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Modularity of Mind

First published Wed Apr 1, 2009

The concept of modularity has loomed large in philosophy and psychology since the early 1980s, following the publication of Fodor's ground-breaking book The Modularity of Mind (1983). In the twenty-five years since the term ‘module’ and its cognates first entered the lexicon of cognitive science, the conceptual and theoretical landscape in this area has changed dramatically. Especially noteworthy in this regard has been the development of evolutionary psychology, whose proponents argue that the architecture of the mind is more pervasively modular than the Fodorian perspective allows. Where Fodor (1983, 2000) draws the line of modularity at the low-level systems underlying perception and language, post-Fodorian theorists such as Carruthers (2006) contend that the mind is modular through and through, that is, up to and including the high-level systems responsible for thought. The concept of modularity has also played a role in recent debates in epistemology, philosophy of language, and other core areas of philosophy—further evidence of its utility as a tool for thinking about the mind.

1. Fodorian modules

In his classic introduction to modularity, Fodor (1983) lists nine features that collectively characterize the type of system that interests him. In original order of presentation, they are:

  1. Domain specificity
  2. Mandatory operation
  3. Limited central accessibility
  4. Fast processing
  5. Informational encapsulation
  6. ‘Shallow’ outputs
  7. Fixed neural architecture
  8. Characteristic and specific breakdown patterns
  9. Characteristic ontogenetic pace and sequencing

A cognitive system counts as modular in Fodor's sense if it is modular “to some interesting extent,” meaning that it has most of these features to an appreciable degree (Fodor, 1983, p. 37). This is a weighted most, since some marks of modularity are more important than others. Information encapsulation, for example, is more or less essential for modularity, as well as explanatorily prior to several of the other features on the list (Fodor, 1983, 2000).

Each of the items on the list calls for explication. To streamline the exposition, I will cluster most of the features thematically and examine them on a cluster-by-cluster basis, along the lines of Prinz (2006).

Encapsulation and inaccessibility. Informational encapsulation and limited central accessibility are two sides of the same coin. Both features pertain to the character of information flow across computational mechanisms, albeit in opposite directions. Encapsulation involves restriction on the flow of information into a mechanism, whereas inaccessibility involves restriction on the flow of information out of it.

A cognitive system is informationally encapsulated to the extent that in the course of processing a given set of inputs it cannot access information stored elsewhere; all it has to go on is the information contained in those inputs plus whatever information might be stored within the system itself, for example, in a proprietary database. In the case of language, for example:

A parser for [a language] L contains a grammar of L. What it does when it does its thing is, it infers from certain acoustic properties of a token to a characterization of certain of the distal causes of the token (e.g., to the speaker's intention that the utterance should be a token of a certain linguistic type). Premises of this inference can include whatever information about the acoustics of the token the mechanisms of sensory transduction provide, whatever information about the linguistic types in L the internally represented grammar provides, and nothing else. (Fodor, 1984/1990, pp. 245–246)

Similarly, in the case of perception—understood as a kind of non-demonstrative (i.e., defeasible, or non-monotonic) inference from sensory ‘premises’ to perceptual ‘conclusions’—the claim that perceptual systems are informationally encapsulated is equivalent to the claim that “the data that can bear on the confirmation of perceptual hypotheses includes, in the general case, considerably less than the organism may know” (Fodor, 1983, p. 69). The classic illustration of this property comes from the study of visual illusions, which typically persist even after the viewer is explicitly informed about the character of the stimulus. In the Müller-Lyer illusion, for example, the two lines continue to look as if they were of unequal length even after one has convinced oneself otherwise, e.g., by measuring them with a ruler (see Figure 1, below).

Mueller-Lyer diagram of lines
Figure 1. The Müller-Lyer illusion.

