Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Moral Luck

First published Mon Jan 26, 2004; substantive revision Tue Jun 3, 2008

Moral luck occurs when an agent can be correctly treated as an object of moral judgment despite the fact that a significant aspect of what she is assessed for depends on factors beyond her control. Bernard Williams writes, “when I first introduced the expression moral luck, I expected to suggest an oxymoron” (Williams 1993, 251). Indeed, immunity from luck has been thought by many to be part of the very essence of morality. And yet, as Williams (1981) and Thomas Nagel (1979) showed in their now classic pair of articles, it appears that our everyday judgments and practices commit us to the existence of moral luck. The problem of moral luck arises because we seem to be committed to the general principle that we are morally assessable only to the extent that what we are assessed for depends on factors under our control (call this the “Control Principle”). At the same time, when it comes to countless particular cases, we morally assess agents for things that depend on factors that are not in their control. And making the situation still more problematic is the fact that a very natural line of reasoning suggests that it is impossible to morally assess anyone for anything if we adhere to the Control Principle.

1. Generating the Problem of Moral Luck and Kinds of Luck

The idea that morality is immune from luck finds inspiration in Kant:

A good will is not good because of what it effects or accomplishes, because of its fitness to attain some proposed end, but only because of its volition, that is, it is good in itself… Even if, by a special disfavor of fortune or by the niggardly provision of a step motherly nature, this will should wholly lack the capacity to carry out its purpose — if with its greatest efforts it should yet achieve nothing and only the good will were left (not, of course, as a mere wish but as the summoning of all means insofar as they are in our control) — then, like a jewel, it would still shine by itself, as something that has its full worth in itself. Usefulness or fruitlessness can neither add anything to this worth nor take anything away from it (Kant 1784/1998, 4:394).

Thomas Nagel approvingly cites this passage in the opening of his 1979 article, “Moral Luck.” Nagel's article began as a reply to Williams' paper of the same name, and the two articles together articulated in a new and powerful way a challenge for anyone wishing to defend the Kantian idea that morality is immune from luck.

To see exactly how the challenge arises, let us begin with the Control Principle:

(CP) We are morally assessable only to the extent that what we are assessed for depends on factors under our control.

It is intuitively compelling, as is the following corollary of it:

(CP-Corollary) Two people ought not to be morally assessed differently if the only other differences between them are due to factors beyond their control.

Not only are the Control Principle and its corollary plausible in themselves, they also seem to find support in our reactions to particular cases. For example, if we find out that a woman who has just stepped on your toes was simply pushed, then our temptation to blame her is likely to evaporate. It seems that the reason for this is our unwillingness to hold someone responsible for what is not in her control. Similarly, if two drivers have taken all precautions, and are abiding by all the rules of the road, and in one case, a dog runs in front of the car and is killed, and not in the other, then, given that the dog's running out was not something over which either driver had control, it seems that we are reluctant to blame one driver more than the other. Although we might expect different reactions from the two drivers, it does not seem that one is deserving of a worse moral assessment than the other.

At the same time, it seems that there are countless cases in which the objects of our moral assessments do depend on factors beyond agents' control. Even though “moral luck” seems to be an oxymoron, everyday judgments suggest that there is a phenomenon of moral luck after all. As Nagel defines it, “Where a significant aspect of what someone does depends on factors beyond his control, yet we continue to treat him in that respect as an object of moral judgment, it can be called moral luck.” (Nagel 1979, 59). To bring out the conflict with the Control Principle even more starkly, we will understand moral luck as follows:

(ML) moral luck occurs when an agent can be correctly treated as an object of moral judgment, despite the fact that a significant aspect of what he is assessed for depends on factors beyond his control.

We certainly seem to be committed to the existence of moral luck. For example, we seem to blame those who have murdered more than we blame those who have merely attempted murder, even if the reason for the lack of success in the second case is that the intended victim unexpectedly tripped and fell to the floor just as the bullet arrived at head-height. Since whether the intended victim tripped or not is not something in control of either would-be murderer, we appear to violate the Control Principle and its corollary.

It might be tempting to respond at this point that what people are really responsible for are their intentions or their “willings,” and that we are thus wrong to offer different moral assessments in this pair of cases. Adam Smith (1790/1976), for example, advocates this position, writing that

To the intention or affection of the heart, therefore, to the propriety and impropriety, to the beneficence or hurtfulness of the design, all praise or blame, all approbation or disapprobation, of any kind, which can justly be bestowed upon any action, must ultimately belong. (II.iii.intro.3.)

But this tempting response faces difficulties of its own. First, as we will see, the would-be murderers offer only one of many cases in which our intuitive moral judgment appears to depend on “results” beyond one's intentions, as Smith himself noted (II.iii.intro.5). And even more importantly, luck can affect even our “willings” and other internal states (Feinberg 1970, 34-38). As Nagel develops the point, there are other types of luck that affect not only our actions but also every intention we form and every exertion of our wills. Further, once these kinds of luck are recognized, we will see that not one of the factors on which agents' actions depend is immune to luck.

Nagel identifies four kinds of luck in all: resultant, circumstantial, constitutive, and causal.

Resultant Luck. Resultant luck is luck in the way things turn out. Examples include the pair of would-be murderers just mentioned as well as the pair of innocent drivers described above. In both cases, each member of the pair has exactly the same intentions, has made the same plans, and so on, but things turn out very differently and so both are subject to resultant luck. If in either case, we can correctly offer different moral assessments for each member of the pair, then we have a case of resultant moral luck. Williams offers a case of “decision under uncertainty”: a somewhat fictionalized Gauguin, who chooses a life of painting in Tahiti over a life with his family, not knowing whether he will be a great painter. In one scenario, he goes on to become a great painter, and in another, he fails. According to Williams, we will judge Gauguin differently depending on the outcome. Cases of negligence provide another important kind of resultant luck. Imagine that two otherwise conscientious people have forgotten to have their brakes checked recently and experience brake failure, but only one of whom finds a child in the path of his car. If in any of these cases we correctly offer differential moral assessments, then again we have cases of resultant moral luck.

