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Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism

First published Fri Jan 23, 2004; substantive revision Sun Jun 7, 2009

Non-cognitivism is a variety of irrealism about ethics with a number of influential variants. Non-cognitivists agree with error theorists that there are no moral properties or moral facts. But rather than thinking that this makes moral statements false, noncognitivists claim that moral statements are not in the business of predicating properties or making statements which could be true or false in any substantial sense. Roughly put, noncognitivists think that moral statements have no truth conditions. Furthermore, according to non-cognitivists, when people utter moral sentences they are not typically expressing states of mind which are beliefs or which are cognitive in the way that beliefs are. Rather they are expressing non-cognitive attitudes more similar to desires, approval or disapproval.

Cognitivism is the denial of non-cognitivism. Thus it holds that moral statements do express beliefs and that they are apt for truth and falsity. But cognitivism need not be a species of realism since a cognitivist can be an error theorist and think all moral statements false. Still, moral realists are cognitivists insofar as they think moral statements are apt for truth and falsity and that many of them are in fact true.

1. A More Detailed General Description

1.1 Two Negative Constitutive Non-cognitivist Claims

Two negative theses comprise the central common non-cognitivist claims, although often current theories only endorse them in qualified form. One thesis might be called semantic nonfactualism. Simply put this thesis denies that predicative moral sentences express propositions or have truth conditions. Thus semantic nonfactualism suggests that their contents are not apt for truth or falsity. Moral predicates do not denote or express properties and predicative moral sentences do not therefore predicate properties of their subjects. The second negative thesis can be called psychological non-cognitivism. This thesis denies that the states of mind conventionally expressed by moral utterances are beliefs or mental states which fall on the cognitive side of the cognitive/non-cognitive divide. Typically non-cognitivists accept both negative theses, though there are views which accept one and not the other.

Some non-cognitivists have accepted these theses in their strongest form — moral sentences in no way predicate properties, are apt for truth or falsity, or express beliefs. But most current non-cognitivists accept these negative claims only in a somewhat weakened form. For example many non-cognitivists hold that moral judgments' primary function is not to express beliefs, though they may express them in a secondary way. Others deny that their contents are true or false in an robust sense but not that they can be true or false in a deflationary sense according to which there is no substantial property separating true and false sentences.

Non-cognitivists deny neither that moral sentences are meaningful nor that they are generally used by speakers in meaningful ways. Thus different sorts of non-cognitivist couple their negative theses with various positive claims about the meanings of moral sentences and about the states of mind that they express. It is the diversity of positive proposals that generates the different varieties of non-cognitivism. Emotivists suggest that moral sentences express or evoke non-cognitive attitudes towards various objects without asserting that the speaker has those attitudes. Norm-expressivists suggest (roughly) that the states of mind expressed by moral sentences are attitudes of acceptance of various norms or rules governing conduct and emotion, perhaps coupled with a judgment that the objects or action under discussion comports with those norms. Prescriptivists suggest that these sentences are a species of prescription or command, and may or may not offer an account of the state of mind such judgments express.

While non-cognitivism was first developed as a theory about moral judgments (Ogden & Richards 1923, 125. Barnes 1933.) many of the arguments for the position apply equally well to other sorts of evaluative language. Thus most non-cognitivists today extend the treatment to normative or evaluative judgments generally, and the discussion below will often speak of normative or evaluative judgments and terms — a category which includes as paradigms moral judgments, judgments of rationality, and judgments of value.

1.2 Cognitivism

Cognitivism is perhaps best defined as the denial of non-cognitivism. Cognitivists think that moral sentences are apt for truth or falsity, and that the state of mind of accepting a moral judgment is typically one of belief or at least that the terms are apt for expressing beliefs in the same sense that other ordinary descriptive terms are so apt. (There is some reason to be careful here since cognitivists may not need to employ the sense of ‘express’ that expressivists need to get their theory off the ground. See Schroeder 2008a.) Different species of cognitivist disagree about the contents of moral sentences and beliefs, about their truth conditions, and about their truth. To discuss all the varieties would require a complete taxonomy of possible metaethical positions. What they have in common, however, is that they all deny that an adequate account of moral judgments can be given consistent with the two negative non-cognitivist theses.

1.3 Contrast with Cognitivist Subjectivism

It is useful to contrast non-cognitivism with one particular variety of cognitivism in order to more clearly present what the non-cognitivist is claiming. Various versions of cognitivist subjectivism equate moral properties such as rightness with the property of being approved of by some person or group. To be right is to be approved of by the speaker, or the speaker and her friends, or the members of the speaker's society, or everybody. On many such views, when a speaker says something is right she is in fact saying that she approves, or that she and those like her approve. In one very good sense she would then have expressed her approval — she said that she approved or that she and her friends did. And, if approval is a conative rather than a cognitive attitude, we might say that she expressed a non-cognitive attitude. But this by itself is not sufficient to make the position non-cognitivist. This variety of subjectivism agrees with one of the positive non-cognitivist theses (that moral utterances conventionally express non-cognitive attitudes), but it does not agree with either of the essential negative non-cognitivist claims (that the judgments don't express beliefs and/or that they are not truth-apt). According to this subjectivist theory, the moral utterance expressed the speaker's belief that she approves of the action and this has truth conditions which are also the truth conditions of the sentence uttered. When a non-cognitivist says that a sentence conventionally expresses an attitude, she means to contrast the mode of expression with saying that one has the attitude. A simple example gets the idea across. One can express dislike of something by saying that one dislikes it. This is the way that a cognitivist subjectivist thinks we express moral attitudes. But one can also express dislike of something by booing or hissing. This is much like the way some non-cognitivists think we express moral attitudes. The latter way of expressing an attitude is different from the way cognitivist subjectivists think we express moral attitudes because it expresses the attitude without saying that we have the attitude (Barnes 1933; Carnap 1937, 28–29.)

2. Principal Varieties in More Detail

The principal varieties of non-cognitivism can be distinguished by focusing on the positive claims they make in explicating the semantic function of moral expressions and the nature of the mental states typically expressed by those who utter them in simple predicative statements.

2.1 Emotivism

Emotivists think moral terms in grammatically assertive utterances function primarily to express emotion and perhaps also to elicit similar emotions in others (Barnes 1933; Ayer 1952, Chapter 6.; Stevenson 1946). They can be read as suggesting that the right way to explain the meanings of such terms is to point out that they are conventional devices for performing a certain sort of speech act, one which if sincere requires that the speaker have a certain attitude. Sentences employing general predicates of positive moral evaluation such as ‘right’, ‘good’, ‘virtuous’, and so on signal a non-cognitive pro-attitude such as approval or preference. Sentences employing general predicates of negative evaluation such as ‘wrong’, ‘bad’, and ‘vicious’ signal negative non-cognitive attitudes. Thus to call a person virtuous is to express an attitude of approval and the speech act of doing so is analogous to the speech act performed when we cheer for that person. The account can be extended beyond general moral terms. Simple predicative utterances employing the so-called thick moral terms such as ‘brave’ and ‘honest’ can then be thought of as performing this same speech act while at the same time predicating the natural property (say fearlessness in the case of bravery) which common usage of the term seems to track. Thus thick moral terms can the thought of as having both descriptive and emotive meaning.

Some theorists who view themselves as emotivists suggest that even the most general terms of moral evaluation have a descriptive meaning rather than just an emotive or non-cognitive meaning. (Stevenson 1944, 22; Hare 1952, suggests the same sort of idea within a prescriptivist theory at 118.) One such approach analyzes judgments applying a moral predicate to a particular object or action as expressing approval or disapproval of some property while at the same time predicating that property of the object or item in question (Barker 2000, Ridge 2006). According to these theorists, a sentence such as “Lying is wrong” both predicates a property of the act type lying and expresses the speaker's disapproval of that property.

While this two component approach may have advantages when dealing with the role of moral terms in inferences and arguments (see discussion of the embedding problem below), it may be open to the objection that the view is no longer a version of non-cognitivism. Accounts of this sort do not deny that moral judgments predicate properties — in fact they are committed to the claim that they do. And speakers will make these predications only when they believe that they are true, so that it seems that moral judgments will express beliefs.

Non-cognitivist proponents of the two component theories insist that the theories count as non-cognitivist because emotive meaning is in some sense primary or prior to the descriptive component. One way they can do this is by suggesting that the predicated property is determined by the moral attitudes of the speaker (Hare 1952, 118). To go back to our example, the property predicated by “Lying is wrong,” could be the most general property toward which the speaker has an attitude of moral disapproval. Different speakers would thus be predicating different properties of lying, and which property this would be in a particular case would be a function of the emotive attitudes of the speaker. Whether this is sufficient to count such theories as emotivist or non-cognitivist is open to dispute, but many proponents of such views do call themselves non-cognitivists and emotivists. And these more complicated views are often adopted by theorists who begin from simpler theories which are paradigm cases of non-cognitivism.

2.2 Prescriptivism

Prescriptivists suggest that moral judgments are a species of prescriptive utterance and that prescriptions are distinct from assertions, even when they have the grammatical form of assertions. Early prescriptivists thought that this had radical implications for moral reasoning and argument. Carnap suggested that moral judgments are equivalent to relatively simple imperatives. The statement ‘Killing is evil’ means the same thing as ‘Do not kill.’ On that basis he claimed that there could be no moral knowledge or error. (Carnap 1937; 23–24 & 29)

By contrast current versions of prescriptivism, most developed in the works of R. M. Hare, have attempted to vindicate moral thinking as a rational enterprise. The main idea here is that while moral sentences do in fact express a species of imperative or prescription, they express prescriptions of a special universal sort. And it is largely because they are prescriptions of this sort that they are subject to various consistency constraints, so that accepting one moral judgment carries with it a requirement that one accept other judgments in some respects like it. While Hare denies that moral judgments are exactly equivalent to imperatives expressible in any other form of words, he does tell us a lot about what they mean. Moral imperatives are universal in a number of ways. They are to apply not just to the agent about whom they are made (if they are made with respect to a particular agent) but also to any agent who is similarly situated. And they apply to any action or object which is relevantly similar to the actions or objects about which the judgment is made. They apply to all relevantly similar cases at any time and any place. Thus, very roughly, when one calls an action right one is not only prescribing the action in question, but also any relevantly similar action wherever and whenever it occurs. And the prescription is addressed not only to the agent whose action is up for assessment but also to every other person, including the speaker and listeners. In this way, Hare believes, calling an action wrong commits the speaker to judging wrong any relevantly similar action done at any time and any place by any person.

