Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Mental Imagery

Edward B. Titchener: The Complete Iconophile

An Englishman, Edward B. Titchener, became one of Wundt's most influential students. After graduate studies with Wundt, Titchener moved to the United States and became Professor of Psychology at Cornell, where, as well as being responsible for translating many of the more experimentally oriented works of Wundt into English, he established a successful graduate school and a vigorous research program (Tweney, 1987). Despite the fact that Wundt's and Titchener's philosophical and theoretical views, and their scientific methodologies, differed in important ways (Leahey, 1981), Titchener, much more than most of his American born colleagues, shared Wundt's vision of psychology as a pure science, with essentially philosophical rather than pragmatic ends, and he gained the reputation of being Wundt's leading disciple and representative in the English speaking world. However, he had no interest in his master's völkerpsychologie. Titchener had been deeply influenced by positivist optimism as to the scope of science, and he hoped to study even the “higher” thought processes experimentally (Danziger, 1979, 1980). Thus he attempted to push the method of controlled laboratory introspection far beyond the bounds that Wundt had so carefully set for it. Although he certainly knew why Wundt rejected introspection as a method for studying these processes, he believed its pitfalls could be avoided if the introspectors were suitably trained. Thus, an important part of the education of a psychologist in Titchener's laboratory was a rigorous training in how to introspect reliably (Titchener, 1901-5; Schwitzgebel, 2004).

Titchener appears to have been both a particularly vivid imager, and a firm believer in imagery's cognitive importance. He had studied British Empiricist philosophy whilst an undergraduate at Oxford, and was well aware of Berkeley's argument that “general ideas” (i.e. mental images that, in-and-of-themselves, represent kinds or categories of things, rather than particulars) are inconceivable (see section 2.3.3). Many philosophers today take Berkeley's argument to amount to a knock-down refutation of the traditional theory that images (ideas) are the primary vehicles of thought and that they ground linguistic meaning.[1] If mental images can only, intrinsically represent particulars, as Berkeley held, then they are surely inadequate for grounding the meanings of the general, categorical terms that are fundamental to thought and language. Titchener, however, flatly rejected Berkeley's claim, not because he found a flaw in his logic, but on introspective grounds. Commenting on Berkeley's remark about the impossibility of having an idea (image) of a general triangle (Berkeley, 1734, Introduction XIII), Titchener replies:

But I can quite well get … the triangle that is no triangle at all and all triangles at one and the same time. It is a flashy thing, come and gone from moment to moment: it hints two or three red angles, with the red lines deepening into black, seen on a dark green ground. It is not there long enough to say whether the angles join to form the complete figure, or even whether all three of the necessary angles are given. Nevertheless, it means triangle; it is Locke's general idea of a triangle; (Titchener, 1909).

Of course, Titchener was well aware that the image described here was thoroughly idiosyncratic. However, he did want to claim that such images (in virtue not so much of their individual, intrinsic characteristics, but of their place in a whole associative network of imagery) do carry meaning, and are thus fitted to be the vehicles of thought. He also described examples of his own visualizations of abstract concepts (such as the concept of meaning itself: “the blue-grey tip of a kind of scoop … digging into a dark mass of what appears to be plastic material”) and even claimed to experience imaginal meanings of connectives such as but (Titchener, 1909). Titchener plainly held that (together with actual sensations, and emotional feelings) mental content is mental imagery.