Circumstantial luck. Circumstantial luck is luck in the circumstances in which one finds oneself. For example, consider Nazi collaborators in 1930's Germany who are condemned for committing morally atrocious acts, even though their very presence in Nazi Germany was due to factors beyond their control (Nagel 1979). Had those very people been transferred by the companies for which they worked to Argentina in 1929, perhaps they would have led exemplary lives. If we correctly morally assess the Nazi collaborators differently from their imaginary counterparts in Argentina, then we have a case of circumstantial moral luck.

Constitutive luck. Constitutive luck is luck in who one is, or in the traits and dispositions that one has. Since our genes, care-givers, peers, and other environmental influences all contribute to making us who we are (and since we have no control over these) it seems that who we are is at least largely a matter of luck. Since how we act is partly a function of who we are, the existence of constitutive luck entails that what actions we perform depends on luck, too. For example, if we correctly blame someone for being cowardly or self-righteous or selfish, when his being so depends on factors beyond his control, then we have a case of constitutive moral luck. Further, if a person acts on one of these very character traits over which he lacks control by, say, running away instead of helping to save his child, and we correctly blame him for so acting, then we also have a case of constitutive moral luck. Thus, since both actions and agents are objects of moral assessment, constitutive moral luck undermines the Control Principle when it comes to the assessment of both actions and agents.

Causal luck. Finally, there is causal luck, or luck in “how one is determined by antecedent circumstances” (Nagel 1979, 60). Nagel points out that the appearance of causal moral luck is essentially the classic problem of free will. The problem of free will to which Nagel refers arises because it seems that our actions — and even the “stripped-down acts of the will” — are consequences of what is not in our control. If this is so, then neither our actions nor our willing are free. And since freedom is often thought to be necessary for moral responsibility, we cannot be morally responsible even for our willings. Sometimes the problem is thought to arise only if determinism is true, but this is not the case. Even if it turns out that determinism is false, but events are still caused by prior events according to probabilistic laws, the way that one is caused to act by antecedent circumstances would seem to be equally outside of one's control (e.g., Pereboom 2002, 41-54, Watson 1982, 9). Finally, it is worth noting that some have viewed the inclusion of the category of causal luck as redundant, since what it covers is completely captured by the combination of constitutive and circumstantial luck (Latus 2001).

Upon reflection, it seems that we morally assess people differently for what they do (or who they are) when their actions and personal qualities depend on luck of all kinds. And it is not only in unusual cases like that of would-be murderers that people are subject to the various types of luck. For example, whether any of our intentions are realized in action or not depends on some factors outside of our control. Thus, if resultant luck undermines our assessments of moral responsibility, as the Control Principle suggests, then many of our everyday judgments ought to be abandoned. Still, applying the Control Principle to resultant luck continues to leave open the possibility that we are correctly assessed for things like our intentions, just not for the results of our intentions. But consideration of the other sorts of luck leads to more and more global skepticism about moral assessment. For example, circumstantial luck affects even our intentions, so it seems that we cannot be assessed in virtue of our intentions. Once again, though, we might still be able to retain the idea that we are morally assessable for something, even if only for what we would have intended in various situations. But reflection on constitutive luck and causal luck can make it seem as though we cannot be properly assessed for anything we do. For if who we are and therefore what we would have done are themselves subject to luck, then according to the Control Principle, we cannot be properly assessed even for those things. What is left as an object of assessment? As Nagel puts it, “[t]he area of genuine agency, and therefore of legitimate moral judgment, seems to shrink under this scrutiny to an extensionless point” (1979, 66.) He goes on,

I believe that in a sense the problem has no solution, because something in the idea of agency is incompatible with actions being events, or people being things. But as the external determinants of what someone has done are gradually exposed, in their effect on consequences, character, and choice itself, it becomes gradually clear that actions are events and people things. Eventually nothing remains which can be ascribed to the responsible self, and we are left with nothing but a portion of the larger sequence of events, which can be deplored or celebrated, but not blamed or praised (1979, 68).

If this is right, then we could not simply revise our everyday moral judgments in accordance with a more diligent application of the Control Principle; at best, if we adhere to the Control Principle, we should refrain from making any moral judgments. Not everyone shares this skepticism, and there is naturally a wide variety of responses to the challenge of how to reconcile our adherence to the Control Principle with our everyday judgments that commit us to the existence of moral luck. At stake are not only our seemingly ubiquitous practices of moral praise and blame, but also the resolution of other central debates in ethics, philosophy of law, and political philosophy.

2. Implications for Other Debates

Before turning to proposed solutions to the problem, it will be helpful to see just what rests on resolving the problem of moral luck.

