Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Mental Imagery

The Perky Experiment

Titchener's theories, and, to a very large extent, the introspection based experimental methods he used to test and refine them, have long since fallen into disrepute.[1] However, one series of experiments carried out in Titchener's laboratory, by his student C.W. Perky (1910), has achieved something of a classic, even mythic, status in the literature on imagery. Perky asked her subjects to fixate a point on a screen in front of them and to visualize various objects there, such as a tomato, a book, a leaf, a banana, an orange, or a lemon. As the subjects did this, and unbeknownst to them, a faint patch of color, of an appropriate size and shape, and just above the normal threshold of visibility, was back projected (in soft focus) onto the screen. Apart from on a couple of occasions when the projection apparatus was mishandled, none of Perky's subjects (who ranged from a ten year old child to the trained and experienced introspectors of Titchener's laboratory) ever realized that they were experiencing real percepts; they took what they “saw” on the screen to be entirely the products of their imagination. In fact, however, the projections did influence their experiences: some subjects expressed surprise at finding themselves imagining a banana “upright” rather than the horizontally oriented one they had been trying for; one was surprised to wind up imagining an elm leaf after trying for a maple. On the other hand, purely imaginary details were also reported: One subject could “see” the veins of the leaf; another claimed that the title on the imagined book was readable.

It may be very tempting to take Perky's experiment as a clear demonstration that there are no differences in kind between the subjective experiences of perception and imagery. Although perception is usually more vivid (or, as Hume put it, has greater “vivacity”) than mental imagery, the experiment appears to show that this is, at best, a mere difference in degree, and cannot guarantee that we will not systematically confuse the two. However, it is notable that the projected color patches in Perky's setup were clearly seen as such by witnesses who were not actively striving to form an image (Perky, 1910). Furthermore, Segal (1971b) reports that her initial attempts to replicate Perky's findings were a failure. Her subjects spontaneously noticed the projected color patches. In order to reproduce “the Perky effect,” Segal found it necessary to induce a prior state of relaxation in her subjects (Segal & Nathan, 1964; Segal, 1971b).[2]

In her replication and extension of Perky's work, Segal also tried projecting faint pictures that were quite different from the mental image she had asked her subjects to form. In some cases the relaxed subjects assimilated even this incongruous stimulus into their imagery, and still did not realize that a real visual stimulus was influencing their experience. For example, some subjects were asked to imagine a New York skyline whilst a faint image of a tomato was projected on the screen. Several of them failed to notice the tomato, but reported imagining New York at sunset (Segal, 1972). Nevertheless, Segal concludes from her extensive experimental studies that the Perky effect does not show that mental images and faint percepts are inherently indistinguishable. Rather, the confusion between image and percept seems to occur because the processes involved in forming a mental image of the requested type interfere with the normal utilization of the mechanisms of perception, and raise perceptual detection thresholds (Segal, 1971b; Segal & Fusella, 1971).