With ordinary prescriptions, it isn't obvious that there is a state of mind that someone must be in if they utter or obey a command and which we ought to characterize as accepting an imperative. Hare, himself at one point argues that there is no substantive way of characterizing the attitude a person must have if she expresses or accepts a prescription or moral judgment (Hare 1952, 9–11). Even so, prescriptivists have some reason for wanting to offer an account of accepting a moral judgment if they want to explain moral practice. Ordinarily we attribute moral judgments to people, even people who are silent. So the prescriptivist will want to say something about our basis for these attributions. An account of the attitude that constitutes accepting a moral judgment will allow them to ground such attributions. One suggestion is that the attitude of accepting a moral judgment involves an intention to do what the judgments recommend. Sincerely accepting a command directed at oneself involves doing it if one is in circumstances where it applies and one is able and otherwise intending to do it should one find oneself in those circumstances (Hare 1952, 20). Since moral commands are universal according to the theory, they will be directed at everyone. Thus anyone who sincerely accepts a moral judgment will be disposed to do what they believe right in circumstances where they can. Less sincere judgments may lack this connection (Hare 1952, 169). The matter is relevant to some of the arguments over internalism that we will consider below.

2.3 Quasi-realism

Since non-cognitivism is a species of irrealism about ethics, it should be unsurprising that many of its main motivations overlap with those for other versions of ethical irrealism, especially with those for error theories. Early non-cognitivists seem most concerned to defend metaphysical and epistemic commitments incompatible with a realist interpretation of moral claims. For example, moral judgments seem to be empirically under-determined (Ayer 1952, 106; Mackie 1977, 39). Hence they fail tests for meaningful discourse proposed by logical positivists. If moral language is meaningful, it would be a counter-example to the view. Thus early versions of non-cognitivism were proposed by these theorists, not so much because they were interested in moral philosophy but rather to render innocuous a seeming counter-example to their own theories (Carnap 1937, 24-27; Ayer 1952, 107–109).

More contemporary non-cognitivists have also been motivated by similar underlying metaphysical and epistemic commitments. But they have been as concerned with vindicating the legitimacy of moral practice and argument as with anything else. As a result, they have put more time and energy into explaining, and in a certain sense justifying, the realist-seeming features of moral discourse in the absence of a commitment to realism (Hare 1952; Blackburn 1984, 1998; Gibbard 1990).

‘Quasi-Realism’ is Simon Blackburn's name for this sort of non-cognitivism, and especially his own version of expressivism. Yet other sophisticated non-cognitivists, notably Allan Gibbard, have been happy to work under the quasi-realist banner (Gibbard 2003, 18–19). What especially distinguishes the quasi-realist project is an emphasis on explaining why we are entitled to act as if moral judgments are genuinely truth-apt even while strictly speaking they remain neither true nor false. Thus it is a commitment of a quasi-realist that normative judgments are in an important way different from most (other) paradigm descriptive judgments — enough so to render problematic their status as either true or false — and yet that a justification is nonetheless available for our practices of treating them as if they were in fact true or false. What exactly this comes to is hard to say without discussing some of the special problems for non-cognitivism in general, since it is precisely in offering solutions to those problems that the quasi-realist carries out his program. Thus we will revisit the position later on in the context of these problems.

2.4 Norm-expressivism

Allan Gibbard (1990) has proposed an analysis of judgments regarding rationality according to which they express non-cognitive attitudes towards rules or norms. From there he proceeds to reduce other normative judgments into various more particular kinds of judgments of rationality, so that all moral judgments are covered by the proposed analysis. Gibbard suggests that normative judgments express the acceptance of systems of norms — rules dividing actions under naturalistic descriptions into those which are forbidden, permitted and required. To call an action rational is, to a first approximation, to express one's acceptance of a system of norms which allows it. To call an action irrational is to express one's acceptance of a system of norms which forbids it. And so on (Gibbard 1990, 46). This is only Gibbard's idea to a first approximation, since a speaker may not have a determinate system of norms in mind when he or she makes such a judgment. So Gibbard suggests we would do better to think of judgments to the effect that an action would be irrational as expressing rejection of any set of norms which does not forbid it. More precisely, a normative judgment predicating a normative term of a particular action rules out combinations of descriptive judgments concerning the action with norms that either permit, forbid, or require (as appropriate) actions falling under those descriptions. More complex judgments are captured using sets of norm-world pairs which the judgments “rule out” representing those states of mind inconsistent with the judgments in question. The basic idea is that a judgment that action A is permissible is incompatible with a pair the first member of which represents A as a lie, and the second member of which is a norm that rules out lying. And it is inconsistent with many more such combinations besides. Given this, we can capture the content of the judgment that action A is permissible by specifying the set of world-norm pairs with which it is incompatible. (A more detailed exposition of Gibbard's technical apparatus can be found within the discussion of the Embedding Problem below.)

Gibbard develops his analysis to cover moral judgments by analyzing such judgments in terms of judgments of rationality. An action is wrong if and only if it fails to meet standards of action the intentional or negligent violation of which in a normal state of mind would be sufficient for finding the agent prima facie blameworthy. And an action is blameworthy if it would be rational for the agent to feel guilty and for others to resent the agent for doing the action (Gibbard 1990, 45). Since the rationality of guilt or resentment receives a non-cognitive analysis, the approach generates a non-cognitive analysis of moral judgments themselves.

Gibbard's more recent work (Gibbard 2003) retains many of the main features of his norm-expressivist theory but it revises to some extent the account of the non-cognitive attitudes involved in accepting a normative judgment. On the current view, such judgments express the acceptance of plans, or perhaps better they express a state of mind that we might think of as planning to act in this way or that depending on the naturalistic circumstances one finds oneself in. More complex judgments embedding normative terms express combinations of such attitudes with further attitudes, including ordinary beliefs. Whereas in the earlier work Gibbard used sets of world-norm pairs to formally capture the contents of judgments, in the later work he relies on what he calls “fact-prac worlds”. Formally they mostly function in the same ways as the world-norm pairs did in the earlier theory. But in the fact-prac worlds apparatus contingency plans take the place of norms as members of the pairs. Once again, a judgment that action A is permissible will be inconsistent with some combinations of factual beliefs with plans. Each of these combinations can be captured by a factual component representing how the world is factually together with a component representing a plan. For example the judgment that action A is permissible will be incompatible with any pair the fact-representing member of which represents action A as a lie, paired with a plan that rules out lying. And just as a similar idea allowed Gibbard to use sets of norm-world pairs to capture the content of normative judgments, he now can capture the content of a normative judgment by specifying the set of fact-prac worlds with which it is incompatible. When the apparatus is fully developed, the fact representing members of the pairs can once again be thought of as possible worlds insofar as they specify every detail of the world, and the plans are hyper-plans insofar as they have an answer for what to do in every circumstance. Gibbard often calls these fully determinate fact-prac worlds “fact-plan worlds”. The resulting theory might now be called ‘plan-expressivism’ rather than ‘norm-expressivism’ though most of its important structural features are very similar to those of his earlier view.

Further developments come in the form of Gibbard's arguments for the theory: Gibbard suggests that people need to plan and need ways to think about and represent plans, and he argues that a language which might naturally develop in order to do this and which therefore expressed acceptance of such plans would wind up looking very much like our actual moral discourse. And he uses the fact-prac world apparatus to argue that supervenience of the moral on the non-moral falls naturally out of the resulting story. (Gibbard 2003).

2.5 Borderline cases

Often philosophical positions are introduced in rather pure and stark versions, only to be modified in light of arguments and objections so as to become more like competing theories over time. It should not be too surprising that this is the case in metaethics and that present day non-cognitivist theories are less distinguishable from cognitivist alternatives than earlier versions. It can even be a controversial matter whether theories developed within the non-cognitivist tradition but modified to handle objections still deserve the label. The varieties of emotivism which postulate both descriptive meaning and emotive meaning have sometimes aroused such suspicions. Furthermore, while non-cognitivists accept each of the two negative theses outlined above, there are views which accept only one of the two without the other. These positions constitute two metaethical theories which we might think of as borderline cases lying just outside the non-cognitivist region of logical space.

Fictionalists are not semantic non-factualists. Moral sentences are regarded as genuinely truth-apt. Such sentences do have truth conditions and an assertive sentence using a moral predicate does predicate a property. Yet, in normal use, these sentences are not strictly speaking true. Thus far the fictionalist agrees with error theorists. But while error theorists think that the falsity of moral sentences implies that ordinary moral talk is massively in error, fictionalists disagree. According to the fictionalist a speaker uttering a false moral sentence is typically not expressing a belief in the content expressed by the sentence. Rather such speakers are using it fictively, and this use involves no error. Thus, fictionalists are psychological non-cognitivists. Accepting a moral judgment is not believing the judgment true and the state of mind conventionally expressed by an assertive sentence using moral terms is also not belief in the content of that judgment. Just like standard versions of non-cognitivism, fictionalists will generally offer a story about what non-cognitive states of mind they do conventionally express. For example, they may suggest that the state of mind is an intention to act as if the moral judgment expressing the intention is true. The rejection of semantic nonfactualism leads most taxonomists to omit fictionalism from the non-cognitivist genus, but some fictionalists have presented their views as descendants of non-cognitivism (MacIntyre 1981, 15–18; Kalderon 2005).