2.1 The Justification of Laws and Punishment

Whether or not we accept, reject, or qualify the Control Principle has implications for the law, and for punishment in particular. The question of how resultant luck should affect punishment has been debated at least since Plato (The Laws IX, 876-877). One can argue that if results are not in our control, then our attributions of moral responsibility should not be affected by them. And since moral desert and thus punishment should reflect moral responsibility, the degree of punishment we allot should not be based even in part on results. H.L.A. Hart puts this conclusion in the form of a rhetorical question: “Why should the accidental fact that an intended harmful outcome has not occurred be a ground for punishing less a criminal who may be equally dangerous and equally wicked?” (1968, 129). It turns out, however, that the idea that results should not be taken into account in determining punishment is in direct tension with a variety of criminal laws, including, for example, the differential punishment accorded attempted murder and murder in the United States. It is also in direct tension with parts of the tort law in the United States such as the differential treatment accorded the merely negligent person and the negligent person whose negligence leads to harm. Yet the line of reasoning that leads to this conclusion explicitly invokes the Control Principle, particularly as applied to resultant luck; thus, whether or not we accept or reject the Control Principle in this context has important implications for views of punishment whose justification rests on moral desert. The implications of the status of the Control Principle are not limited to results, however. For example, if we accept the Control Principle in unqualified form, and deny the existence of moral circumstantial, character, and causal luck, then it seems that no actual punishment could be justified on the basis of moral desert. For no one would be morally responsible for anything, and so not morally deserving. (See Moore (1997).) (On the debate concerning differential punishment for attempts and successful criminal behavior, see Alexander et al (2008) Davis (1986), Feinberg (1995), Kadish (1994), Lewis (1989), and Ripstein (1999). On luck and tort law, see Waldron (1995).)

2.2 Egalitarianism

Whether or not the Control Principle is true either in its general or in some restricted form also has implications for the debate over what, if anything, justifies egalitarianism. Let us understand egalitarianism as the view that a distribution of relevant goods that is more equal over a relevant population is more just than one that is less equal. Inspired by the work of John Rawls, some egalitarians have invoked the idea that our constitution and circumstances are out of our control in the justification of their view. For example, Rawls writes that

The existing distribution of income and wealth, say, is the cumulative effect of prior distributions of natural assets—that is, natural talents and abilities—as these have been developed or left unrealized, and their use favored or disfavored over time by social circumstances and such chance contingencies as accident and good fortune. Intuitively, the most obvious injustice of the system of natural liberty is that it permits distributive shares to be improperly influenced by these factors so arbitrary from a moral point of view. (Rawls 1971, p. 72.)

Egalitarians who treat luck in this way are sometimes called “luck egalitarians.” (For examples of various versions of luck egalitarianism, see Arneson 1997, 2001, Cohen 1989, Dworkin 1981 and 2000, Roemer 1996; for criticisms see Nozick 1974, Anderson 1999, Hurley 2001, and Scheffler 2003.) It is often difficult to see exactly how the appeal to constitutive luck is meant to function in various arguments for egalitarianism. There are two very general ways the reasoning might go: a “positive” and a “negative” way (Nozick 1974). According to one positive line of reasoning, it is first observed that one's natural talents, circumstances of birth, and so on are things that are beyond one’s control, and at the same time, if a natural “free market” system operates, these circumstances give rise to many advantages and disadvantages relative to others. By the Control Principle, one is not responsible for these advantages and disadvantages. Further, it is wrong for people to have advantages and disadvantages for which they are not responsible. Therefore, justice requires a more egalitarian redistribution of goods to rectify this wrong. Although this line of reasoning has received much criticism, it is arguable that a weaker, and so less vulnerable “negative” line of reasoning is really behind much of luck egalitarianism (see, for example, Arneson 2001).

The “negative” luck argument for egalitarianism is really a rebuttal to the objection that people should not be deprived in the name of egalitarianism of what they have earned. The argument goes like this: Take as a starting point a presumption in favor of equality of condition. Next observe, as before, that one's natural talents, circumstances of birth, and so on are things beyond one’s control, and, again, that these factors often give rise to advantages and disadvantages relative to others. Therefore, by the Control Principle, one is not responsible for many advantages and disadvantages. If one is not responsible for these, then one is not deserving of them. And if one is not deserving of them, then it is not wrong to redistribute goods in a more egalitarian way that eliminates many advantages and disadvantages.

The explicit appeal to the Control Principle in both of these lines of reasoning shows ways in which the plausibility of Luck Egalitarianism depends on the resolution of the problem of moral luck. It is also notable that some luck egalitarians attempt to draw a line between certain sorts of luck; for example, it is sometimes argued that if one suffers a great financial setback due to one’s choice to engage in high-stakes gambling, then there might be circumstances in which it would be wrong to seek to treat one in the same way as another whose equal suffering was brought on by, say, a devastating earthquake. It might be that underlying this move is acceptance of a restricted version of the Control Principle; for example, one that allows that one can be responsible for one's choices and their expected consequences, but not for the results of one's choices that are in large part beyond one's control. Here, too, it is clear that how one resolves the problem of moral luck — whether one rejects the possibility of moral luck altogether, accepts it in all forms, or accepts certain kinds and not others — has implications for the ultimate success of Luck Egalitarianism. Thus, much is at stake in the resolution of the problem of moral luck. Before turning to suggested solutions, a brief bit of ground-clearing will be necessary.

3. Kinds of Moral Assessment

The Control Principle states that we are morally assessable only to the extent that what we are morally assessed for is under our control. But it is important to recognize that there are many different kinds of moral assessment. For example, there are judgments about a person's character, for example, as “good” or “bad” (sometimes called “aretaic” judgments). There are also judgments of states of affairs that concern people's actions as “ good ”or “ bad ”(sometimes called “axiological” judgments. Then there are judgments of actions as “right” or “wrong” (sometimes called “deontic” judgments). There are also judgments of responsibility, blame, and praise. As we will see, this category can be further divided in various ways.