Informational encapsulation is related to what Pylyshyn (1984) calls cognitive impenetrability. But the two properties are not the same; instead, they are related as genus to species. Cognitive impenetrability is a matter of encapsulation relative to information stored in central memory, paradigmatically in the form of beliefs and utilities. But a system could be encapsulated in this respect without being encapsulated across the board. For example, auditory speech perception might be encapsulated relative to beliefs and utilities but unencapsulated relative to vision, as suggested by the McGurk effect (see below, §2). Likewise, a system could be unencapsulated relative to beliefs and utilities yet encapsulated relative to perception; it's not implausible, for example, that the practical reasoning system has this character (again, see §2). Strictly speaking, then, cognitive impenetrability is a specific type of informational encapsulation, albeit a type with special salience in the Fodorian scheme. Lacking this feature means failing the encapsulation test, the litmus test of modularity. But systems with this feature might still fail the test, due to information seepage of a different (i.e., non-central) sort.

The flip side of informational encapsulation is inaccessibility to central monitoring. A system is inaccessible in this sense if the intermediate-level representations that it computes prior to producing its output are inaccessible to consciousness, and hence unavailable for explicit report. In effect, centrally inaccessible systems are those whose internal processing is opaque to introspection. Though the outputs of such systems may be phenomenologically salient, their precursor states are not. Speech comprehension, for example, likely involves the successive elaboration of myriad representations (of various types: phonological, lexical, syntactic, etc.) of the stimulus, but of these only the final product—the representation of the meaning of what was said—is consciously available (at best).

Mandatoriness, speed, and superficiality. In addition to being informationally encapsulated and centrally inaccessible, modular systems and processes are “fast, cheap, and out of control” (to borrow a phrase by roboticist Rodney Brooks). These features form a natural trio, as we'll see.

The operation of a cognitive system is mandatory just in case it is automatic, that is, not under conscious control (cf. Bargh & Chartrand, 1999). This means that, like it or not, the system's operations are switched on by presentation of the relevant stimuli and those operations run to completion. For example, native speakers of English cannot hear the sounds of English being spoken as mere noise: if they hear those sounds at all, they hear them as English. Likewise, it's impossible to see a 3D array of objects in space as 2D patches of color, however hard one may try (despite claims to the contrary by painters and other visual artists influenced by Impressionism).

Speed is arguably the mark of modularity that requires least in the way of explication. But speed is relative, so the best way to proceed here is by way of examples. Speech shadowing is generally considered to be very fast, with typical lag times on the order of about 250 ms. Since the syllabic rate of normal speech is about 4 syllables per second, this suggests that shadowers are processing the stimulus in syllabus-length bits—probably the smallest bits that can be identified in the speech stream, given that “only at the level of the syllable do we begin to find stretches of wave form whose acoustic properties are at all reliably related to their linguistic values” (Fodor, 1983, p. 62). Similarly impressive results are available for vision: in a rapid serial visual presentation task (matching picture to description), subjects were 70% accurate at 125 ms. exposure per picture and 96% accurate at 167 ms. (Fodor, 1983, p. 63). In general, a cognitive process counts as fast in Fodor's book if it takes place in a half second or less.

A further feature of modular systems is that their outputs are relatively ‘shallow’. Exactly what this means is unclear. But the depth of an output seems to be a function of at least two properties: first, how much computation is required to produce it (i.e., shallow means computationally cheap); second, how constrained or specific its informational content is (i.e., shallow means informationally general) (Fodor, 1983, p. 87). These two properties are correlated, in that outputs with more specific content are typically more expensive for a system to produce, and vice versa. Some writers have interpreted shallowness to require non-conceptual character (e.g., Carruthers, 2006, p. 4). But this conflicts with Fodor's own gloss on the term, in which he suggests that the output of a plausibly modular system such as visual object recognition might be encoded at the level of ‘basic-level’ concepts, like DOG and CHAIR (Rosch et al., 1976). What's ruled out here is not concepts, then, but highly theoretical concepts like PROTON, which are too specific and too expensive to meet the shallowness criterion.

