Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Mental Imagery

Representational Neglect

The clinical neurological syndrome of representational (or imaginal) neglect, discovered in the late 1970s, is probably best understood in connection with the closely associated perceptual deficit known as left unilateral neglect (or hemineglect), descriptions of which can be found in the clinical literature as far back as 1876, and which has been quite extensively studied since the early 20th century (Halligan & Marshall, 1993; Bartolomeo, 2007). Although not everyone who suffers from perceptual unilateral neglect also has representational neglect, representational without perceptual neglect seems to be relatively rare (Coslett, 1997; Bartolomeo et al., 1994; Bartolomeo, 2002, 2007).

Left unilateral neglect is a fairly common consequence of damage to the parietal cortex of the right hemisphere of someone's brain (although other parts of the hemisphere, notably the superior temporal cortex, may also be implicated). (Similar damage to the left hemisphere does not normally produce equivalent symptoms of right unilateral neglect, or, if it does, the symptoms are generally much milder, and recovery is relatively rapid (Driver & Vuilleumier, 2003).) The syndrome manifests itself as a failure to notice or pay normal attention to things and events to the victim's left, and to the left sides of objects. Sufferers, who are generally unaware of their problem, have been known to do such things as forgetting to shave (or apply makeup to) the left side of their face, forgetting to wear their left shoe, or failing to eat food on the left side of their plate despite complaining that they are still hungry. If asked to mark the midpoint of a horizontal line, they are likely to mark a point well to the right of center, and if asked to copy a drawing they will generally copy only the right-hand side, including few if any details to the left (see figure 1). Other sense modes as well as vision are also affected. Patients often fail to explore the left sides of objects when examining them by touch, and in acute cases may hold their head turned towards the right, and may fail to respond to questions from someone standing to their left, although they respond quite normally to someone on the right. Despite all this, victims of unilateral neglect are clearly not blind or otherwise insensible to things on their left side. They can see things there if their attention is explicitly drawn to them, and may even occasionally spontaneously notice things to their left, especially if nothing much is going on to the right (Halligan & Marshall, 1993; Bartolomeo & Chokron, 2001; Driver & Vuilleumier, 2003).

Drawings and the copies made of them by neglect patients
Figure 1.
Examples of drawings, and the copies made of them by neglect patients.

The fact that some patients suffering from unilateral neglect also experience left representational neglect, affecting their imagery and their memory performance, was first reported by Bisiach & Luzzatti (1978), who asked two neglect patients to imagine being in the Piazza Del Duomo, a well known square in Milan, the patients' native city, and to describe the buildings and other features around the square. (One of the patients was also questioned about the items in “the studio where he had spent most of his life,” with very similar results.) When asked to imagine that they were standing on the steps of the cathedral that is at one end of the Piazza, nearly all of the features mentioned, by both subjects, were ones that would have been to their right from that viewpoint, and very few things on the left were recalled. When asked to imagine standing at the opposite end of the square, facing the cathedral, most of the features they mentioned were ones on the other, previously neglected, side, which was now to their right. Presumably, the patients were forming a mental image of the Piazza, as viewed from the specified location, and attempting to read off the features around it from their imagery. Clearly knowledge of features on both sides (presumably mostly gained before they became ill) was in their memory, but they were unable to access all of it normally from their imagery. Representational neglect has since been studied in numerous other patients using other locations and various other stimuli, ranging from irregular cloud-like shapes to maps of France (e.g., Bisiach, Luzzatti & Perani, 1979; Bisiach et al., 1981; Ogden, 1985; Meador et al., 1987; Sunderland, 1990; Bartolomeo et al., 1994; Rode et al., 1998, 2004).

Kosslyn (1994) claims that the phenomenon of representational neglect lends support to quasi-pictorial theory, because it adds to the already extensive roster of evidence suggesting that visual perception and imagery make use of the same brain structures. Furthermore, as as Bisiach & Berti (1990) point out, and as Pylyshyn himself concedes, “it’s hard to think why a symbolic [i.e., mentalese] representation would favor one side of a scene over another” (Pylyshyn, 2003b §7.4.3 ). On the other hand, however, both Bartolomeo (2002; Bartolomeo & Chokron, 2002) and Pylyshyn (2002b §R5.3, 2003b §7.4.3) argue that it is difficult to reconcile the facts of representational neglect with the commitments of quasi-pictorialism.

Kosslyn (1994) does not attempt to spell out an account of the phenomenon, but two ways suggest themselves in which one might try to fit it into his theoretical framework. One is the possibility that part of the visual buffer of the neglect patient has been damaged, so that the left sides of mental images (and percepts) are missing or degraded in some way. However, this seems unlikely, especially as the brain lesions that cause neglect are not in the retinotopically mapped areas where the visual buffer is supposed to be, and neglect affects all sense modes, and not just vision. It also makes it difficult to explain why not all patients suffering from one type of neglect (perceptual or representational) also suffer from the other (Coslett, 1997; Bartolomeo, 2002; Bartolomeo & Chokron, 2002; but see also Della Sala et al., 2004).

Perhaps a more plausible suggestion is that the patients with representational neglect are failing to pay attention to the left sides of their inner quasi-pictures, much as they fail to pay attention to the left side of their external environment (Meador et al., 1987). However, this raises difficulties too. Perceptual unilateral neglect clearly involves significant abnormalities of external attentional mechanisms, such as the control of gaze direction (both through the way the eyes and the head itself are turned). This is not to say that internal attentional mechanisms are not involved as well, they surely are, but it is notable that when external attention is manipulated, inducing the patients to turn their eyes more to the left (through techniques such as prism adaptation, or by simply telling them to turn their head and eyes leftwards) the symptoms not only of perceptual, but also of representational neglect can be ameliorated (Meador et al., 1987; Rode et al., 1998; Rode, Rossetti & Boisson, 2001; but see also Rode et al., 2007). This suggests that the mechanisms of directional attention in general, in its external as well as its internal aspect, are involved the representational neglect phenomenon.

In light of this, and other neurological evidence, Bartolomeo (2002; Bartolomeo & Chokron, 2002; see also Rode et al., 2004; Bartolomeo et al., 2005) argues that enactive theory, that explains imagery in terms of the operation of attentional mechanisms that are normally directed at the outside world, provides a better framework for the explanation of representational neglect. Pylyshyn (2002b §R5.3, 2003b §7.4.3), despite his overarching commitment to description theory, concedes a great deal to Bartolomeo's position.