Distinguishing between the various notions of moral assessment allows for the possibility that the Control Principle should be read as applying to some, but not to other forms of moral assessment. For example, some argue that there is a perfectly acceptable form of moral luck which does not conflict with the true spirit of the Control Principle, namely, luck in what you are responsible for (e.g., Richards 1986, Zimmerman 2002). For example, it will be readily admitted by many that the successful murderer can be responsible for a death, whereas the one who unsuccessfully attempts murder is not responsible for a death. At the same time, both could be equally responsible in degree (Zimmerman 2002, 560) or both could be equal in their moral worth (Richards 1986, 171, Greco 1995, 91). If the most important kind of moral assessment is, say, one's moral worth, then the Control Principle can be suitably restricted to apply to assessments of moral worth. As will become clear, a number of responses to the problem of moral luck appeal to the general strategy of distinguishing among different forms of moral assessment. Most focus on two families of moral assessment: (i) the family that includes responsibility, blame, and praise for actions and/or for one's own traits or dispositions, and (ii) the family that includes the notion of the moral worth of an agent and the moral quality of her character. (But see Zimmerman 2006 for a recent discussion of luck and deontic judgments.)

4. Responding to the Problem: Three Approaches

There are three general approaches to responding to the problem of moral luck: (i) to deny that there is moral luck despite appearances, (ii) to accept the existence of moral luck while rejecting or restricting the Control Principle, or (iii) to argue that it is simply incoherent to accept or deny the existence of some type(s) of moral luck, so that with respect to at least the relevant types of moral luck, the problem of moral luck does not arise.

Some who respond to the problem of moral luck take a single approach to all kinds of luck. But many take a mixed approach; that is, they embrace one approach for one kind of luck and another approach for another kind of luck, or address only a certain type(s) of luck, while remaining silent about the other types. Is taking a mixed approach legitimate? After all, it seems that if the Control Principle is true, then there is no moral luck, and if it is false, then there can be any type of moral luck. But, alas, matters are not necessarily so simple. It is possible at least in theory to offer a principled reason for qualifying the Control Principle so that it applies only to certain sorts of factors and not others. At the same time, as we will see, providing just such a principled way of distinguishing certain kinds of luck from others turns out to be a formidable task.

4.1 Denial

Most of those who deny that one or more types of moral luck exist are those who seek to preserve the centrality of morality in our lives. But it is also possible to adopt a position of denying the possibility of moral luck while at the same time showing that the Control Principle, while true, prevents morality from playing the central role we might have hoped for it. Something like this position seems to be the one Williams adopts in his (1993) “Postscript” to “Moral Luck,” for example.

4.1.1 Denying Moral Luck and Preserving the Centrality of Morality

Let us begin with the first and larger group of those who embrace the approach of denying the existence of moral luck. One of their main tasks is to explain away the appearance of moral luck. A second main task is to paint a plausible and coherent picture of morality that avoids luck.

An important tool for those who wish to explain away the existence of moral luck is what Latus (2000) calls the “epistemic argument.” (See Richards, Rescher, Rosebury, and Thomson.) To see how it goes, let us begin by focusing on resultant luck. Why do we feel differently about the successful and unsuccessful murderers? Because, according to the epistemic argument, we rarely know exactly what a person's intentions are or the strength of her commitment to a course of action. One (admittedly fallible) indicator is whether she succeeds or not. In particular, if someone succeeds, that is some evidence that the person was seriously committed to carrying out a fully formed plan. The same evidence is not usually available when the plan is not carried out. Thus, rather than indicating our commitment to cases of resultant moral luck, our differential treatment of successful and unsuccessful murderers indicates our different epistemic situations with respect to each. If we were in the unrealistic situation of knowing that both agents had exactly the same intentions, the same strength of commitment to their plans, and so on, then we would no longer be inclined to treat them differently. Thomson represents a number of those who employ this strategy when she asks, “Well do we regard Bert [a negligent driver who causes a death] with an indignation that would be out of place in respect to Carol [an equally negligent driver who does not]? Even after we have been told about how bad luck figured in his history and good luck in hers?” And Thomson answers: “I do not find it in myself to do so” (1993, 205). Not everyone shares this intuition, however, as we will see in the next section.

The epistemic argument can be extended to circumstantial luck. Consider again the Nazi sympathizer, and a counterpart who moved in 1929 to Argentina on business. The counterpart has exactly the same dispositions as the Nazi sympathizer, but lives a quiet and harmless life in Argentina. According to this line of reasoning, while it is true that the counterpart is not responsible for the same deeds as the Nazi sympathizer, he should be judged precisely for what he would have done. Richards argues that we do judge people for what they would have done, but that what they do is often our strongest evidence for what they would have done. As a result, given our limited knowledge, we might not be entitled to treat the counterpart in the same way as the Nazi sympathizer, even though they are equally morally deserving of such treatment (Richards 1986, 174 ff.). Thus, circumstantial luck, like resultant luck, affects the basis available to us when we judge agents, but does not affect what those agents deserve.

It is hard to see how the argument can be extended further to cover constitutive or causal luck. But even if the epistemic argument is limited in this way, it can still be part of a good overall strategy of responding to the problem of moral luck insofar as it is possible to take a mix-and-match approach to different kinds of luck.

A second strategy for explaining away moral luck is most naturally applied to resultant luck. Those who adopt this strategy argue that it is understandable or even appropriate to feel differently about the driver who kills a child than about the one who does not. What is not appropriate is to offer different moral assessments of their behavior (e.g., Rosebury, Richards, Wolf, Thomson).

Williams elucidates a notion of “agent-regret,” a sentiment whose “constitutive thought” is a subject's first-person thought that it would have been much better had she done otherwise. Agent regret also requires a certain sort of expression that is different from that of what we might call “bystander regret.” For example, it might include the willingness to compensate a person who was harmed by one's actions. In the case of a lorry driver who, through no fault of his own, runs over a child, Williams writes, “we feel sorry for the driver, but that sentiment co-exists with, indeed presupposes, that there is something special about his relation to this happening, something which cannot merely be eliminated by the consideration that it was not his fault” (1981, 43).