All three of the features just discussed—mandatoriness, speed, and shallowness—are associated with, and to some extent explicable in terms of, informational encapsulation. In each case, less is more, informationally speaking. Mandatoriness flows from the insensitivity of the system to the organism's utilities, which is one dimension of cognitive impenetrability. Speed depends upon the efficiency of processing, which positively correlates with encapsulation in so far as encapsulation tends to reduce the system's informational load. Shallowness is a similar story: shallow outputs are computationally cheap, and computational expense is negatively correlated with encapsulation. In short, the more informationally encapsulated a system is, the more likely it is to be fast, cheap, and out of control.

Dissociability and localizability. To say that a system is functionally dissociable is to say that it can be selectively impaired, that is, damaged or disabled with little or no effect on the operation of other systems. As the neuropsychological record indicates, selective impairments of this sort have frequently been observed as a consequence of circumscribed brain lesions. Standard examples from the study of vision include prosopagnosia (impaired face recognition), achromatopsia (total color blindness), and akinetopsia (motion blindness); examples from the study of language include agrammatism (loss of complex syntax), jargon aphasia (loss of complex semantics), alexia (loss of object words), and dyslexia (impaired reading and writing). Each of these disorders have been found in otherwise cognitively normal individuals, suggesting that the lost capacities are subserved by functionally dissociable mechanisms.

Functional dissociability is associated with neural localizability in a strong sense, namely, the system in question is implemented in neural circuitry that is both relatively circumscribed in extent (though not necessarily in contiguous areas) and dedicated to the realization of that system and that system only. Localizability in this sense goes beyond mere implementation in local neural circuitry, since a given bit of circuitry could (and often does) subserve more than one cognitive function. Candidate examples of systems that might be strongly localizable include color vision (in V4), visual motion detection (in MT), and visual face recognition (in lateral fusiform gyrus).

Domain specificity. A system is domain specific to the extent that it has a restricted subject matter, that is, the class of objects and properties that it processes information about is circumscribed in a relatively narrow way. As Fodor (1983) puts it, “domain specificity has to do with the range of questions for which a device provides answers (the range of inputs for which it computes analyses)” (p. 103): the narrower the range of inputs a system can compute, the narrower the range of problems the system can solve—and the narrower the range of such problems, the more domain specific the device. Alternatively, the degree of a system's domain specificity can be understood as a function of the range of inputs that turn the system on, where the size of that range determines the informational reach of the system (Carruthers, 2006; Samuels, 2006).

Domains (and by extension, modules) are typically more fine-grained than sensory modalities like vision and audition. This seems clear from Fodor's list of plausibly domain-specific mechanisms, which includes systems for color perception, visual shape analysis, sentence parsing, and face and voice recognition (Fodor, 1983, p. 47)—none of which correspond to perceptual or linguistic faculties in an intuitive sense. It also seems plausible, however, that the traditional sense modalities (vision, audition, olfaction, etc.), and the language faculty as a whole, are sufficiently domain specific to count as displaying this particular mark of modularity (McCauley & Henrich, 2006).

Innateness. The final feature of modular systems on Fodor's roster is innateness, understood as the property of “develop[ing] according to specific, endogenously determined patterns under the impact of environmental releasers” (Fodor, 1983, p. 100). On this view, modular systems come on-line chiefly as the result of a brute-causal process like triggering, rather than an intentional-causal process like learning. (For more on this distinction, see Cowie, 1999; for an alternative analysis of innateness, see Ariew, 1999.) The most familiar example here is language, the acquisition of which occurs in all normal individuals in all cultures on more or less the same schedule: single words at 12 months, telegraphic speech at 18 months, complex grammar at 24 months, and so on (Stromswold, 1999). Visual object perception is another, less obvious candidate (Spelke, 1994).

2. Modest modularity

The thesis of modest modularity, as I shall call it, has two strands. The first strand of the thesis is positive. It says that input systems, such as systems involved in perception and language, are modular. The second strand is negative. It says that central systems, such as systems involved in belief fixation and practical reasoning, are not modular.