In contrast, Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons have propounded a view which they call Nondescriptivist Cognitivism. As the label suggests, they do not regard their view as a species of non-cognitivism, but like fictionalism the view does accept one of non-cognitivism's two constitutive negative theses while rejecting the other. However, with respect to each thesis Horgan and Timmons's choices contrast with those made by fictionalism. Nondescriptivist cognitivism spurns psychological non-cognitivism, but embraces semantic nonfactualism, at least insofar as it rejects the claim that moral sentences describe the world or predicate genuine properties. (Horgan & Timmons 2000; Timmons 1999.) The precise content of the view is difficult to pin down. (It holds that moral judgments express beliefs that do not represent the world as being one way rather than another, yet it is arguably constitutive of beliefs that they represent.) It is nevertheless worth noting the view since, together with fictionalism it illustrates that there are positions which accept only one of the two negative theses constitutive of non-cognitivism. If the views are coherent this would suggest the two negative theses are logically independent.

3. Motivations for Non-cognitivism

Non-cognitivism is motivated by a number of considerations, most rooted in metaphysics, the philosophy of mind or epistemology.

3.1 The Open Question Argument

At the beginning of the 20th Century, G. E. Moore's open question argument convinced many philosophers that moral statements were not equivalent to statements made using non-moral or descriptive terms. For any non-moral description of an action or object it seemed that competent speakers could without confusion doubt that the action or object was appropriately characterized using a moral term such as ‘good’ or ‘right’. The question of whether the action or object so described was good or right was always open, even to competent speakers. Furthermore, in the absence of any systematic theory to explain the possibility of synthetic as opposed to analytic identity claims, many were convinced that this showed that moral properties could not be identified with any natural (or supernatural) properties. Thus Moore and others concluded that moral properties such as goodness were irreducible sui generis properties, not identical to natural properties (Moore 1903, 15).

The non-naturalists had however neglected another option consistent with their argument. Perhaps moral predicates did not refer to properties at all, and perhaps their meaning was not analyzable in non-moral descriptive terms not because they referred to irreducibly moral properties but because, despite appearances, they were not referring expressions at all. In other words, semantic nonfactualism about moral terms entails that questions of the sort highlighted by Moore could not be closed by any amount of competence with the expressions used to ask them because the expressions in question are not in fact equivalent. Thus non-cognitivists could argue that moral expressions used in such open questions did not function to represent anything or to predicate any property and as such were not equivalent to any descriptive or referring expressions. Rather they merely served to convey emotion (Ogden and Richards 1923, 125). Speakers to whom such questions seemed open were tacitly aware of this difference in function and hence not in a position to equate moral expressions with descriptive expressions.

Contemporary philosophers recognize the possibility that sentences that express identities might be synthetic as opposed to analytic or true by definition. We can discover that water is the same stuff as H2O without being able to infer it from the meanings of the terms involved (Kripke 1972; Putnam 1975a). And descriptive naturalists about morality have pointed out that the openness of Moore's question to competent speakers does not rule out the possibility of securing the identity of a moral property with a naturalistic property through empirical discoveries that do not rely on the expressions in question having the same meaning (Boyd 1988). Yet many contemporary defenders of non-cognitivism suggest that the open question argument still provides ammunition for their claims. Even if we cannot infer from the openness of a question that the referents of two terms used to ask that question are distinct, we might still have reason to think that the two expressions do not mean the same thing. Thus non-cognitivists have used the open question argument to suggest that moral terms contain a normative element completely lacking in descriptive terms and which should be cashed out along the lines that the non-cognitivists favor.

The open question argument can be seen as providing independent support for what is sometimes called Hume's Law — the claim that one can never validly deduce an ‘ought’ from an ‘is’ (Hume 1888, 469). According to Hume's Law, no set of premises consisting entirely of non-moral descriptive statements is sufficient to entail a moral or normative conclusion. The non-cognitivist is in a position to explain this, insofar as her positive proposal for the functioning of moral terms will suggest they do more than merely describe the world. She will say that moral terms essentially express a positive attitude, or function to commend. Purely descriptive terms do not. Nothing can be the conclusion of a valid argument which is not already implicit in the premises. Thus descriptive claims cannot entail the extra expressive or imperatival component that according to the non-cognitivist is part of the meaning of moral terms (Hare 1952, 32–49).

There are of course many ways to resist these arguments. Perhaps moral expressions are analytically equivalent to naturalistic expressions, but these analyticities are themselves not obvious even to competent speakers (Lewis 1989, 129). This may be because no analyticities are obvious, or it may be because moral analyses in particular are especially complex. One moral that could be drawn from the history of Twentieth Century analytic philosophy is that if there are any analyticities, competent speakers can question them. This is the paradox of analysis. If any definition can be questioned by a competent speaker, and we think there are at least some definitions sufficient to underwrite analytic truths, then the mere fact that a speaker can doubt a candidate analysis may not tell against that analysis. An equivalence could be analytic because competent speakers tacitly respect them, for the most part acting as if they are true (Lewis 1989, 130). It has been suggested that moral concepts are role concepts analogous to the concepts of various mental states as conceived by functionalists (Jackson and Pettit 1995). If so we should expect them to be quite complex. And their complexity might make it hard to recognize the adequacy of an analysis, even for speakers who tacitly respect the equivalence so defined.

Relatedly, some theorists have wanted to resist Hume's Law, arguing that one can in fact validly draw normative or moral conclusions from purely descriptive premises (Foot 1958–9; Searle 1964). It is actually quite difficult to find an adequate formulation that is immune to counter-example, although many theorists suspect there is nonetheless something right about Hume's claim (Humberstone 1996).

There may be a problem for those more sophisticated forms of non-cognitivism according to which moral terms have both descriptive and prescriptive or expressive meaning when these are coupled with reliance on the Open Question Argument. Suppose that the postulated extra expressive or prescriptive component in moral terms explains why competent speakers would not equate moral terms with descriptive analyses of them and that it also explains why we cannot validly infer a moral conclusion from non-moral premises. If moral terms have descriptive meaning in addition to their non-cognitive element one should be able to validly argue in the other direction. The problem is that competent speakers are just as likely to wonder about the validity of such inferences as they are to wonder about those going from descriptive premises to normative conclusions. If the openness of such questions to competent speakers is sufficient to refute claims of meaning equivalence, it should here refute theories which include descriptive meanings in an otherwise non-cognitive analysis. If the arguments that lead non-cognitivists to postulate descriptive meaning are sufficiently compelling it seems they should not rely on the open question argument to support their views.

3.2 Naturalism

Naturalism in metaphysics has been on the ascendancy for some time, though it is often somewhat difficult to ascertain exactly what the position amounts to. Metaphysical naturalists claim that there are only natural properties, in some good sense of the term ‘natural’. Usually naturalism is taken to rule out at least the existence of supernatural entities or properties. And one standard way that naturalists have defended their position has been to reduce seemingly mysterious properties or objects which might appear to be non-natural to more familiar purportedly natural properties. That is, they have tried to show that these objects or entities are nothing over and above some set of natural properties or objects appropriately arranged. One strategy is to identify seemingly suspect properties with natural properties, either via connecting definitions or through synthetic identities. In this way the seemingly suspect properties can be allowed into the naturalist's ontology without undermining the commitment to naturalism. Many naturalists have taken this approach to moral properties (Firth 1952; Railton 1986; Boyd 1988).

Non-cognitivism is not a form of reductive naturalism about the contents of moral judgments, beliefs and sentences. It does not equate the property seemingly predicated in such judgments with any natural property, precisely because it denies that the (primary) function of such expressions is to predicate properties. But in another good sense non-cognitivists are naturalists. They offer a reduction of the attitude of accepting a moral judgment to a perfectly naturalistic sort of attitude such as the attitude of approval or disapproval. And they do not postulate any properties which cannot be reduced to natural properties. Thus another motivation for accepting non-cognitivism has been naturalism. If someone doubts the prospects for reducing moral properties to natural properties (perhaps under the influence of the open question argument), they need not concede that there are any extra-natural or supernatural properties. One can simply reinterpret even the moral judgments one accepts as predicating no properties at all. Or, as with the more sophisticated versions of non-cognitivism, one can allow them to predicate natural properties and argue that the appearance that they do something other than this is due to the additional expressive component in their meaning. One's naturalism will then not commit one to giving up moral judgments or reducing moral properties to natural properties (Ayer 1952, 106–7).

3.3 Motivational internalism and the action-guiding character of moral judgments

Many non-cognitivists have argued for their theories based on motivational internalist premises. Motivational internalists believe that there is some sort of conceptual or necessary connection between moral judgments on the one hand and motivations to act on the other. (Hare 1952, 20; Brink 1989, 37ff.; Smith 1994, 60ff.) The nature of the connection is a matter of some dispute and theorists have suggested and refuted a variety of candidates (Darwall 1997). Non-cognitivists have often supported their theory by arguing from versions of judgment internalism, which postulate a necessary connection between accepting a moral judgment on the one hand and being motivated to act on it on the other. This sort of internalism is controversial, so that leading non-cognitivists have had both to defend judgment internalism and to argue that their favored theory should be accepted as the best explanation of the sort of internalism they attempt to vindicate.

You can find defenses of various versions of judgment internalism which support somewhat different but still necessary connections between accepting or uttering a moral judgment on the one hand and being motivated on the other. One version makes the connection very tight — if one accepts a judgment one is motivated to do what it says we ought to do. Others are looser, requiring motivation only in rational persons (Korsgaard 1986; Smith 1994, 61) or perhaps in normal members of a community (Dreier 1990; Horgan & Timmons 1992; 164–5). Depending on which version a theorist defends, different versions of non-cognitivism can explain the necessity of the connection, although not all versions can be easily explained using non-cognitivist resources. The tightest connection which requires motivation in anyone who accepts the judgment that some action is right is rather well explained by a very simple version of emotivism on which a judgment that some action is right conventionally expresses one's approval of that action. One can only sincerely use that expression when one has the attitude just as one can only sincerely cheer for some team or person if one has a positive attitude towards them. Sincere utterance requires motivation, that's part and parcel of this sort of emotivist theory.