It is possible to take this thought still further and argue that it is reasonable to expect and perhaps even demand that one who kills the child respond in a different way from the other. For example, Wolf argues that there is a “nameless virtue” which consists in “taking responsibility for one's actions and their consequences” (2001, 13). It is the virtue of taking responsibility in some sense for the consequences of one's actions, even if one is not responsible for them. In some ways it is akin to the virtue of generosity in that it “involves a willingness to give more…that justice requires.” (14) To take another example, Richards suggests that we often have negative feelings about those who cause harm, even when we realize that they are not deserved, and that these can be feelings we ought to have. For example, it ought to be distressing for a parent to encounter a girl who accidentally dropped your baby, even if you know that no one could have held on (1986, 178-79). The feelings that both agents and observers naturally do or even ought to have can easily be confused with judgments that commit us to the existence of moral luck. Yet once we distinguish these legitimate feelings from moral judgments, we can and should eliminate the judgments that entail a commitment to moral luck. Again, this strategy is most naturally applied to resultant luck.

Recently, critics of this strategy have objected to it on a variety of grounds. For example, it has been argued against Wolf's view, in particular, that once we acknowledge the appropriateness of greater self-blame in cases of greater harm, no good reason for denying moral luck remains. (See Moore, forthcoming.) It has also been argued that Wolf's description of our phenomenology is at best incomplete: it is not merely that we wish people to blame themselves more when they cause greater harm, but that we judge them to be more blameworthy. Our judgments of greater responsibility also require explaining away. (See Domsky 2004.)

A variant of this strategy employs the idea that one can justify differential treatment of, say, the negligent driver who hits a child and one who does not, even if both are equally morally blameworthy. For example, Henning Jensen (1984) argues that while both are equally culpable, there are consequentialist reasons for not subjecting the first negligent driver to the same degree of blame behavior. Since we all take some risks, and some are less likely to lead to harm than others, to blame everyone for simply taking such risks would require such a high standard of care as to risk destroying our ability to function as moral agents. On the other hand, requiring punishment for or compensation from those who do cause harm is required to provide a “restorative value” for those agents and preserve their integrity.

A third strategy is to point out that we mistakenly infer moral luck from legal luck. While there might be good reasons for the law to treat people differently even if what they do depends on factors beyond their control, we (understandably) make the mistaken inference that the law directly reflects correct moral assessment in such cases. For example, there are a number of reasons why the law might justifiably punish successful crimes more severely than merely attempted ones, including the balancing of deterrence and privacy (Rosebury 521-24). If reasons like this provide the justification for the differential treatment of such cases in the law, then it would indeed be wrong to infer that the successful and unsuccessful murderers are deserving of different moral assessments. However, the fact that we do make such a mistaken inference explains why we often commit ourselves to the existence of moral luck, when reflection can show that doing so is a mistake.

In addition to explaining how there can be an appearance of moral luck, despite the fact that there is not any, some of those who wish to deny the existence of moral luck take on the task of offering a coherent and plausible picture of morality that avoids luck.

Some of those engaged in the free will debate have denied the existence of causal, and perhaps also of constitutive, moral luck by offering a distinctive metaphysical account of human agency. (See, for example, Chisholm, Taylor, Clarke, and O'Connor. See also Pereboom who argues that such an account is coherent, but not true.) The view is known as “Agent-Causal Libertarianism,” and the basic idea is that agents themselves cause actions or at least the formation of intentions, without their being caused to do so. Thus, the agent herself as a substance, exercizing her causal powers is an undetermined cause of her intentions. On some agent causal views, only the agent, as opposed to events caused by other events is the cause of the intention (e.g., O'Connor), while on another view, the agent acts in tandem with events that probabilistically cause the action (Clarke 1993). Particularly on the first sort of view, we seem to avoid the conclusion that our actions must depend on causal factors that are beyond our control. At the same time, it is not clear exactly how the move to agent causation is supposed to restore the kind of control we seek. For we might ask why we should consider the agent cause in control of her actions, while we can imagine that other substance causes (e.g., tables or billiard balls) would not be in control of what they cause. It might be stipulated that the exercise of the particular causal power to cause intentions simply is an exercise of control, but we need further details to see that the challenge has not been stipulated away. (See Clarke 2005 and Mele 2006 for recent discussions of agent causation and luck.) It is also important to note that Agent-Causal views are consistent with actions and even intentions depending in part on factors beyond one's control, such as the reasons people have available at the time of decision or action.

In a very different way, as we have seen, it is possible to take on a part of the task of describing a coherent picture of luck-free morality by identifying an object of moral assessment in the case of circumstantial luck. For example, Richards suggests that people should be assessed for what they would have done in different circumstances. More fundamentally, people should be assessed for their characters, of which their actions in different circumstances are manifestations.