In this section I will present and assess the case for modest modularity. The next section (§3) will be devoted to discussion of the stronger thesis of massive modularity, which retains the positive strand of Fodor's thesis while reversing the polarity of the second strand from negative to positive—though not without changing the subject to a certain extent as well (Wilson, 2008).

Modularity around the edges. The first, positive part of the modest modularity thesis is that input systems are modular. By ‘input system’ Fodor (1983) means a computational mechanism that “presents the world to thought” (p. 40) by processing the outputs of sensory transducers. (A sensory transducer is a device that converts the energy impinging on the body's sensory surfaces, such as the retina and cochlea, into a computationally usable form, without adding or subtracting information.) As noted earlier, input processing involves non-demonstrative inferences from sensory data to hypotheses about the layout of objects in the world. These hypotheses are then passed on to central systems, for the purpose of belief fixation.

Fodor argues that input systems constitute a natural kind, defined as “a class of phenomena that have many scientifically interesting properties over and above whatever properties define the class” (Fodor, 1983, p. 46). He argues for this by presenting evidence that input systems are modular, where modularity is marked by a cluster of psychologically interesting properties—the most interesting and important of these being informational encapsulation, as discussed in §1. In the course of that discussion, we reviewed a representative sample of this evidence, and for present purposes that should suffice. (Readers interested in further details should consult Fodor, 1983, pp. 47–101.)

Fodor's claim about the modularity of input systems has encountered stiff resistance over the years (Churchland, 1988; Arbib, 1987; Marslen-Wilson & Tyler, 1987; McCauley & Henrich, 2006). The most thorough and up-to-date critique is due to Prinz (2006), who argues that perceptual and linguistic systems rarely (if ever) satisfy the criteria of modularity. In particular, he argues that such systems are not informationally encapsulated. To this end, Prinz adduces two types of evidence. First, he points to what look to be top-down effects on visual and linguistic processing, the existence of which would tell against cognitive impenetrability, i.e., encapsulation relative to central systems. Some of the most striking examples of such effects come from research on speech perception. Probably the best-known is the phoneme restoration effect, as in the case where listeners ‘fill in’ a missing phoneme in a spoken sentence (The state governors met with their respective legi*latures convening in the capital city) from which that phoneme (the /s/ sound in legislatures) has been deleted and replaced with the sound of a cough. By hypothesis, this filling-in is governed by listeners' background beliefs about the linguistic context. Second, there appear to be cross-modal effects in perception, which would tell against encapsulation relative to non-central systems. The classic example of this, also from the speech perception literature, is the McGurk effect. Here, subjects watching a video of one phoneme being spoken (e.g., /ga/) dubbed with a sound recording of a different phoneme (/ba/) hear a third, altogether different phoneme (/da/).

How convincing one finds this part of Prinz's critique, however, depends on how convincing one finds his interpretation of the evidence for these effects. And the situation is not as clear-cut as it might first appear. Regarding phoneme restoration, for example, it could be that the effect is driven by listeners' drawing on information stored in a language-proprietary database (specifically, information about the linguistic types in the lexicon of English), rather than by their background beliefs about the linguistic context. In other words, it's not clear that phoneme restoration is a top-down effect. As for the McGurk effect, this seems perfectly consistent with the claim that speech perception is an informationally encapsulated system, albeit a system that is multi-modal in character (cf. Fodor, 1983, p.132n.13). The fact that auditory speech perception is influenced by information derived from visual speech perception, that is, in no way undermines the claim that speech perception simpliciter is encapsulated. (For doubts about other aspects of Prinz's case against input-system modularity, see Samuels, 2006.)

