Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Mental Imagery

Plato and his Predecessors

Although no direct discussion of mental imagery is known in the surviving fragments of the works of the presocratic philosophers, presocratic views about visual perception may well be of relevance to later developments. When one looks into the convex, mirror-like surface of the pupil of someone's eye one sees a reflected image, what seems to be a miniature copy or model, inside the eye, of what they are seeing. Not unreasonably, this image (eidolon) within the eye was taken by many of these pioneering theorists to be the key to understanding vision (Beare, 1906; von Fritz, 1953). As Sarbin & Juhasz (1970) point out, from there it is but a very small step (although one we cannot be sure that any of the presocratics took) to regarding not only visual experience, but also quasi-visual experience, mental imagery, as arising from the presence within oneself of just such a miniature copy of a visual scene.

Plato does not discuss mental imagery systematically. However, he does clearly allude to the phenomenon in certain passages. In the Theatetus (191c,d) he raises the idea that memory might be analogous to a wax tablet into which our perceptions and thoughts stamp images of themselves, as a signet ring stamps impressions in wax . Also, in the Philebus (39b,c), in discussing circumstances when visual perception is unreliable, he speaks (metaphorically) of an inner artist painting pictures (of what we think we see) in the soul. These passages undoubtedly had an impact on how later generations and ages came to think about imagery. However, for Plato himself they are not part of an attempt to develop a comprehensive cognitive theory; rather they are floated hypothetically, in the context of arguments designed to highlight the unreliability of memory and perception as sources of true knowledge.

Plato does begin to sketch a theory of cognition in the Timaeus (where he lets up from the search for apodictic philosophical truth that preoccupies most of his dialogues, and puts forward his conjectures about the construction and working of the natural world). Here it is suggested that inner images have a role in controlling the appetites, the “lower” (as Plato saw it) aspect of the soul. He speculates that the higher, rational soul in the brain exerts control over the unruly lower, appetitive soul (situated, he says, in the belly) by causing pleasant or unpleasant images to be reflected in the shiny surface of the liver. There they evoke either the liver's natural sweetness or its bitterness, and thereby either soothe the appetitive soul, or goad it into compliance with reason (Timaeus 70d-72c). (Plato is probably influenced, here, by the traditional Greek belief that the liver is the organ of divination. Inspired visions and prophetic dreams, he suggests, are images reflected in the liver at times when the rational soul has temporarily abdicated its control.) This theory is not developed or defended in any detail, however. Furthermore, Plato does not seem to envisage any deep distinction between these internal “mental” images on the liver and ordinary optical reflections in mirrors, pools, or other shiny objects.

Indeed, although his writings contain at least three different words (eidolon, phantasma, and, most frequently, eikon) that may often, in context, reasonably be translated as “image,” Plato does not seem to use these terminological resources to mark any particularly important distinctions. In effect, he lumps mental images (including imprints in the wax of memory, and paintings on the canvas of the soul) together with other sorts of images, such as sculptures, paintings, shadows, and reflections, and assigns them all to the very lowest rung of the divided line that represents the hierarchy of being (Republic 509 d). All are imperfect, and thereby misleading, copies of material things, which are themselves, of course, merely imperfect instantiations of the eternal forms, the proper objects of philosophic enquiry. Images (mental or otherwise) are doubly removed from the forms, and are to be shunned as a likely source of error and delusion. This is why Plato deprecated sensuously evocative poetry, such as, perhaps significantly, the works of Simonides (Thayer, 1975). To give our attention to images (including those that poetry can arouse) is to turn away from the light of reality, to give ourselves over to the delusive shadows cast upon the wall deep within the cave.