Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Mental Imagery

Other Quasi-Perceptual Phenomena

It is largely because of the features of intentionality and voluntary control that imagery may be seen as a quintessentially mental phenomenon, in contrast to other sorts of quasi-perceptual phenomena, such as afterimages (Richardson, 1969 ch.2; Grüsser & Landis, 1991 ch. 23) and phosphenes (Oster, 1970; Grüsser & Landis, 1991 ch. 10), both of which are generally thought to be explicable in purely (and fairly straightforward) physiological terms. Afterimages and phosphenes are phenomenologically quite different from the mental imagery of memory and imagination, and they seem not to bear intentionality (and so, unlike mental images, they do not function as mental representations), and they are not subject to direct voluntary control. Also, mental imagery should not be (and rarely is) confused with the hypothetical very short-term visual memory store known as iconic memory (or the icon) (Sperling, 1960; Neisser, 1967; Long, 1980; Haber, 1983). Although this, at least arguably, is cognitive and representational rather than a purely physiological function, unlike imagery it functions automatically and unconsciously, and is quite outside our voluntary control.

On the other hand, the rare, poorly understood, and controversial phenomenon known as eidetic imagery apparently resembles ordinary mental imagery in intentionality, but is said to be phenomenologically distinct in point of its great vividness, detail, and stability, and because it is “externally projected,” experienced as “out there” rather than “in the head”. Thus the experience of eidetic imagery is supposedly much more akin to seeing a real, external object or scene, than is ordinary imagery experience. (However, eidetikers, as they are sometimes called, are generally reported as having a fair degree of voluntary control over their eidetic images, and rarely if ever seem to mistake them for objective realities.) According to Haber (1979), eidetic ability is found almost exclusively amongst young children, and is fairly rare even amongst them, occurring only in about 2% to 15% of American under-twelves. Other investigators, however, have reported evidence of adult eidetic ability (Jaensch, 1930; Doob, 1964, 1965), and Ahsen (1965, 1977) holds that most or all of us have at least a potential eidetic capacity.

A rather well known case of an alleged adult eidetiker is a woman, known by the pseudonym Elizabeth, studied by Stromeyer & Psotka (1970; Stromeyer, 1970). The abilities ascribed to her, however, are not at all typical of eidetikers in general. Amongst other unique and surprising feats, she was supposedly able to use her eidetic ability to fuse the two halves of a million-dot random dot stereogram, enabling her to see the three-dimensional shape thus produced (normally such 3-D fusion only takes place when the two halves of the stereogram are presented simultaneously, one to each of a subject's eyes)[1]. However, there is no credible account of anyone coming anywhere close to duplicating this truly incredible performance in subsequent research, so it is probably unwise to give the case too much evidential weight. Despite considerable effort having been put into the search, nobody with even remotely similar abilities has been found (Merritt, 1979). Certainly the child eidetikers studied by Haber (1979) and others are not capable of such a feat (indeed, they are no better at recalling visual details of things than are non-eidetikers), and Elizabeth herself has never been identified and re-tested.

In fact, there is no scientific consensus regarding the nature, the proper definition, or even the very existence of eidetic imagery, even in children (see the commentaries published with Haber, 1979). Some investigators, most notably Haber (1979), hold that it is a real (albeit elusive), distinct, and sui generis psychological phenomenon, whose mechanisms and psychological functions (if any) may well turn out to be quite different from those of ordinary memory or imagination imagery. Others, however, such as Gray & Gummerman (1975) and Bugelski (1979), argue that reports of eidetic imagery are best understood as rather hyperbolic descriptions of ordinary (though perhaps particularly vivid) visual memory imagery.

It may also be worth pointing out that mental imagery should not be confused with imagery as the term has come to be used in literary criticism, where it usually seems to mean something like metaphor or figurative language, and, in particular, highly concrete, perceptually specific language that is used primarily for its suggestive or emotional effect. Furbank (1970) has traced the history of this usage (of which he is sharply critical). It seems likely that the usage originally arose because it was assumed that the distinctive effects of these linguistic tropes arise from their power to arouse actual mental imagery in a reader, and some literary theorists have recently attempted to revive this way of thinking about literary imagery (Esrock, 1994; Scarry, 1999). However, it is certainly not safe to assume that someone who mentions imagery in a literary context necessarily intends to allude to quasi-perceptual experience.