Zimmerman begins where Richards leaves off, proposing to pursue “the implications of the denial of the relevance of luck to moral responsibility” to their “logical conclusion” (2002, 559). With the possible exception of some kinds of constitutive luck, Zimmerman rejects the possibility of moral luck of all four kinds while proposing a coherent picture of moral assessment. He rejects the possibility of resultant luck by first acknowledging that a man who (by luck) succeeds in his plan to cause harm is responsible for more things than one who (by luck) fails to carry out an identical plan. But, according to Zimmerman, we must distinguish between scope and degree of responsibility. Both men are responsible to the same degree, and it is this kind of moral assessment to which the Control Principle ought to apply. When it comes to circumstantial luck, things are more difficult. For when it comes to cases like those of resultant luck in which we want to hold people responsible, we can find something to hold them responsible for, namely, their plans or intentions or attempts. However, when it comes to cases of circumstantial luck, such as the Nazi collaborator and his counterpart, there are no counterpart plans or intentions or attempts that have simply failed to come to fruition. Zimmerman suggests that there is nothing that we hold the counterpart responsible for; in this case, the scope of the agent's responsibility is 0. But we can and should still hold him responsible to the same degree as the Nazi sympathizer. He is responsible tout court even if he is not responsible for anything (2002, 565). He is responsible in the sense that his moral record is affected for better or worse in virtue of something about him. For there is something in virtue of which he is responsible, namely, his being such that he would have freely performed the very same wrong actions had he been in the same circumstances as the Nazi sympathizer.

This reasoning can be extended still further to cover the case of constitutive and even one kind of causal luck. Suppose that Georg does not kill Henrik, and George does kill Henry. Further suppose that “the reason for Georg's not killing Henrik was that he was too timid, or that he had a thick skin and Henrik's insults did not upset him in the way that Henry's insults upset George, or that he was deaf and simply did not hear the insults that Henrik hurled his way. If it is nonetheless true that Georg would have freely shot and killed Henrik but for some such feature of the case over which he had no control, then, I contend, he is just as responsible, in virtue of this fact, as George is” (2002, 565). Zimmerman acknowledges that there are features of one's constitution that are essential to who one is, although he denies that timidity, thick-skinnedness, and so on count among them. However, if such features are essential, then it will not be true to say that had Georg lacked them, he would have freely killed Henrik. Since Georg is responsible, on Zimmerman's view, precisely in virtue of such counterfactuals being true, he would be absolved of responsibility if such features were essential to him. For this reason, Zimmerman concedes that “the role that luck plays in the determination of moral responsibility may not be entirely eliminable…” (2002, 575).

Finally, Zimmerman goes on to claim that his reasoning applies even to cases in which a person's actions are causally determined. If it is true that, say, Georg would have killed Henrik if his deterministic causal history, over which he has no control, had been different, then Georg is as responsible as he would have been had he killed Henrik in a world that was not determined. The upshot of the application of Zimmerman's reasoning is that we are all responsible, blameworthy, and even praiseworthy in ways we have never imagined. If Zimmerman is right, there are countless counterfactuals that apply to each and every one of us, in virtue of which we are responsible to one degree or another. The view thus takes the Control Principle extremely seriously, and applies it in the broadest possible way. The price we pay for “taking luck seriously” is that our everyday moral judgments are, if not always mistaken, at the very least radically incomplete.

A number of objections can be raised to Zimmerman's view, including (i) that at least large classes of the counterfactuals in virtue of which he thinks people are responsible lack truth value (e.g., Adams 1977, Nelkin 2004, and Zimmerman 2002, 572), and (ii) that he is simply mistaken that one can be responsible without being responsible for anything. Even if one or both of these objections are on target, Zimmerman's article is very helpful in showing what an attempt to follow out the denial of moral luck to its logical conclusion looks like.

Unlike Zimmerman, most of those who adopt the denial strategy do so only for certain sorts of moral luck. By treating all sorts of luck in the same way (with the exception of constitutive luck with respect to one's essential properties), Zimmerman challenges those who adopt this strategy to defend the drawing of the line between resultant and other sorts of luck. As we will see, this very same challenge is also issued by those who take a diametrically opposed position and accept all forms of moral luck.

4.1.2 Denying Moral Luck and Setting Aside Morality in Favor of Ethics

Before turning to the approach of accepting the existence of moral luck, it remains to consider the view ascribed earlier to Williams' “Postscript” (1993). Extracting Williams' position on “Moral Luck” is a notoriously difficult task, made easier only by Williams' own acknowledgment in the “Postscript” that his original article “may have encouraged” some misunderstandings (251). Many commentators have read Williams as advocating the position that moral luck exists and is deeply threatening to morality. There is certainly a line of reasoning in Williams' original article that suggests this (see 37-42, 51-53). But in the Postscript, Williams makes a distinction between morality and ethics that allows him to deny the existence of moral luck, thus preserving a certain integrity for morality.

Williams understands morality to embody the Kantian conception of it described above, accepting that the essence of the Control Principle is “built into” morality so understood (1993, 252). At the same time, examples like the Gauguin case described earlier show that one can be rationally justified in one's decision in virtue of its outcome. Further, such a case shows that our overall value judgment of someone's decision can depend on factors beyond the control of the agent. We must conclude, then, that there is a kind of value that competes with, if not trumps, moral value. And if that is right, then we must give up “the point of morality” so understood, namely, to “provide a shelter against luck, one realm of value (indeed, of supreme value) that is defended against contingency” (1993, 251, emphasis mine). It seems that morality can only insulate itself from luck at the expense of foregoing supreme value. Once we acknowledge this cost, we can keep morality intact (although skeptical doubts about its ability to resist luck can still be raised), but we have lost our reason to care about it. Instead, Williams suggests, we should care about ethics, where ethics is understood to address the most general question of how we ought to live.

Questions can be raised about this line of reasoning. For example, we can ask whether there is any sense in which Williams' Gauguin ought to have left his family, despite the fact that the result was so welcome. If there is not, then Williams has not shown that morality competes with, or is trumped by, some other value. From the other direction, we can ask whether Williams is right that morality loses its point if it is not the supreme source of value. Of course, even if Williams' reasoning is unsound, the conclusion could still be correct, and others have offered different routes to it.