A further challenge to modest modularity, not addressed by Prinz (2006), comes from evidence that susceptibility to the Müller-Lyer illusion varies by both culture and chronological age. For example, it appears that adults in Western cultures are more susceptible to the illusion than their non-Western counterparts; that adults in some non-Western cultures, such as hunter-gatherers from the Kalahari Desert, are nearly immune to the illusion; and that within (but not always across) Western and non-Western cultures, pre-adolescent children are more susceptible to the illusion than adults are (Segall, Campbell, & Herskovits, 1966). McCawley and Henrich (2006) take these findings as showing that the visual system is diachronically (as opposed to synchronically) penetrable, in that how one experiences the illusion-inducing stimulus changes as a result of one's wider perceptual experience over an extended period of time. They also argue that the aforementioned evidence of cultural and developmental variability in perception militates against the idea that vision is an innate capacity, that is, the idea that vision is among the “endogenous features of the human cognitive system that are, if not largely fixed at birth, then, at least, genetically pre-programmed” and “triggered, rather than shaped, by the newborn's subsequent experience” (p. 83). However, they also issue the following caveat:

[N]othing about any of the findings we have discussed establishes the synchronic cognitive penetrability of the Müller-Lyer stimuli. Nor do the Segall et al. (1966) findings provide evidence that adults' visual input systems are diachronically penetrable. They suggest that it is only during a critical developmental stage that human beings' susceptibility to the Müller-Lyer illusion varies considerably and that that variation substantially depends on cultural variables. (McCauley & Henrich, 2006, p. 99; italics in original)

As such, the evidence cited can be accommodated by friends of modest modularity, provided that allowance is made for the potential impact of environmental, including cultural, variables on development—something that most accounts of innateness make room for.

A useful way of making this point invokes Segal's (1996) idea of diachronic modularity (see also Scholl & Leslie, 1999). Diachronic modules are systems that exhibit parametric variation over the course of their development. For example, in the case of language, different individuals learn to speak different languages depending on the linguistic environment in which they grew up, but they nonetheless share the same underlying linguistic competence in virtue of their (plausibly innate) knowledge of Universal Grammar (UG). Given the observed variation in how people see the Müller-Lyer illusion, it is possible that the visual system is modular in much the same way. Such a possibility seems perfectly consistent with the claim that input systems are modular in the operative sense.

Non-modularity at the center. I turn now to the dark side of Fodor's thesis: the claim that central systems are not modular.

Among the principal jobs of central systems is the fixation of belief, perceptual belief included, via non-demonstrative inference. Fodor (1983) argues that this sort of process cannot be realized in an informationally encapsulated system, and hence that central systems cannot be modular. Spelled out a bit further, his reasoning goes like this:

1.Central systems are responsible for belief fixation.
2.Belief fixation is isotropic and Quinean.
3.Isotropic and Quinean processes cannot be carried out by informationally encapsulated systems.
Hence(from 2 and 3):
4.Belief fixation cannot be carried out by an informationally encapsulated system.
5.Modular systems are informationally encapsulated.
Hence(from 4 and 5):
6.Belief fixation cannot be carried out by a modular system.
Hence(from 1 and 6):
7.Central systems are not modular.

The argument here contains two terms that call for explication, both of which relate to the notion of confirmation holism in the philosophy of science. The term ‘isotropic’ refers to the epistemic interconnectedness of beliefs in the sense that “everything that the scientist knows is, in principle, relevant to determining what else he ought to believe. In principle, our botany constrains our astronomy, if only we could think of ways to make them connect” (Fodor, 1983, p. 105). Antony (2003) presents a striking case of this sort of long-range interdisciplinary cross-talk in the sciences, between astronomy and archaeology; Carruthers (2006, pp. 356–357) furnishes another nice example, this time linking solar physics and evolutionary theory.

A second dimension of confirmation holism is that confirmation is ‘Quinean’, meaning that:

[T]he degree of confirmation assigned to any given hypothesis is sensitive to properties of the entire belief system … simplicity, plausibility, and conservatism are properties that theories have in virtue of their relation to the whole structure of scientific beliefs taken collectively. A measure of conservatism or simplicity would be a metric over global properties of belief systems. (Fodor, 1983, pp. 107–108).