On the other hand, this easy explanation of the strong internalist thesis has liabilities. Such strong internalism may be too strong to be credible insofar as it rules out amoralists — those who accept moral judgments without being at all motivated to do what they recommend. Such people may be possible and even actual (Brink 1989, 46). If so, simple emotivism of the sort described is refuted because the sincerity conditions for making the judgment require the motivation not present in the amoralist. Examples such as the amoralist have led internalists to posit more moderate, defeasible, but still necessary connections between moral judgments and motivation (Korsgaard 1986; Dreier 1990; Smith 1994). More complex versions of non-cognitivism can make the connection with actual motivation looser and thereby withstand the amoralist challenge. But not every more moderate internalist principle will be easily explained by a corresponding non-cognitivist theory. Some versions of moderate internalism require that rational people will be motivated in accordance with their own moral judgments (Smith 1994, 61). But it isn't clear what version of non-cognitivism can take advantage of this sort of defeasible connection. On any theory where the acceptance of a moral judgment is constituted by the acceptance of a non-cognitive attitude, it should be the case that those who genuinely hold the judgment have the attitude. This should apply to the irrational as well as the rational.

Other responses to the amoralist are available consistent with non-cognitivism. One such response is not to accept a defeasible version of internalism, but rather to claim that amoralists do not have genuine moral beliefs. What an amoralist expresses when she makes a moral claim that she is disinclined to honor involves using the moral predicate in an “inverted commas sense” — a sense which alludes to the value judgments of others without itself expressing such a judgment (Hare 1952, 145–6). Many cognitivists have not found this a persuasive characterization of all amoralists (Brink 1989, 46–7). Alternatively, non-cognitivists can point out that a sentence can conventionally express an attitude even when uttered by people who don't have the requisite attitude. For example, one can apologize without feeling sorry or actually caring about what is at issue (Joyce 2002). But it is not so easy to see how to carry this over to the treatment of accepting a moral judgment in the absence of uttering a moral sentence. We would like there to be grounds to attribute the belief or acceptance of a moral judgment to those who are silent on some grounds, and it isn't clear exactly what resources are available to a non-cognitivist if it doesn't involve being in some attitudinal state. Even if one can sincerely apologize without having any special feeling or attitude as one does so, it seems we would not say of a person that they were sorry unless they had such an attitude. Thus the analogy with apology only takes us so far.

Hare's most famous argument for the action-guiding character of moral judgments is the Missionaries and the Cannibals Argument. He suggests an example in which our translation practices seem to indicate that when we use moral words from our home language to translate words and concepts from another language, what is most important to us is that native users of the language or concepts generally use them to guide choice and action (Hare 1952, 148–9). If this is right, it establishes a connection of the following form: Necessarily the acceptance of a moral judgment will normally incline society members to do what is recommended by that judgment. This version will require an intention to act or something similar in most people much of the time, but it will not require such an intention from everybody all of the time. The argument thus supports a version of moderate internalism. And, according to Hare, people who utter general commands that are directed at themselves will normally but not invariably act in accordance with those commands (Hare 1952, 169). So this much of prescriptivism fits with the sort of internalism that Hare's arguments support. But, insofar as Hare also suggests that accepting a command directed at oneself requires an intention to act accordingly (Hare 1952, 20), he seems committed to a closer connection between moral judgment and motivating states than the Missionaries and Cannibals Argument vindicates.

Thus far we have been considering internalism as a reason to accept non-cognitivism based on a sort of inference to the best explanation. Insofar as non-cognitivism can explain the connection between normative or moral judgments and motivation we have some reason to accept it. But the explanations so far have relied on the positive part of non-cognitivism — the part that connects the meanings of moral terms to commendation or the expression of attitudes. The denial of cognitivism so far has played no role. Since the expressivist or prescriptivist component of non-cognitivist theories does not by itself entail the denial of cognitivism, a cognitivist could take them on board and explain a species of internalism just as non-cognitivists do (Copp 2001).

There is, however, a popular non-cognitivist strategy for arguing that they are uniquely placed to explain judgment internalism. This strategy proceeds from the Humean idea that belief alone is incapable of motivating action. The Humean Theory of Motivation, as it has come to be known, postulates that motives must always be composed of desires for some end, possibly along with some relevant means-ends belief (Hume 1888, 413; Smith 1987). The theory is supposed to rule out any state of mind which both qualifies as a cognitive state and which would be sufficient to motivate action by itself without supplementation from some independent desire. If moral judgments necessarily motivate, even in the absence of further desires, the theory seems to entail that they cannot be genuine beliefs. They must be conative rather than cognitive states, or at the very least be composites to which the non-cognitive component is essential. Even if beliefs are also constituents of the judgment, those beliefs will not be identical to it, since they can persist in the absence of motivation while the moral judgments necessitate motives (Blackburn 1998, 97–100).

This argument too can be resisted by cognitivists. It presupposes a particularly strong version of internalism. If the nature of the necessary connection between moral judgments and motives is of a defeasible kind, it will be possible for someone to accept the judgment while remaining unmotivated (Korsgaard 1986; Dreier 1990; Smith 1994). And even a stronger version of judgment internalism might be consistent with various subjectivist cognitivist theories, especially those which relativize the truth of moral judgments to individual agents. Such theories can make the truth conditions for the judgments include the presence of certain attitudes in the speaker and claim that speakers are highly accurate in tracking that part of their truth conditions (Harman 1978; Dreier 1990.). Furthermore, despite its lofty pedigree, the Humean Theory of Motivation is itself subject to dispute (Dancy 1996; Darwall 1983; Nagel 1970; McDowell 1981).

3.4 Supervenience

It is common ground among moral theorists that moral properties supervene on non-moral properties. Two items cannot differ in their moral properties without differing in some non-moral property as well. Or to put the point in terms more suited to the non-cognitivist, all agree that it is inappropriate to treat two items as morally distinguishable without believing that they are also distinguishable in some other way. If two actions are otherwise identical, labeling one as good thereby commits one to labeling the other as good.

Some non-cognitivists have argued that this uncontroversial datum supports their theories against rival alternatives. Hare seems to have introduced the term ‘supervenience’ to the philosophical literature (Hare 1952, 145) and he suggested that his own theory, universal prescriptivism, was uniquely placed to explain it. Insofar as moral prescriptions were by their nature universal they would prescribe or proscribe any action which was sufficiently similar to the action up for evaluation. Thus Hare included supervenience as one of the phenomena that any adequate metaethical theory should explain and he counted it as a point in favor of his theory that it did so. But the feature of his theory that did the explanatory work was not its non-cognitivism — rather it was that it required the judgments to be universal in the ways he specified. In fact, Hare himself suggested that the supervenience of moral judgments on descriptive features was part and parcel of these judgments having a secondary descriptive meaning (Hare 1963, 7–22).

Other contemporary expressivist theories can use a similar approach to explaining supervenience. Take a version of expressivism which says that a moral judgment that such and such an action is wrong predicates a nonmoral property of that action and at the same time expresses disapproval of that property. This too will explain supervenience, insofar as the speaker will be committed by that moral judgment to disapproving of anything else with that property. Gibbard's apparatus in which the judgments express attitudes towards norms that pick out actions by their natural features will generate the same sort of result. Thus each of these theorists will be able to explain supervenience. But of course naturalist reductionist theories will also be able to do the necessary explanatory work. If moral properties just are natural properties, there should be no surprise if two items cannot differ in their moral properties without also differing in their natural properties. We might thus conclude that supervenience does not favor either cognitivism or non-cognitivism.

Simon Blackburn, however, argues that the phenomenon of supervenience especially favors non-cognitivism. According to Blackburn, it is not just the simple fact that moral properties supervene on nonmoral properties that needs to be explained. Nor is it just that appropriate moral predication must supervene on nonmoral predication, to put the point in a way that does not beg the question against non-cognitivism. It is rather to explain how honoring the supervenience constraint can be a requirement of linguistic competence, even while there is no analytic entailment from nonmoral claims to moral claims. In other words, what needs explaining is how supervenience can be a conceptual requirement even while there is no analytic equivalence between moral properties and any non-moral property. Blackburn thinks that we require such an explanation even if there are metaphysically or nomically necessary connections between moral and nonmoral terms or properties. For, he thinks, it is hard to see how such nomic or metaphysical connections could justify the analytic status of the supervenience thesis. People can be ignorant of nomic necessities for it is an empirical matter what natural laws govern our world. And they might be ignorant of certain metaphysical necessities while knowing all the truths about the meanings of their terms. So these necessities cannot justify the apriori and analytic status that the supervenience requirement has. Or to put the same point differently, a requirement to recognize some constraint that one should recognize merely in virtue of having competence with the appropriate terms cannot be explained by citing a fact which mere linguistic competence does not put one in a position to recognize.

Blackburn's favored explanation of the difference in status between the two claims is roughly as follows: Moral judgments must supervene on judgments regarding natural properties because it is the point of moral judgments “to guide desires and choices among the natural features of the world” (Blackburn 1993, 137). Since this sort of explanation makes reference to our purposes in using moral terms rather than to an independent realm of moral fact, Blackburn thinks it supports a quasi-realist account rather than a straightforward realist theory. He goes on to suggest that because the explanation relies on facts about what beliefs can coexist with linguistic competence, there is “no further inference to a metaphysical conclusion” (Blackburn 1993, 143).

It should be obvious that Blackburn's argument is not entirely independent of the arguments for non-cognitivism that we have already surveyed. The claim that there is no analytic entailment from any natural property to any moral property is simply Hume's Law — a datum often supported through use of the open question argument. Thus any reductive naturalist about moral properties will deny that premise of the argument along with the validity of the open question argument. (Dreier 1993) The thought that an explanation which involves the practical purposes to which moral judgments are put must favor non-cognitivism over cognitivism might well depend on accepting a Humean division between inert beliefs and motivating desires. An anti-Humean might well deny that action-guiding purposes will not best be served by beliefs concerning genuine properties (McDowell 1981). And it should be no surprise that explaining the analyticity of the supervenience constraint should require claims about what the competent can believe. For the phenomena to be explained are supposed to be analytically necessary. In other words they are claims the linguistically competent must accept (Dreier 1993).