The idea that we ought to care about ethics, understood as Williams does, finds inspiration in the work of Aristotle. Aristotle is concerned with the nature of the good life in the broadest sense — in what he calls “eudaimonia,” often translated as “happiness”. Aristotle defends the idea that happiness consists in being a virtuous person over a complete life, and, in turn, the idea that being a virtuous person requires not only that one have virtuous qualities and dispositions, but also that one act on them. Luck enters into the account in at leat two ways. First, on Aristotle's account, one becomes a virtuous person by undergoing the right kind of upbringing and training. Since whether one receives this training is at least to some extent beyond one's control, one's ability to live a virtuous life is deeply dependent on luck. Second,the fact that being a virtuous person requires the performance of certain kinds of activities means that the world must cooperate in various ways in order for one to be truly virtuous, and so be truly happy. Aristotle writes that happiness “needs the external goods as well; for it is impossible, or not easy, to do noble acts without proper equipment” (1984 NE 1099a 31-33). For example, in order to engage in acts of generosity, one must have resources at one's disposal to share. And since having the right equipment is at least to some extent a matter of circumstantial luck, the value of one's life itself will depend in part on what is not in one's control. On one interpretation of Aristotle, luck enters into the account in yet a third way. Acting in accordance with virtue does not suffice for happiness, on this interpretation, although it is the “dominant component” of Aristotle's account of happiness (Irwin 1988, 445). According to this view, one must also have a minimum provision of external goods (e.g., health, security, access to resources) whose contribution to happiness is independent of their making virtuous activity possible. If this is right, then the value of one's life will depend at least in part on factors beyond one's control. In sum, while there is some dispute about whether Aristotle thought more than a life of virtuous activity is required for happiness, it is clear that luck plays a significant role in determining both whether people are truly virtuous and whether people's lives are good in the broadest sense. Hence, “the fragility of goodness” (Nussbaum).

4.2 Acceptance

All of those who accept the existence of some type of moral luck reject the Control Principle and the Kantian conception of morality that embraces it. As a result, they must either explain how we can revise our moral judgments and practices in a coherent way or show that we are not committed to the Control Principle in the first place.

4.2.1 Accepting Moral Luck and Revising our Practices

Some who accept luck argue that doing so requires a significant change in our moral practices. Browne (1992), for example, suggests that if the Control Principle is false, we ought not to respond to an agent's wrongdoing with anger and blame that is “against” him, but rather with anger that does not include hostility or the desire to punish. Nevertheless, we can still respond to the successful murderer with more of the “right” kind of anger than we feel toward the unsuccessful one. One question that might be raised here is whether we are left with enough of our ordinary conception of morality to include genuine notions of blame and responsibility.

4.2.2 Accepting Moral Luck without Revision

Others suggest that the Control Principle does not have nearly the hold on us that Nagel and Williams assume, and that rejecting it would not change our practices in a significant way. Among these are some who focus on the free will debate and others who take on the broader problem of moral luck directly. Accepting Moral Luck and the Free Will Debate

A large group who accept moral luck do not explicitly address the problem of moral luck as so formulated because they focus on what Nagel identifies as a narrower issue, namely, that of free will. One traditional problem of free will is posed by the following line of reasoning: if determinism is true, then no one can act freely, and, assuming that freedom is necessary for responsibility, no one can be responsible for their actions. Compatibilists have argued that we can act freely and responsibly even if determinism is true. Since most do not adopt Zimmerman's radical account of moral assessment in which one can be responsible despite not being responsible for anything, they admit the existence of causal moral luck. If, as some have argued, causal luck is exhausted by constitutive and circumstantial luck, then they also accept that there can be these sorts of moral luck, as well.

A basic compatibilist strategy is to argue that agents can have control over their actions in the sense required for freedom and/or responsibility even if they do not control the causal determinants of those actions. For example, if one acts with the ability to act in accordance with good reasons (Wolf 1990) or if one acts with “guidance control” which consists in part of acting on a reasons-responsive mechanism for which one has taken responsibility, (Fischer and Ravizza 1998), one can be responsible for one's actions. The key move here is to distinguish between different kinds of factors over which one has no control. If one's actions are caused by factors that one does not control and that prevent one from having or exercizing certain capacities, then one is not responsible. However, if one's actions are caused by factors that one does not control, but that do allow one to have and exercize the relevant capacities, then one can be “in control” of one's actions in the relevant sense, and so responsible for one's actions.

Interestingly, compatibilists are often silent on the question of resultant and circumstantial moral luck, although these forms of luck might represent an underutilized resource for them. For if it turns out that the luck — or lack of control — delivered by determinism is but one source of luck among others, then determinism does not embody a unique obstacle to free will and responsibility, at least when it comes to control. This is to expand the application of a widely used compatibilist strategy to show that when it comes to causal luck, compatibilists are not alone.

For within the free will debate, compatibilists are not alone in accepting the existence of certain types of luck. Many libertarians assume that our actions are caused by prior events (not themselves in our control) in accordance with probabilistic laws of nature (see, for example, Kane 1996, 1999, Nozick 1981). Given this view, it is natural to conclude that if determinism is false, there is at least one kind of luck in what sort of person one decides to be and so in what actions one performs. That is, there is luck in the sense that there is no explanation as to why a person chose to be one way rather than another. At the same time, Kane, for example, denies that there must be luck in the sense that one's choices are flukes or accidents if determinism is false. In Kane's view, what is important is to be free from luck of the second kind. For even if one's action is not determined, it can still be the case that the causes of one's action are one's own efforts and intention. And if one's action is caused by one's own efforts and intentions, then one's action is not lucky in the sense of being a fluke or accident. But while this shows that one's actions can be free of luck of an important kind, it still leaves unaddressed luck of a third kind, namely the kind at issue in the moral luck debate: the dependence of agents' choices on factors beyond their control. And it appears that on the libertarian view in question, our choices are indeed subject to luck of this sort. (See Pereboom (2002) for a discussion of the similar burdens shared by compatibilists and this sort of libertarian.) Only the agent-causal libertarians discussed above offer an account that aims specifically at eliminating a type of moral luck. Accepting Moral Luck and Distinctive Conceptions of Morality

It is also possible to argue that we are not committed to the Control Principle by taking on the problem of moral luck directly.