Both isotropy and Quineanness are features that preclude encapsulation, since their possession by a system would require potentially unlimited access to the contents of central memory, and hence cognitive penetrability to the max. Put in slightly different terms: isotropic and Quinean processes are global rather than local, and since globality rules out encapsulation, isotropy and Quineanness rule out encapsulation.

By Fodor's lights, the upshot of this argument—namely, the exclusion of modularity from central systems—is bad news for the scientific study of higher cognitive functions. This is neatly expressed by his “First Law of the Non-Existence of Cognitive Science,” according to which “[t]he more global (e.g., the more isotropic) a cognitive process is, the less anybody understands it” (Fodor, 1983, p. 107). His grounds for pessimism on this score are twofold: first, global processes are resistant to computational modelling, making them unpromising objects of psychological study; and second, global systems are unlikely to be associated with local brain architecture, thereby rendering them unpromising objects of neuroscientific study. For these reasons, Fodor's argument against central modularity seems to deliver a knock-out punch against the very possibility of a science of higher cognition—not a happy result, as far as most cognitive scientists and philosophers of mind are concerned.

Be that as it may, Fodor's argument is a difficult one to resist. The main sticking points are these: first, the strong negative correlation between globality and encapsulation; second, the strong positive correlation between encapsulation and modularity. Putting these points together, we get a strong negative correlation between globality and modularity: the more global the process, the less modular the system that executes it. Hence, it seems there are only three ways to block the conclusion of the argument:

  1. deny that central processes are (strongly) global;
  2. deny that globality and encapsulation are (strongly) negative correlated;
  3. deny that encapsulation and modularity are (strongly) positively correlated.

Of these three options, the second seems least attractive, as it seems something like a conceptual truth that globality and encapsulation pull in opposite directions. The first option is perhaps a bit more appealing, though the idea that central processes are global to a substantial extent (if not to the max) is hard to deny—and that is all the argument really requires.

That leaves the third option: denying that modularity requires encapsulation. This is, in effect, the strategy pursued by Carruthers (2006). More specifically, Carruthers draws a distinction between two kinds of encapsulation: ‘narrow-scope’ and ‘wide-scope’. A system is narrow-scope encapsulated if it cannot draw on information held outside of it in the course of its processing. This corresponds to encapsulation as Fodor uses the term. By contrast, a system that is encapsulated in the wide-scope sense can draw on exogenous information during the course of its processing—it just can't draw on all of that information at once (that is, all of the information is accessible, but not all of it can be accessed on any given occasion). This is encapsulation in a much weaker sense of the term than Fodor's. Indeed, Carruthers's use of the term ‘encapsulation’ here is something of a misnomer (Prinz, 2006).

In any case, if modularity requires only weak (i.e., wide-scope) encapsulation, then Fodor's argument against central modularity no longer goes through. But given the importance of strong (i.e., narrow-scope) encapsulation to Fodorian modularity, all this really shows is that central systems might be modular in a non-Fodorian sense. (We might call it ‘modularity*’, so as to avoid confusion.) The original argument that central systems are not modular (that is, not modular in the Fodorian sense)—and with it, the motivation for the negative strand of the modest modularity thesis—still stands.

3. Massive modularity

According to the massive modularity thesis, the mind is modular (in some sense) through and through, including the parts responsible for high-level cognition functions like belief fixation, problem-solving, planning, and the like. Originally articulated and advocated by proponents of evolutionary psychology (Sperber, 1994, 2002; Cosmides & Tooby, 1992; Pinker, 1997; Barrett, 2005; Barrett & Kurzban, 2005), the thesis has received its most comprehensive and sophisticated defense at the hands of Carruthers (2006). Before proceeding to the details of that defense, however, we need to consider briefly what concept of modularity is in play.