Allan Gibbard (2003) has recently proposed a new argument for expressivism grounded in his fact-prac world apparatus as a representational device for capturing normative judgments. Given that account of the content of normative judgments it will turn out to be necessary that those with moral attitudes are committed to normative judgments which treat descriptively identical items the same for purposes of planning. This is because the plans themselves must be formulated so as to individuate circumstances of action using “recognitional” concepts. Thus any two recognitionally identical circumstances will yield the same plan of action. If Gibbard's reasons for thinking that plans must be formulated in recognitional terms are cogent, this result would allow the theory to explain the relevant phenomenon of supervenience. It does not, however, show that a cogntivist theory might not do just as well on its own terms.

4. Problems, Objections and Response Strategies

One strategy of objection to non-cognitivism is to find fault with the main motivating ideas. We have already surveyed many of these in the course of discussing the arguments for non-cognitivism. We now turn to objections resting on the content of the theory rather than its motivations.

4.1 The Embedding Problem

Non-cognitivism as presented to this point is incomplete. It gives us an account of the meanings of moral expressions in free standing predicative uses, and of the states of mind expressed when they are so used. But the identical expressions can be used in more complex sentences, sentences which embed such predications. Thus far we have not considered what the expressions might mean when so used. We say things such as the following:

It is true that lying is wrong.
Lying is not wrong.
I wonder whether lying is wrong.
I believe that lying is wrong.
Fred believes that lying is wrong.
Is lying wrong?
If lying is wrong he will be sure to do it.
If lying is wrong then so is misleading truth-telling.

So, in addition to their analyses of unembedded predication, non-cognitivists owe us an account of the meanings of more complex sentences or judgments such as these. Leading contemporary non-cognitivists have all tried to provide accounts. As it turns out, the task is difficult and generates much controversy.

The task is difficult in virtue of two interrelated considerations (1). In many cases what the non-cognitivist says about the meanings of moral sentences used in simple predication cannot plausibly apply to the same sentences when embedded. For example, if a non-cognitivist says the meaning of ‘Lying is wrong’ is explained by the suggestion that it serves to express disfavor towards lying in the way that ‘Boo lying!’ might, that does not seem to be a good explanation of what the very same words are doing when they are used in many embedded contexts. For example if those words occur in the antecedent of a conditional, or when a person says, ‘I wonder if lying is wrong’ they may well not express such disapproval. Nor is there a convention which justifies competent listeners in an expectation that the speaker has such an attitude of disapproval towards lying. So more must be said to explain such embedded uses. And (2) whatever we say about the meanings of moral predications when embedded in various contexts, we would like it to make sense of the way these more complex expressions interact in inference and argument with more straightforward predicative uses of those expressions. The first consideration makes this harder to do. Normally we believe that the status of an argument as valid depends, at least in part, on the words not shifting in meaning as we move from premise to premise. But given that the noncognitivist account of the meaning of the expressions when unembedded does not straightforwardly extend to their embedded use, it is not obvious how this constraint will be met (Geach 1960, 223).

Consider the following example from Geach (1965, 463):

(P1) If tormenting the cat is bad, getting your little brother to do it is bad
(P2) Tormenting the cat is bad.
Ergo, getting your little brother to torment the cat is bad.

The argument is valid. But if the entire meaning of ‘tormenting the cat is bad’ in the second premise is well explained by saying that it is suited for use in expressing disapproval of tormenting the cat, then that meaning cannot be the same as the meaning it has in the first premise (which one might accept even if one approves of tormenting cats). This doesn't show that the expression is not being used emotively in the second premise; a descriptivist can agree to that. But it does indicate that more will need to be said to explain what is going on. For straightforwardly descriptive arguments of the same form, the explanation of why the argument is valid relies on the idea that the phrase in the antecedent has a constant meaning that it represents both unembedded and embedded. This is what Geach has called The Frege Point: “A thought may have just the same content whether you assent to its truth or not; a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition” (Geach 1965, 449). As Geach saw it, we need to think of predication as constant across embedded and unembedded occurrences of predicative moral sentences so as not to commit a fallacy of equivocation in making arguments.

But the negative component of the non-cognitivist position, that moral judgments do not express propositions or predicate properties, seems to rule out this way of explaining matters. If there is no proposition expressed in normal predicative uses of moral expressions we eliminate one candidate for a constant element that generates relations of implication with other expressions embedding the same form of words. If there is no common thing predicated by such sentences, whether embedded or not, it is hard to see what their meanings have in common across these contexts. This is the problem known variously as the Embedding Problem, Geach's Problem, the Frege/Geach Problem and the Frege/Geach/Searle problem in honor of it's two earliest discussants (Geach 1957–58, 1960 & 1965; Searle 1962) and of Frege to whom Geach credited the basic insight.

There seem to be two main ways to try and offer a non-cognitivist solution to this challenge. One approach is to accept Geach's diagnosis and try to find a common element of meaning among the different uses of the same predicative expressions. This common element could then be used to underwrite relations of logical implication in roughly the way that ordinary propositions are used. The alternative approach is to give a different sort of explanation for the seeming relations of implication between such judgments or sentences. We'll examine this second method first as it has been most popular.

4.1.1 A logic of attitudes

One way to start from scratch without accepting the Frege Point is to postulate a logic of attitudes which licenses inferences between the appropriate judgments. The general idea is that if there are norms of correct inference that hold between various judgments which require us to accept one when we accept another, we can use those norms to underwrite the relations of logical implication that we intuitively accept among moral judgments. Thus this strategy attempts to reverse the usual order of explanation for why we infer as we do. We standardly begin by pointing out relations of implications between the contents of the judgments that form the premises and conclusion of an argument and from there we derive a justification for accepting the conclusion based on the premises. For example, one justification would be to postulate norms of belief revision that require us to try (other things equal) to eschew inconsistency in the contents of our thoughts. By contrast the approach under consideration starts with norms governing the consistency of attitudes that do not depend on prior relations of implication or consistency among their contents. It then tries to generate relations of implication and consistency between judgments by invoking these independent norms.

Most such accounts begin by giving plausible accounts of the entire judgments in which simpler moral explanations are embedded. These accounts might analyze them either as complex beliefs (Blackburn 1971) or as further non-cognitive expressive judgments (Blackburn 1984). These judgments should be such as to have rational connections to the other judgments that are likely to play a role in valid arguments. If all goes well, a kind of pragmatic incoherence or irrationality will be involved when someone accepts the judgments of a valid argument so analyzed while at the same time rejecting the conclusion. Such a speaker would be in a state similar to those uttering sentences of the sort that feature in Moore's paradox, such as ‘It is raining but I don't believe that it is.’

A simple example of this sort of approach comes from Blackburn. Conditionals express higher order attitudes towards accepting certain conjunctions of attitudes. “If lying is wrong, telling your little brother to lie is wrong,” (when sincerely uttered) expresses approval of making disapproval of getting one's brother to lie “follow upon” disapproval of lying.

…Anyone holding this pair [the above attitude, plus the attitude expressed by ‘lying is wrong’] must hold the consequential disapproval: he is committed to disapproving of getting little brother to lie, for if he does not his attitudes clash. He has a fractured sensibility which cannot itself be an object of approval. (Blackburn 1984, 195)

Logical entailments involving moral judgments are explained as follows: A constellation of attitudes which includes the attitudes expressed by the conditional and by the seemingly assertive premises but not those expressed by the conclusion is irrational, because it goes against the purposes of moral discourse. Somewhat more sophisticated ways of working out this strategy can be found in several places, including further work by Blackburn himself (1988b), but the basic idea is well exemplified in this proposal.

The proposal also well exemplifies the program of quasi-realism. By displaying our practices of inference as making sense despite their non-cognitivist roots, Blackburn hopes to vindicate those practices. If the program goes through for enough of our standard ways of speaking and reasoning, including the other embedded contexts not currently under discussion, he hopes to show how we can “earn the right” to talk as if these judgments are true.

The logic of attitudes strategy has met with much resistance on the part of cognitivists. It seems to many that the answer conflates genuine inconsistency with mere pragmatic incoherence (Hale 1986; Schueler 1988; Brighouse 1990; Zangwill 1992; van Roojen 1996). In fact it might seem that this is obvious; if we define validity or entailment in terms of truth preservation, arguments with purely non-cognitive premises will not even be candidates for validity and relations among them will not be entailments.

This quick way of arguing that the strategy involves conflation is probably too quick as these critics largely recognize. Even before Geach raised his version of the challenge to non-cognitivism, Hare pointed out that there can be relations between commands that are very much like the logical relations between descriptive utterances, so much like them that we would expect them to receive a common explanation. ‘If it is raining, take an umbrella,’ and ‘If it is raining, you will take an umbrella,’ interact logically with ‘It is raining’ in very similar ways and seemingly for similar reasons. This inspired Hare to invent a model of linguistic meaning with two components. One, the phrastic, to represent states of affairs, and the other, the neustic, to function as something like a mood indicator. The neustic indicates what speech-act is being performed with the phrastic. It might be asserted or denied, prescribed or proscribed, and so on (Hare 1952, 17–22). Hare hoped that the logical connectives could be included as parts of the phrastic (Hare 1952, 21), so that a common set of logical rules could be used to explain most of the standard inferences in any mood using some standard logical principle relating judgments involving those connectives. Nevertheless he did include some extra rules, such as a rule forbidding imperatival conclusions based on premises that include no imperatives.

The payoff was supposed to be a unification of logic for sentences in various moods, including moral sentences which Hare thought were a species of universal imperative. A full assessment of the adequacy of the system would be beyond the scope of this entry. It is not obvious how the proposal is supposed to work in full generality, and it is hard to see how treating logical connectives solely as components of the phrastics can do all the needed work. But the phenomenon that Hare was pointing to — that the relations between certain imperatives are very much like those between similar descriptions — gives non-cognitivists a response to the objection that only genuinely truth-apt judgments can stand in logical relations to one another.

