kinds of cases where mentally ill people seem to have some grasp of what they are doing, and that what they are doing is wrong, and it is very difficult to draw clear lines between somewhat similar cases.


The category of psychopathy is one of the more controversial within psychiatry. The closest that the diagnostic manual DSM-IV-TR comes to this diagnosis is antisocial personality disorder, and the whole category of personality disorder has come under critical scrutiny. Antisocial personality disorder, and the corresponding diagnoses for youth, (behavioral disorders and oppositional defiant disorder), have been especially questioned because they include as symptoms destructive and often criminal behavior. There is a great deal of suspicion of any attempt to excuse the symptomatic behavior of psychopaths.

Some of the debate hangs on the correct explanation of the behavior of psychopaths. Psychopaths are often intelligent and calculating, yet they are also impulsive and pay as little regard for their own long-term interests as they do for that of other people. They can be very emotional, yet they also seem to lack some emotional capacities. In particular, it is still an open question to what extent they comprehend the wrongness of their actions, and can be said to have a conscience. If their moral understanding is extremely limited -- for example an ability to list the kinds of actions that would be classed as morally wrong, but no ability to empathize with those who suffer -- then there is still philosophical work to be done in deciding what this implies for moral responsibility, punishment or treatment.

Another characterization of psychopaths is that they are simply people with deeply flawed characters and no use for morality. This characterization is probably closer to media portrayals of psychopaths than clinical reality, but it still raises philosophical issues. In particular, we can ask, if a person has a bad character, and lacks any interest in or feeling for the welfare of others, then he may not be able to behave well. How can we blame someone for doing what is in his nature? This is an issue for moral theory generally, and arises especially for virtue theory. It is of particular practical consequence when it comes to judging psychopaths, if this account of their behavior matches any real psychopaths.

To go further into the philosophical discussion of psychopathy would require setting out empirical discussion and ethical theory in far more detail, so we will leave this discussion of psychopathy.


There has been a great deal of discussion of whether alcoholism should count as a disease, by physicians, philosophers, legal theorists and policy makers. Many factors enter into the discussion, but one way of understanding the literature is that it centers on the issue of whether alcoholics are responsible for their continued drinking. It is plausible that alcoholism is a disease if and only if alcoholics are in some significant way (in need of clarification) not responsible for their drinking. What is less clear is which is logically prior, the disease status of alcoholism or the responsibility of alcoholics for their drinking.

Often one finds claims in popular discourse to the effect that alcoholics are not responsible for their drinking because the drinking is a symptom of a disease, or because it is the disease that causes them to drink. If this is the case, there must be independent evidence that alcoholism is a disease: various sorts of evidence have been suggested, including the withdrawal symptoms that alcoholics experience when they abstain from drinking, physical changes that occur in the brain as a result of excessive long-term drinking, and epidemiological studies that show that there is a genetic component to alcoholism.

It takes little thought to see, however, that these sorts of evidence can't by themselves prove that alcoholism is a disease. How one proves that a condition is a disease depends partly on what criteria of disease we can agree upon, but even without giving a definition of disease, one can see that the claim that the empirical evidence entails that alcoholism is a disease is highly contestable. The existence of withdrawal symptoms does show that it is difficult to stop drinking, but there is a great logical distance between having a habit that is hard to give up and having a disease. The fact that brain abnormalities occur in excessive drinkers is suggestive of a physical disorder, but abnormalities in themselves do not constitute diseases or disorders. The fact that heavy drinking causes changes in people's brains is not in itself surprising. Further evidence about what the effect of the brain abnormality has on the person would be needed, and its correlation with heavy drinking is not enough. Finally, the fact that a habit such as heavy drinking has a genetic component again does not prove that it is a disease. Laziness and cowardice could also turn out to have genetic components, but that would not make them diseases.

The problem for the disease status of alcoholism is that a habitual drinker can be described with such strongly evaluative terms as weak, self-deceiving, selfish, self-destructive, shortsighted, uncaring about other people, and even pathetic. Some would claim that such psychological characteristics provide the best explanation of an alcoholic's problem drinking, and if this is right, then the alcoholism-as-disease explanation is at best secondary, and at worst, utterly wrong-headed. While it is hard to find a description of self-destructive heavy drinking that makes it simply a matter of personal decision, an expression of one's values, or a rational choice, it does seems that problem drinking can often be a self-perpetuating way of life. It is difficult or impossible to locate a specific single cause of the drinking, and it also seems that the drinker has a role in perpetuating her problem. It is not simply something that happens to her.

Nevertheless, the testimonials and behavior of alcoholics also provide grounds for thinking that they have extreme difficulty in giving up drink, and often no simple exertion of willpower or resolution to give up will solve the problem. Often heavy drinkers try to stop or cut back but fail to do so, even when they know full well that terrible consequences will result from their continuing to drink, and when drinking does not provide pleasure or lasting benefit.

This sort of argument suggests that it is in fact the issue of personal responsibility that is logically prior, and the question of whether alcoholism is a disease depends on it. Thus, the argument would go, alcoholism is a disease because alcoholics cannot control their drinking.

Now, it is very plausible that self-control is a matter of degree; people have more or less control over their behavior. Some people are better at resisting temptation than others. It is rare for a person to have complete control over her actions, and it is almost unimaginable for a person to have no control whatsoever over her actions. It would seem to follow that there must be some degree to which alcoholism is a disease, or to put it another way, the disease status of alcoholism is not all-or-nothing.

However, at least for the purposes of public policy in present circumstances, there is no room for a concept of a condition that is a part or semi-disease. It tends to be that policy must come down on one side or the other on the question whether alcoholism is a disease, but that given the nature of alcoholism, the issue is not simply settled by the scientific and psychological facts. It follows that other considerations can come into play, such as considerations about the social and economic effects of labeling alcoholism a disease. These considerations may tip the scales one way or the other. This may provide a justification of current practice where alcoholism counts as a disease for some purposes but not others. For example, under US law, alcoholism is not a disability covered by the Americans with Disabilities Act, and so is not a condition employers must make allowances for. But treatment of alcoholism by federal health care organizations (such as the Veterans Administration) is mandated by law.

Philosophers have started to discuss the irrationality of alcoholics, how to explain their symptomatic behavior, and to what extent they are responsible for their behavior. Notable examples are Gary Watson (1999), Alfred Mele (1996), and Jon Elster (1999a). There is an astonishing amount of empirical research and psychological models aiming to explain alcoholism, and philosophers will probably find, as they have found with much work on emotion and social psychology, that the literature contains questionable assumptions about fundamental psychological concepts. Central to the philosophical discussion is the examination of the possibility of irresistible desires and the way that cravings can reduce an addict's self-control. Indeed, addiction can provide an important test case for any theory of the nature of action, since it is a prime example of irrationality, and it is important that theories about the nature of practical reasoning be able to give an adequate account of the nature of irrationality.

There is some overlap between this topic and that of the responsibility of weak willed agents, although so far there has been little systematic discussion by philosophers of the relation between addiction and weak willed action.


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