The main thing to note here is that the operative notion of modularity differs significantly from the traditional Fodorian one. Carruthers is explicit on this point:

[If] a thesis of massive mental modularity is to be remotely plausible, then by ‘module’ we cannot mean ‘Fodor-module’. In particular, the properties of having proprietary transducers, shallow outputs, fast processing, significant innateness or innate channeling, and encapsulation will very likely have to be struck out. That leaves us with the idea that modules might be isolable function-specific processing systems, all or almost all of which are domain specific (in the content [viz. roughly Fodorian] sense), whose operations aren't subject to the will, which are associated with specific neural structures (albeit sometimes spatially dispersed ones), and whose internal operations may be inaccessible to the remainder of cognition. (Carruthers, 2006, p. 12)

Of the original set of nine features associated with Fodor-modules, then, Carruthers-modules retain at most only five: dissociability, domain specificity, mandatoriness, localizability, and central inaccessibility. Conspicuously absent from the list is informational encapsulation, the feature most central to modularity in Fodor's sense.

A second point, related to the first, is that defenders of massive modularity have chiefly been concerned to defend the modularity of central cognition (in some suitably robust sense, not necessarily Fodor's), taking for granted that the mind is modular around the edges (in Fodor's sense, or something like it). Thus, the thesis at issue for theorists like Carruthers might be best understood as the conjunction of two claims: first, that input systems are modular in a strong sense (that is, the positive strand of modest modularity), and second, that central systems are modular, but in a considerably weakened sense. In his (suitably massive) defense of massive modularity, Carruthers focuses almost exclusively on the second of these claims, and so will we.

The centerpiece of Carruthers (2006) consists of three arguments for massive modularity: the argument from design, the argument from animals, and the argument from computational tractability. Let's briefly consider each of them in turn.

The argument from design is as follows:

  1. Biological systems are designed systems, constructed incrementally.
  2. Such systems, when complex, need to have massively modular organization.
  3. The human mind is a biological system, and is complex.
  4. So the human mind will be massively modular in its organization. (Carruthers, 2006, p. 25)

A weakness in this line of reasoning, however, is that even if the mind is massively modular in its organization, it doesn't follow that that the mind is massively modular (i.e., composed throughout of systems that are domain-specific, mandatory, etc.). Fortunately, there's a somewhat stronger argument in the vicinity of this one, due to Cosmides and Tooby (1992). It goes like this:

  1. The human mind is a product of natural selection.
  2. In order to survive and reproduce, our human ancestors had to solve a range of adaptive problems (finding food, shelter, mates, etc.).
  3. Since adaptive problems are solved more quickly, efficiently, and reliably by modular (domain-specific, mandatory, etc.) systems than by non-modular ones, natural selection would have favored the evolution of a massively modular architecture.
  4. So the human mind is probably massively modular.

The force of this argument depends chiefly on the strength of the third premise. Not everyone is convinced, to put it mildly (Samuels, 2000; Fodor, 2000).

A related argument is the argument from animals. Unlike the argument from design, this argument is never explicitly stated in Carruthers (2006). But here is a plausible reconstruction of it, due to Wilson (2008):

  1. Animal minds are massively modular.
  2. Human minds are incremental extensions of animal minds.
  3. So human minds are massively modular.

Unfortunately for friends of massive modularity, this argument, like the argument from design, is vulnerable to a number of objections (Wilson, 2008). I'll mention two of them here. First, it's not easy to motivate the claim that animal minds are massively modular (in the operative, post-Fodorian sense). Though Carruthers (2006) goes to heroic lengths to do so, the evidence he cites—e.g., for the domain specificity of animal learning mechanisms, à la Gallistel, 1990—adds up to less than what's needed. The problem is that domain specificity is just one of five features characteristic of modularity in Carruthers' account, and he adduces little or no evidence to support the attribution of the other four features. So unless domain specificity alone suffices for modularity (which seems unlikely on its face), the argument falters at the first step. Second, even if animal minds are massively modular, and even if single incremental extensions of the animal mind preserve that feature, it's quite possible that a series of such extensions of animal minds might have led to its loss. In other words, as Wilson (2008) puts it, it can't be assumed that the conservation of massive modularity is transitive. And without this assumption, the argument from animals can't go through.