Critics of explaining logic in terms of rational or pragmatic relations between attitudes can grant Hare's basic point. That prescriptions can stand in logical relations to one another does not entail that pragmatic or similar coherence or incoherence forms the basis of these relations. Many skeptics about the strategy have done their best to work out the details of the suggested logic of attitudes. By considering various intuitively available judgments and applying the non-cognitivist accounts to them they have aimed to uncover logical relations that are not easily captured using this approach (Hale 1993, 354). Many of the specific criticisms turn on the details of the particular proposals up for assessment, but there are some more general complaints that seem to recur.

Perhaps the simplest criticism has to do with “the negation problem” for expressivist theories. One datum to be explained is the logical inconsistency of the sentences “Murdering is wrong,” and its negation, “Murdering is not wrong.” The logic of attitudes approach does this by mapping each onto an attitude which it expresses and then showing that the attitudes in question are inconsistent or disagree with one another. Intuitively the first sentence expresses disapproval of murdering. The problem now is to find an attitude incompatible with it and which plausibly is expressed by the second sentence. And it turns out to be difficult to find an attitude to do the job.

There are three ways to negate the claim that Fred believes that murder is wrong:

(1) Fred does not believe that murdering is wrong.
(2) Fred believes that not murdering is wrong.
(3) Fred believes that murdering is not wrong.

Intuitively these ascribe different states of mind to Fred, and the third ascribes the attitude expressed by our target sentence. But when we negate the attitude ascription constitutive of the simple expressivist analysis (Fred disapproves of murdering) we don't have enough candidate attitudes to capture all three. We have only:

(1*) Fred does not disapprove of murdering. And,
(2*) Fred disapproves of not murdering.

And these plausibly correspond to the first two attitudes towards murder expressed in (1) and (2). But it is the third which ascribes belief in the negation of the claim that murder is wrong, so we have not yet got our explanation.(Unwin 1999, 2001; Hale 2002; Schroeder 2008a).

A more general (but not necessarily more fundamental) criticism emphasizes that the strategy of reducing logical inconsistency to attitudinal incoherence requires us to find the former whenever we find the latter. An advocate of one version of the logic of attitudes approach is committed to finding inconsistency in what seem to be merely Moore-paradoxical sentences involving morality, such as ‘Laughing is wrong, but I don't believe that it is.’ If inconsistency is to be explained via the relations between attitudes, any way of expressing those same attitudes will be inconsistent. Since other sentences may also express the very same attitudes as moral judgments express, these too will have to stand in the same logical relations to other sentences that moral judgments expressive of those attitudes will. That can force the theory to be highly revisionary of our ordinary judgments about logical consistency and implication. Any sentence or set of sentences, moral or otherwise, which expresses commitments that the approach rules incoherent and hence inconsistent will also have to count as inconsistent. Yet this can conflict with our ordinary judgments about such cases. Normally, for example, we regard Moore-paradoxical sentences as consistent but self defeating. But if the Moore-paradoxicality of a set of moral attitudes is supposed to justify counting moral judgemets that express them as inconsistent, we should regard these sentences as inconsistent. And if that is true for Moore-paradoxical moral sentences, it should also go for Moore-paradoxical nonmoral sentences. Yet that is not how we are pretheoretically inclined to view them (van Roojen 1996).

This is not to say that there are not ways forward for the non-cognitivists. (Dreier 2006, Horgan and Timmons 2006b, Schroeder 2008b, 2008c). One strategy is to back away from pragmatic incoherence as the explanation of the inconsistency in question while sticking with the idea that the basic explanatory resource is the incompatibility of some attitudes with others. Horgan and Timmons (2006b) postulate an infinite hierarchy of primitive inconsistency relations between the attitudes which are expressed using the sentences which we pre-theoretically regard as inconsistent. For example, they postulate that the attitude expressed by ‘Lying is wrong,’ is inconsistent with the attitude expressed by ‘Lying is not wrong’. But they say no more to explain why this is so. It is just a primitive fact about these attitudes (and many others) that they have this sort of incompatibility. The large number of primitive incompatibilities postulated by the theory makes critics worry that no real explanatory work is being done. (Schroeder 2008a, 2008b) It seems at least that all should agree we would at least have a more unified account if we could construct the story with fewer primative inconsistencies.

It may yet be possible to do something of this sort. Dreier (2006) suggests that non-cognitivists might be able to give a plausible explanation of inconsistency if they can find a way to distinguish between indifference and indecision. And he makes some suggestions for how that may be done. Schroeder (2008b, 2008c) suggests that the non-cognitivist may yet be able to make considerable headway with the logic of attitudes, but only if she is willing to accept some revisions to our pre-theoretic view of various matters. He suggests that the essential problem is that there is not enough structure to the judgments postulated by the standard non-cognitivist accounts to distinguish all of the attitudes necessary to stand in the appropriate logical relations. And, he suggests, an expressivist can generate enough structure by complicating the story about what the attitudes in question are attitudes towards. The specific proposal is to that 'lying is wrong' (for example) expresses a noncognitive attitude not directly towards lying but towards blaming for lying. If that attitude is itself incompatible with holding the very same attitude towards not blaming for lying, the resulting account can be used to give a unified story about consistency and inconsistency among non-cognitive attitudes. Adding this extra structure into the attitudes creates more places to insert negations to generate the full range of attitudes it seems a person can have. An extension to sentences embedding both moral and non-moral judgments adds more complication and has the upshot that all judgments would need to express a basic non-cognitive attitude towards actions. (Schroeder, 2008c)

Many non-cognitivists have by and large remained unimpressed with cognitivist complaints about embedding (Blackburn 1998, 72). In fact, it appears that there is not really even agreement on what the problem is. Those urging Geach's objection think that it needs to be explained why moral arguments are genuinely valid, where validity is a logical relation between contents of judgments. Thus they are unhappy with the entire logic of attitudes approach precisely because it tries to find the primary ground of implication in rational relations between the judgments considered as attitudes rather than the contents. Many non-cognitivists, on the other hand, think that the task is to explain why we reason as we do (Bjornsen 2001), or perhaps why it is rational to reason as we do. And they may suggest that this last verdict is itself just one more non-cognitive judgment.

4.1.2 A logic of contents

Non-cognitivists can meet the challenge on their critics' terms if they can get an alternative approach to work. The alternative uses the alleged descriptive meanings of moral judgments to generate the required logical relations. No party to the debate denies that descriptions can stand in logical relations to one another. Thus some non-cognitivists hope to explain logical relations by using the secondary descriptive component in the meanings of moral terms postulated by some versions of non-cognitivism.

According to the main variants of this approach, this secondary component picks out a descriptive property determined by the moral attitudes of the speaker. If the speaker morally approves of all and only sweet things, then this property is sweetness. An ordinary judgment that such and such is right might then in a secondary way predicate sweetness. If the speaker morally disapproves of all and only the sour things then her judgments of wrongness predicate sourness as the secondary descriptive meaning. And so on. In embedded contexts, this secondary component becomes the semantic value of the embedded moral expression. ‘If lying is wrong, then he will lie,’ has an antecedent whose embedded content is the same as a statement predicating the property on which the speaker's moral disapproval supervenes. Thus, continuing with our example, the sentence says the same thing as, ‘If lying is sour, then he will lie.’ And the content of this conditional will interact with the secondary descriptive meaning of the unembedded moral judgments to determine its logical functioning so that we get the implications we would expect. Differing proposals of this general sort say somewhat different things about exactly how the descriptive content is expressed (Barker 2000; Ridge 2006) or quasi-expressed (Jackson 1999), but the basic idea is worked out in similar ways.

Cognitivists can raise doubts about the adequacy of these proposals due to the way the descriptive meaning is determined. If it is the actual attitudes of the speaker that determine the property, a speaker may not use the same term to pick out the same property in each premise of the argument. For she may have had one attitude when she considers earlier premises, only to change her attitude during the course of the overall argument. Thus Geach's original charge of equivocation might still be appropriate in some circumstances (van Roojen 2005). Worries of this sort make expressivist theories which are at the same time cognitivist (Copp 2001, Boisvert 2008) more attractive because they can claim many of the attractions of expressivism without the cost of seeming equivocation.

Many people suspect that the technical apparatus introduced by Allan Gibbard (1990) leaves his theory well positioned to solve the embedding problem. Gibbard suggests we can use an extension of possible worlds semantics to capture normative contents consistent with his norm expressivist analysis. The extension generates a set of world-norm pairs by pairing each possible world with each possible set of consistent and complete norms. Consistent complete sets of norms divide naturalistically described act-types into those which are permitted, required, or forbidden in such a way that no action can be both required or permitted and also forbidden. Sets of these pairs are then used to represent the contents of moral judgments. On Gibbard's preferred way of doing this, particular judgments rule out sets of these pairs. For example, judging an action forbidden will rule out any pair in which the world member of the pair represents the action as satisfying a complete naturalistic description which is not sufficient to classify an action as forbidden according to the set of norms forming the second member. The set of the remaining pairs which the judgments do not rule out represent the contents of the judgments.

From here the approach is further extended to handle the contents of conjunctions, disjunctions, and conditionals and to explain how these interact logically. Contents of conjunctions are the intersections of the sets representing their conjuncts. Contents of disjunctions are the unions of the sets representing the contents of the disjuncts. Contents of conditionals will be the union of the set representing the negation of the antecedent and the set representing the consequent. Judgments are inconsistent if the intersection of their contents is empty. Arguments are valid if the premises are inconsistent with the denial of the conclusion (Gibbard 1990, chapter 5).

