Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Mental Imagery

Ancient Imagery Mnemonics

Imagery seems to have first attracted learned attention when its powerful mnemonic properties were discovered by the Greek poet and sophos (wise man) Simonides (c.556-c.468 B.C.). According to a legend passed on by Cicero (106-43 B.C.), the discovery occurred at a banquet in Thessaly which Simonides attended in order to present a lyric poem written in praise of the host. Simonides was called outside shortly after his performance, and during his absence the roof of the banqueting hall suddenly collapsed, crushing the other diners, and mangling many of their corpses beyond recognition. Simonides, however, found he was able to identify the bodies (important for proper burial) by consulting his visual memory image of the people sitting around the banqueting table, which enabled him to identify the corpses according to where they were found. From this experience,

[Simonides] inferred that persons desiring to train this faculty [of memory] must select places and form mental images of the things they wish to remember and store those images in the places, so that the order of the places will preserve the order of the things, and the images of the things will denote the things themselves, and we shall employ the places and images respectively as a wax writing-tablet and the letters written on it. (Cicero, De Oratore, II, lxxxvi – translation: Sutton & Rackham, 1942).

Supposedly, this was the origin of the mnemonic technique known as the method of loci, described by Roman rhetoricians such as Cicero and Quintilian (c.35-c.95 A.D.), and widely employed, in various forms, by orators and others from classical, through medieval, and up until early modern times. Indeed, it has been argued that this now largely forgotten technique had a quite significant impact on the development of the Western intellectual tradition throughout the ancient, medieval and renaissance periods (Yates, 1966; Spence, 1985; Carruthers, 1990, 1998; Small, 1997; Rossi, 2000); for one thing it helped to keep imagery at the forefront of thinking about cognition during these times. The method of loci was originally mainly used by orators to remember the points to be made in a speech, in their proper order, although related imagery based techniques would later come to be used for other purposes, such as spiritual exercises. In one of the method's more straightforward forms, the orator would prepare by committing the layout of a complex but familiar architectural space (e.g. the interior of a temple) to memory, so as to be able to vividly imagine its various regions and features. He would then imagine objects, symbolizing the points to be remembered (e.g. a sword to represent battle), placed at various loci (strategic landmark positions, such as the temple's niches and windows) around the space. The points could then be recalled in their proper order, whilst making a speech, simply by imagining moving around the space along a predetermined route, “seeing” the objects by coming upon them in their appointed loci, and thereby being reminded, in sequence, of the points they symbolized.

In the Middle Ages and the Renaissance, very elaborate versions of the method evolved, using specially learned imaginary spaces (Memory Theaters or Palaces), and complex systems of predetermined symbolic images, often imbued with occult or spiritual significances. However, modern experimental research has shown that even a simple and easily learned form of the method of loci can be highly effective (Ross & Lawrence, 1968; Maguire et al., 2003), as are several other imagery based mnemonic techniques (see section 4.2 of the main entry).