Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Mental Imagery

Aristotle's Influence

Despite the obscurities surrounding the concept of phantasia, the impact on latter thinkers of Aristotle's account of cognition in general, and of imagery and imagination in particular, was enormous, and extended far beyond those who were avowed Aristotelians. Indeed, phantasia was an important concept in the epistemology and cognitive theory of the Stoic and Epicurean philosophical schools that dominated philosophy in the Hellenistic and earlier Roman Empire periods. However, they gave the word a rather different sense to that of Aristotle, and it is disputed whether his work had any significant impact on them (Sandbach, 1985; Long, 1986; Annas, 1992).

However that may be, with the rise of the Neoplatonist philosophy that dominated later antiquity, and deeply influenced early medieval Christian thought (before being displaced by overt Aristotelianism), Aristotelian cognitive theory reasserted its influence. Although, of course, the Neoplatonists looked principally to Plato, in fact they also drew liberally on Aristotle's work. Aware, as they were, of the twenty formative years that Aristotle had spent studying under Plato in the Academy, they regarded him not so much as a critic of his master (as modern and Renaissance scholars tend to see him) but as an insightful, if occasionally misguided, developer of themes within the Platonist framework (Harris, 1976; Gerson, 2005; Karamanolis, 2006). As Plato himself has relatively little to say about cognitive processes, and Aristotle has much, this meant that Neoplatonist cognitive theory, and particularly its view of imagery and imagination, was very largely drawn from Aristotle (Wallis, 1972; Blumenthal, 1976, 1977-8, 1996; Emilsson, 1988; Sheppard, 1991). It is true that Plotinus inveighs against the idea that either perception of memory depend on anything like imprints or impressions (i.e., something analogous to an impression in wax) in the soul (Ennead IV, 6), but this is most plausibly to be read not as a denial of the role of imagery experiences in memory and thought, but rather of the theory that such experiences arise from the inner presence of spatially extended, picture-like representations (Emilsson, 1988) (something to which Aristotle himself may have been less than committed (Nussbaum, 1978)). Like contemporary enactive theorists of perception and imagery (see section 4.5 below), Plotinus does not regard either perceiving or imagining to be forms of passive receptivity, but, rather, to involve an active reaching towards the object of the experience.

As is well known, in the wake of the renaissance of learning of the 12th century A.D. (Haskins, 1927), Aristotelianism soon became the dominant philosophy of Western Christendom, and continued as such until the dawn of the modern era. (Even before that, it had had a seminal influence on the Islamic philosophical tradition.) However, even as the revolt against Aristotelianism (presaging the rise of modern science) got under way in the 16th and 17th centuries, Aristotle's views about imagery (and certain other aspects of cognition) retained much of their influence.

Consider, for example, Italian Renaissance philosopher Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola,[1] who, in around 1500, published a work entitled De Imaginatione (On the Imagination) (Caplan, 1930) which relied heavily and overtly on Aristotle's discussions of phantasia and phantasmata (Caplan, 1930; Schmitt, 1967). The book seems to have been quite widely read in the 16th century: at any rate, it went through five or six Latin editions as well as two editions in French translation (Schmitt, 1967 p. 57n6 & p. 191). Later in his career Pico became an outspoken and wide ranging critic of Aristotle's philosophy, a pioneer of the anti-Aristotelian movement. However, he explicitly did not repudiate his earlier work on imagination, remarking that although he rejects Aristotle's teachings when they are false (most of the time, as he now thinks), he still accepts them when they are true (Schmitt, 1967 p. 57).

Later, better-known, anti-Aristotelian philosophers of the early modern period continue to show clear traces of Aristotelian influence in their discussions of imagery and imagination. Rees (1971 p.194) and White (1990), both remark how much Hobbes' account of imagination and imagery (in Leviathan and De Corpore, particularly – see section 2.3.2) seems to rely upon Aristotle. This extends to very close parallels between Hobbes' actual words and relevant passages in Aristotle's Rhetoric (which Hobbes happened to have translated into English). It is also notable how Descartes, in his Treatise of Man (1664) describes the surface of the pineal gland as both the seat of imagination (i.e., the image forming capacity), and of common sense (the latter expression, as used here, referring to a distinctively Aristotelian perceptual faculty that is closely associated, or even identified, with imagination (phantasia) in Aristotelian cognitive theory – see section 2.3.1, especially note 9).