One way to view the moral of Geach and Searle's objections is that the problem for non-cognitivism is due to the theory not making a distinction between the contents of a sentence on the one hand, and the speech act for which the sentence is being used. This is why Searle accuses non-cognitivists of committing the “speech act fallacy.” It is plausible that sentences bear their logical relations to one another in virtue of their contents, and not in virtue of the speech act that they are used to accomplish. What seems to be needed is a way for non-cognitivists to distinguish the contents of a sentence from the force with which it is used. If one thinks of Gibbard's sets of world-norm pairs as capturing the contents of the moral sentences, it looks as if that apparatus allows non-cognitivists to make the relevant distinctions (Dreier 1998). The suggestion is especially attractive in light of the fact that Gibbard's apparatus can be adapted to work with any model theory for propositional attitudes that a theorist might use to replace possible worlds (Dreier 1999).

On the other hand, it is not easy to say whether the apparatus is best interpreted as capturing the contents of distinctively non-cognitive mental states. This won't be a problem for noncognitivism if the apparatus is only playing the role of a model to map independently determined logical relations. But if the world-norm pair apparatus is used to generate genuine contents for the judgments in question — contents which are independent of the force with which sentences are used and which explain the logical relations among them, it might be worrisome that the contents are not distinctively noncognitivist. World-norm pairs might be used to capture the thoughts of a moral realist who believes that there are genuine moral properties supervening on the natural properties of the world. The possible worlds component of the model would represent beliefs about the supervenience base, while the norms would be needed to represent a person's beliefs involving the supervenient moral properties. On this proposal the norms would be needed to represent the contents of the realist's thought because different realist theories might have the moral properties supervene on different nonmoral properties and a person could be a realist without being committed to the truth of any particular realist theory. An opinionated realist might have views about the exact supervenience relation which would be represented by a set of pairs in which the second member — the norms — was the same for each pair in the set. But a less opinionated realist might have her beliefs represented by a set in which the second member varied. Similarly, indexical relativism can also make use of the apparatus to represent moral beliefs consistent with its analysis (Dreier 1999).

Debate in this realm continues to be robust with much of the argument turning on issues which require a great deal of attention to detail.

4.1.3 Minimalism as offering a solution to the problem

It has been suggested that minimalism or deflationism about truth or truth aptness can ride to the rescue of non-cognitivists at this point. If so, perhaps the non-cognitivist can bypass the above debates. A very rough characterization of minimalism will hopefully suffice to explain. Minimalist theories are often presented by contrast with theories of truth according to which truth is some sort of “substantial” relation or property. For example correspondence theories which claim that truth involves a real relation between truth-bearers and reality are often cited as paradigm cases of the contrast class. Minimalists about truth suggest that truth is not such a substantial property. Others propound a version of minimalism by claiming that to understand what truth is one need not grasp anything more substantial than some rather minimal claims. These proponents suggest that the minimal claims needed are insufficient to require anything very substantial that all truths must have in common. Different minimalists formulate these claims in somewhat different ways: Some suggest that what one needs to know is simply that calling a sentence true is just to assert or affirm the sentence (Ramsey 1927). Others hold that sentences of the form ‘S is true’ can generally be replaced by ‘S’. Still others suggest that one has only to accept the theory consisting of all the sentences of Tarski's Schema T — ‘S’ is true iff S — where the sentence ‘S’ is mentioned on the left hand side and used on the right hand side. And others require that one accept all propositions of the form: The proposition that P is true iff P (Horwich 1990, 18–22). More would need to be said to give a full explanation of deflationism about truth, but this should suffice for our purposes.

For more detail on minimalism see the entry on deflationary theories of truth.

It should be reasonably obvious how deflationism about truth can help with one sort of embedded context — those in which a moral sentence follows ‘It is true that.’ If expressivists can give us an adequate account of a moral sentence, such as ‘Teasing the cat is wrong,’ then deflationism tells us that the same account should be sufficient for sentences like ‘It is true that teasing the cat is wrong.’ But it has been suggested that minimalism can provide help in other contexts as well (Blackburn 1988; Stoljar 1993; Horwich 1993). The thought seems to be that all it takes to solve the embedding problem is for it to be appropriate to call moral sentences true, and for those sentences to embed grammatically in longer sentences in the usual ways, and lastly for us to make the usual inferences. Minimalism about truth plus the non-cognitivist account of the use of moral utterances secures the first requirement, while the indicative form of the relevant atomic moral sentences plus our linguistic practices of allowing them to embed wherever predicative sentences embed secures the latter. The motivating ideas here may be as follows: We know how to explain the meanings of more complicated truth-functional embeddings by showing how the truth values of the whole are functions of the truth-values of the component sentences. Minimalism allows us to generate a minimal truth condition for any meaningful indicative sentence, such as ‘Lying is wrong’ is true iff lying is wrong. So minimalism might put the non-cognitivist in a position to make sense of sentences embedding moral predications just as we make sense of any sentences embedding any predications by building up from the truth conditions of the component sentences. And the minimalist non-cognitivist can attempt to avoid Geach's charge of equivocation by suggesting that the minimal truth condition is the meaning of normative predications whether asserted or embedded. The resulting position will be a version of non-cognitivism so long as minimal truth conditions can be distinguished from more robust truth conditions, and so long as the negative non-cognitivist claims are construed in the more robust way (Stoljar 1993, 93). Alternatively non-cognitivists might try to use more robust notions of representation or propertyhood, and use them to deny the representational nature of moral sentences or that they predicate properties, and contrast them with other, fully cognitive discourse, while using minimalist truth conditions to handle embeddings.

Things may not be as easy as this for the minimalist non-cognitivist. An example of Dreier's can be used to make the point. He imagines a predicate, ‘hiyo’. The term is used in getting someone's attention. It evolved in the following way: Early on speakers would say ‘Hiyo Bob!’ upon meeting up with Bob as a way of getting Bob's attention. Soon the practice evolved further. Speakers began to utter ‘Bob is hiyo,’ to perform the same speech act as they had previously performed by uttering ‘Hiyo Bob!’ Suppose now that a theorist wants to explain the meaning of ‘hiyo’. The theorist can begin by presenting a speech act account of that meaning — ‘hiyo’ is used in the speech act of accosting someone. The theorist then adds to this explanation an inference-rule account of the meanings of sentential connectives, such as ‘and’, ‘or’, ‘if … then’. The sentence, ‘Bob is hiyo’ is well formed, and it embeds grammatically in longer sentences. The theorist has explained the functioning of those longer sentences by specifying via inference-rules how they interact with yet further sentences to mediate inference. It would thus seem that the account is on a par with those versions of non-cognitivism which try to use minimalism by itself to solve the embedding problem. If those accounts are adequate we should know what ‘If Bob is hiyo, then there is a dingo about,’ means. But, Dreier suspects we won't know and he concludes that the same holds for the parallel strategy with respect to moral utterances. More than this will be needed to elucidate the meanings of normative predications in such embedded contexts (Dreier 1996, 42–44. At this stage of the literature, it remains controversial what more, if anything, is needed, but the general point is quite powerful (Sinnott-Armstrong, 2000).

Fictionalism can bypass much of this debate while defending psychological non-cognitivism. Recall that fictionalists accept psychological non-cognitivism, but reject semantic nonfactualism. Thus the semantics of moral sentences is just as the realist says it is. Moral sentences do predicate properties both in their free-standing uses and when embedded (MacIntrye 1981; Kalderon 2005) . Hence the fictionalist postulates no equivocation and can use whatever a realist is entitled to use to explain relations of implications between contents. The fictionalist would be free from the task of solving Geach's problem taken as the task of explaining why modus ponens and other forms of inference validly apply to moral utterances (Kalderon 2005). But she does shoulder the related task of making sense of moral reasoning, and of explaining the point of fictive use of moral sentences. In this latter task she may have at her disposal many of the resources and arguments proposed by fully non-cognitivist theories.

4.2 The Wishful Thinking Objection

A recent objection to non-cognitivism pays close attention to the distinction between explaining logical relations on the one hand, and explaining the use of moral judgments in reasoning on the other. Even if the embedding problem is solved, so that we know what moral utterances mean and what complex sentences embedding them also mean, we might still think it irrational to reason in accordance with ordinary logical principles applied to such judgments. The basic idea here is that conditionals with moral antecedents and nonmoral consequents should, together with the moral judgment in the antecedent, license acceptance of the consequent. Thus someone who accepts such conditionals would be rational to infer the consequent upon coming to accept the antecedent. But if expressivism is correct, accepting the antecedent just is holding a non-cognitive attitude. Thus the licensed inference is really a form of wishful thinking, for a non-cognitive change of attitude has licensed a change of belief. For example, suppose someone accepts a judgment expressible by saying, if doing an action is wrong, George will do it. Normally we think that it would be rational for that person to infer the belief that George will hit Sam upon coming to accept that hitting Sam is wrong. But, according to noncognitivism, coming to accept that hitting Sam is wrong is just a change of non-cognitive attitude, and it can seem wrong to think that a change in such attitudes can rationalize a change in belief. It looks like the non-cognitivist is committed to approving of something analogous to wishful thinking. That is they believe something, not because of a change in their evidence, but because of a change in attitude alone (Dorr 2002). Non-cognitivists will resist by suggesting that the conditionals themselves are only rational to accept when one thinks that changes of mind about the antecedent will depend on beliefs about facts that are evidentially relevant to the conclusion. How far this strategy can be made to work is as yet an open question.

4.3 Non-cognitivism and Relativism

It has seemed obvious to many that non-cognitivism has much in common with various relativist metaethical views. Though non-cognitivists may deny that the truth values of moral judgments are relative to speakers or agents because such judgments have no truth values, non-cognitivists often have accepted something similar to relativism. For non-cognitivists hold that it is semantically appropriate for a person to utter a moral judgment whenever she wishes to express the relevant non-cognitive attitude. If there are few rational constraints on holding the relevant attitude, as most non-cognitivists believe, consistent moral judgments cannot be mistaken (Carnap 1937, 30; Hare 1963, 110). If relativism is problematic, it isn't obvious that non-cognitivism avoids the problems.