Third and finally, we have the argument from computational tractability (Carruthers, 2006, pp. 44–59). This is probably the least transparent of the three arguments, in terms of its underlying logic:

  1. The mind is computationally realized.
  2. All computational mental processes must be suitably tractable.
  3. Only processes that are at least weakly (i.e., narrow-scope) encapsulated are suitably tractable.
  4. So the mind must consist entirely of at least weakly encapsulated systems.
  5. So the mind is massively modular.

The main problem here is with the last step. Though one might reasonably suppose that modular systems must be at least weakly encapsulated, the converse doesn't follow. Indeed, Carruthers (2006) makes no mention of weak encapsulation in his definition of modularity, so it's difficult to see how one is supposed to get from a claim about pervasive encapsulation to a claim about pervasive modularity. At best, what we get is an argument for the possibility of massive modularity, rather than its actuality.

All in all, then, compelling general arguments for massive modularity are hard to come by. This is not yet to dismiss the possibility of modularity in central-process cognition. For example, there is recent evidence that the capacity to think about social exchanges is subserved by a domain-specific, functionally dissociable, and even innate mechanism (Stone et al., 2002; Sugiyama et al., 2002). But here too there are grounds for doubt (Prinz, 2006). Skepticism about modularity in other areas of central cognition, such as high-level mindreading, also seems to be the order of the day (e.g., Currie & Sterelny, 2000; but see Carruthers, 2006, pp. 11–12, for a rejoinder).

As for arguments against massive modularity, there is rather less to talk about. Buller and Hardcastle (2000) argue that the thesis is inconsistent with developmental neurobiology, insofar as evidence of developmental plasticity militates against innateness. (An extended version of this argument appears in Buller, 2005, pp. 127–200.) There are two big problems with this argument, however. First, it's unclear to what extent the developmental neurobiological record precludes the innate specification of mental mechanisms. For instance, Machery and Barrett (2008) contend that the inconsistency here is merely apparent, not real. In support of their contention, they point to growing evidence that specific genes are linked to the normal development of cortical structures, both in humans and other animals (for an overview of this evidence, see Ramus, 2006). Second, not all proponents of massive modularity insist that modules are innately specified. Carruthers (2006) is a case in point; Kurzban, Tooby, and Cosmides (2001) is another. The broad upshot of these considerations is clear: appeals to developmental neurobiology do little to undermine the view of mental architecture favored by evolutionary psychologists and their philosophical allies.

4. Philosophical ramifications

Interest in modularity is not confined to cognitive science and the philosophy of mind; it extends well into a number of allied fields. In epistemology, modularity has been invoked to defend the legitimacy of a theory-neutral type of observation, and hence the possibility of some degree of consensus among scientists with divergent theoretical commitments (Fodor, 1984/1990). The ensuing debate on this issue (Churchland, 1988; Fodor, 1988/1990; McCauley & Henrich, 2006) holds lasting significance for the general philosophy of science, particularly for controversies regarding the status of scientific realism. In philosophy of language, modularity has figured in theorizing about linguistic communication, for example, in relevance theorists' suggestion that speech interpretation, pragmatic warts and all, is a modular process (Sperber & Wilson, 2002). It has also been used demarcate the boundary between semantics and pragmatics, and to defend a notably austere version of semantic minimalism (Borg, 2004). Though the success of these deployments of modularity theory is subject to dispute (e.g., see Robbins, 2007, for doubts about the modularity of semantics), their existence testifies to the ongoing relevance of the concept of modularity to philosophical inquiry across a variety of domains.


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cognitive science | mind: computational theory of | neuroscience, philosophy of | psychology: evolutionary