Still many non-cognitivists have argued that the view does not entail or justify relativism. They claim that whether or not a moral judgment is mistaken is itself a matter for moral theorizing. A speaker should only call a moral judgment true if he or she accepts that judgment. A speaker who expresses his or her acceptance of relativism in the normal way would then seem to be expressing commitment to a very deferential moral theory. What seems to be a higher level metaethical claim that no consistent set of moral judgments is mistaken, is really just another moral judgment and hence one which would be rejected by any moral judge with substantive moral commitments (Blackburn 1998, 296 & 304; Timmons 1999). If this line of argument works it will allow non-cognitivism to gain the allegiance of those who wish to deny relativism while giving the motivations that lead to both it and non-cognitivism their due.

4.4 Capturing The Varieties of Normative Ethical Theories Within A Non-cognitivist Metaethic

Many think it a desideratum in metaethical theorizing that a candidate theory be consistent with all or most normative theories actually defended by serious normative ethical proponents. This idea has played some role in the debate over the embedding problem insofar as some of the proposals have been inconsistent with substantive positions taken in the debate about the possibility of moral dilemmas. (van Roojen 1996, 324; Gibbard 1990, 88.) But even aside from that particular issue, the desideratum can make a good deal of work for the non-cognitivist because of the variety of kinds of moral theory and the variety of differing but allegedly consistent judgments proposed by theorists.

A simple example involves what a non-cognitivist should say to differentiate related but differing moral judgments about what is right and what is good. According to standard non-consequentialist theories, rightness and goodness can come apart. In other words, a right action can be such as not to produce the most goodness. Of course consequentialists deny this, and non-consequentialists who use agent-relative values to specify the rightness of actions can also deny that rightness and goodness come apart in this way (Broome 1991, chapter 1). But even if they are incorrect as a matter of substantive moral philosophy, it would seem that competent moral judges can hold views of the sort described without contradiction. Non-cognitivists would like to be able to give an explanation of this consistent with their analyses. Hence they need a way of distinguishing judgments of rightness and judgments of goodness.

A simple strategy might be to claim that they attach to different things — rightness to actions and goodness to states of affairs. But it isn't obvious that no competent speaker could consistently judge an action right but not good. Another strategy would be to distinguish varieties of positive attitudes such that one sort involves a kind of approval distinctive of rightness, whereas another involves a kind distinctive of goodness. Yet another method would be to use something like the two step approach Gibbard uses when he analyzes judgments of rightness in terms of judging it rationally appropriate to feel guilt and anger at certain actions. The approval could be all of the same sort, but the objects of approval might be feelings of guilt in one case and feelings of sorrow in the other, even when these feelings are directed at one and the same object such as an action. No doubt there are other available strategies so the problem does not by itself constitute an objection. It can however complicate the task of constructing and adequate non-cognitivist theory, especially since it can impact the force of other objections as with the embedding problem and moral dilemmas noted above.

A discussion of an additional issue raised in trying to account for the variety of moral judgments with in a non-cognitivist framework is found in the following supplementary document.

Supplement on Agent-Centered Teleology

5. Can The Cognitivist/Non-cognitivist Distinction Be Sustained?

Non-cognitivist success in handling the embedding problem and related worries about reasoning would put non-cognitivists in a stronger argumentative position. But recently some commentators have suggested that success at this endeavor might be a mixed blessing. Success may indicate not that non-cognitivism is the right account of moral judgments, but instead that the contrast with cognitivism is not stark enough to make out a real distinction. Perhaps the distinction between cognitivism and non-cognitivism collapses as non-cognitivist theories are modified to capture all of the phenomena that cognitivists challenge them to explain. While both its advocates and those who argued strenuously against it would likely find themselves somewhat disoriented if this were correct, it does seem that noncognitivists would be most upset by this result. For that position was defined by denying key components of standard realist positions. If the cognitivist/noncognitivist dichotomy does not hold up, it would seem to show either that the standard positions were not after all committed to those components, or that those commitments could not be avoided by plausible theories.

Early versions of non-cognitivism did not seem subject to this sort of objection, precisely because they did not worry much about vindicating overall moral practice. Carnap (1937, 30–31) was happy to convict ordinary moral thinking of error. But as non-cognitivists have attempted to make sense of and explain most of the seemingly realist features of moral practice, it might seem hard to sustain the claim of a sharp contrast between factual language on the one hand and normative language on the other. Several challenges based on roughly this idea find a home in the recent literature.

5.1 Sophisticated Non-cognitivism vs. Sophisticated Cognitivist Relativism

One way to push the point is to challenge the non-cognitivist to distinguish non-cognitivism from cognitivist relativism. A speaker relativist is in a particularly good position to highlight the suggestion that there is little difference between sophisticated non-cognitivism and cognitivism. Both speaker relativists and non-cognitivists can say that the appropriateness of a moral judgment depends on a speaker's attitudes. If the non-cognitivist suggests that moral judgments predicate properties in a secondary way (perhaps to handle embedding), the cognitivist relativist can agree. And the theories can agree that the property predicated is determined as a function of the speaker's moral attitudes. Thus it becomes increasingly difficult to say precisely what the difference between the views is (Dreier 1999).

5.2 Minimalism as Undermining Non-cognitivism

Another line of argument with a similar upshot proceeds from minimalism of the sort we have already canvassed. Deflationism about truth or truth-aptness can be used to argue that there is no room for non-cognitivism of the sort that succeeds in vindicating much of moral practice. If there is no more robust understanding of truth conditions than can be secured by minimalism about truth conditions, it will be impossible for the non-cognitivist to make her distinctive negative claims short of accepting an error theory about a large share of our moral practices. Suppose that all that there is to be a cognitive enterprise or to have truth conditions is to meet certain minimal requirements — requirements that will have to be vindicated in order to make non-cognitivism plausible. Then, if the quasi-realist program succeeds, there will be no way to distinguish plausible non-cognitivism from cognitivism.

More concretely, some have proposed that all that is needed to have minimal truth conditions is for a set of judgments to satisfy two constraints: (1) Sentences composed of the relevant expressions must exhibit the syntactic surface features of paradigmatic truth-apt sentences such as assertions, and they must embed grammatically in more complex sentences such as conditionals, propositional attitude ascriptions, and so on. (2) Use of these expressions must exhibit a certain amount of discipline so that there are clearly appropriate and inappropriate conditions for using them in sentences of the form noted in the first condition (Boghossian 1990, Wright 1993; Divers and Miller 1994). Normative discourse seems to meet both of these constraints relatively straightforwardly. If minimal truth conditionality is all that is needed for a domain of discourse to count as factual, then moral discourse will be factual and semantic nonfactualism about morality and normativity will be mistaken (Divers and Miller 1994).

But it is controversial whether this is all that is required for either minimal or full truth conditionality. One possible and controversial moral of Dreier's ‘Hiyo’ example may be that we could accomplish a number of different speech acts using an utterance with the syntactic surface features of paradigmatically truth-apt sentences. If sentences with such characteristics do not embed appropriately into more complex sentences, it would not seem to be ruled out by grammar alone. Thus if there is to be a meaningful division of discourse into truth-apt and non-truth-apt bits, the weight seems to fall on the discipline criterion. With respect to the ‘Hiyo’ story, the free-standing assertive uses have been stipulatively created to perform a speech act. These then will satisfy the discipline criterion. Depending on how much discipline is needed for embedded uses of the target expressions, the standards for truth-aptness might be very low. Theorists will differ about the persuasiveness of these considerations.

Those persuaded by these sorts of argument will think that more is needed to generate standards for truth-aptness with credible bite. Many regard it as a platitude about assertive utterances that they can be conventionally used to express beliefs. Perhaps even minimal criteria for truth-apt discourse should require that assertions can play this role. But if that is one of the criteria, non-cognitivists will be in a position to use psychological non-cognitivism as a reason to deny that moral judgments are truth-apt (Jackson, Oppy, Smith 1994). Psychological non-cognitivism would support semantic nonfactualism. Another strategy is to find a semantic difference between paradigmatic truth-apt sentences and sentences which can plausibly be given an expressive or prescriptive analysis. One suggestion is that paradigmatic truth-apt sentences cannot be replaced with imperatives, whereas those for which non-cognitivism is the right account can be (Lenman 2003).

5.3 Non-cognitivist Overreaching and Possible Collapse

One final sort of worry about the distinctiveness of non-cognitivism is worthy of mention. This worry is that if too many domains of discourse are such that they require non-cognitive analysis, the contrast between cognitive and non-cognitive domains on which the view depends will be hard to sustain. Blackburn, for example, suggests quasi-realist approaches not just to moral discourse, but also to modality, causation and probability. One may wonder what he means to deny about these domains that is not also applicable to the rest of our seemingly contentful judgments (Rosen 1998). Even Blackburn himself on occasion expresses worries about this problem (Blackburn 1993, 34), but more commonly he and other non-cognitivists resist the worry by pointing to other domains of discourse which are not amenable to non-cognitivist analysis.

A short discussion of a different collapse argument employed against noncognitivism by Jackson and Pettit which has generated quite a bit of literature can be found in the following supplementary document.

Supplement on Assertion Conditions and Truth-Conditionality

6. Conclusion

Non-cognitivism first came on the scene as a rather starkly drawn alternative to prevailing cognitivist and realist construals of moral discourse. As it developed to enable it to explain features of moral discourse relied on by its critics, the view became more subtle and presented a less stark contrast with realist positions. The main negative claims were often somewhat moderated. For example, the claim that moral judgments had no descriptive meaning evolved into a claim that any such meanings were secondary. The claim that moral judgments could not be true or false became the claim that they could be true or false only in a minimal or deflationary sense. Not all of the shifts have been embraced by all non-cognitivists, but it is fair to say that current versions are more complex and subtle than the theories from which they descend. As a result the arguments for and against the views have gotten rather intricate and even technical. That trend is likely to continue for at least a while longer as ideas from other areas of philosophy are employed to further hone the objections and fill out the responses to them.


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non-naturalism, moral


The author thanks David Copp, Mark Decker, Jennifer Haley, Leo Iacano, Mark Kalderon, Clayton Littlejohn, Joe Mendola, Michael Ridge, and Mark Schroeder for good advice and useful help in preparing this entry. The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas for spotting several typographical errors in this entry.