One strategy is to argue that moral luck is only a problem for an overly idealized conception of human agency. But once we adopt a realistic conception of human agency, the problem evaporates. Margaret Urban Walker (1991) argues in this vein that moral luck is only problematic for a conception of moral agents as “noumenal” or pure (238). In contrast, adopting a conception of morality that applies to human beings in all of their impurity will not be threatened by moral luck. According to Walker, the Control Principle is far from obvious, and we would not want to live in a world in which it held sway. The argument appears to rest on the idea that without moral luck, we would lack several virtues that allow us to help each other in most essential ways. Our very reactions to moral luck can be virtuous. For example, by accepting that our “responsibilities outrun control,” we are able to display the virtue of dependability by accepting that we will be there for our friends, even if their needs are not in our control. In contrast, pure agents who are only responsible for what they control “may not be depended on, much less morally required, to assume a share of the ongoing and massive human work of caring, healing, restoring, and cleaning-up on which each separate life and the collective one depend.” (247). Thus, if we focus on our actual moral commitments, we will see that the Control Principle is neither attractive nor necessary for morality.

It is not obvious that a world in which people denied the existence of moral luck would be as bleak as the one Walker envisions. Moral luck skeptics have material with which to question Walker's claim. For example, those who deny resultant moral luck can still agree that agents have an obligation to minimize their risks of doing harm, and those who deny circumstantial moral luck can still agree that agents have an obligation to cultivate qualities that prepare them to act well in whatever circumstances arise.

A second strategy for rejecting the Control Principle turns Nagel's argument on its head by taking as a starting point ordinary judgments and reactions that reveal our implicit rejection of the Control Principle. Adams (1985) adopts this strategy, drawing our attention to common practices, such as blaming people for their racist attitudes even if we do not think that such people are in control of their attitudes. Since Adams focuses primarily on agents' states of mind that have intentional objects such as anger and self-righteousness, it is possible to see him as accepting the existence of constitutive moral luck in particular. But it is also possible to adopt the same sort of strategy for other sorts of luck, including resultant luck. Moore (1997), for example, points to the fact that we resent those who succeed in causing harm more than those who do not, we feel greater guilt when we ourselves cause harm, and when we face decisions, we feel that the consequences of matter to the moral quality of our choices.

Now opponents who deny the existence of moral luck have ways of explaining away these phenomena. When it comes to cases of constitutive luck, like the case of the racist, they can say that what we really (ought to) blame people for are the manifestations of their attitudes and their omitting to take steps to eliminate the offending attitudes. But, on reflection, we ought not to blame people for the mere having of attitudes beyond their control. Similarly, as we saw earlier, when it comes to resultant luck, moral luck skeptics have a variety of strong alternative explanations of our judgments and emotional responses. It is possible that there is a disagreement here at the level of intuitions: some find it easier on reflection to reject moral judgments that depend on results than others. Further, those accepting resultant moral luck face a challenge of articulating a positive theory of how exactly results affect one's moral status while at the same time acccounting for our intuitions. Sverdlik (1988) argues that it is not obvious how such a challenge can be met.

At this point in the debate, those who accept moral luck offer ordinary judgments and responses in their defense, while moral luck skeptics offer alternative explanations of those practices and hold up the Control Principle itself as reason to reject moral luck. We seem to have something of a stalemate. So it is no surprise that those who accept moral luck tend not to rely exclusively on ordinary judgments to make their case, but rather go on to try to undermine the Control Principle in other ways.

Another way of trying to undermine the appeal of the Control Principle itself is to show how it might be mistaken for something else that is more plausible. For example, Adams (1985) recognizes that there are limits to what we can be responsible for, and writes that the states of mind “for which we are directly responsible are those in which we are responding, consciously or unconsciously, to data that are rich enough to permit a fairly adequate ethical appreciation of the state's intentional object and of the object's place in the fabric of personal relationships” (26). Thus, according to Adams' conception of morality, adherents of the Control Principle are correct in an important respect, namely, in their understanding that what one is responsible for springs in the right way from oneself. But this requirement is more general than a strict requirement of control, and although easily confused with the Control Principle, is superior to it, on this view.

Adopting the same general strategy, Moore (1997) identifies still other principles with which the Control Principle might be confused. He points out that when we use the word “luck” in the context of moral assessment, we tend not to mean that the person lacked control over what he did, but rather that what happened was far off of “some moral baseline of the normal” (213). For example, consider two would-be murderers, one of whom fires his gun and hits his target, and the other of whom fires in the same way, from the same distance, and so on, but whose bullet is deflected by an unexpected and unusually strong wind. Moore suggests that the first gunman is not “lucky” in the ordinary sense, even though it is true that whether a hurricane-force wind arose or not was not in his control. According to Moore, there is something intuitively right about morality being immune to luck, but only if we understand “luck” in the sense of “freakishness.” Further, the successful murderer is “in control” of his action in the normal sense of the word “control,” even though he doesn't control the wind. Thus, while we do care about luck and control in making both moral and legal assessments, they aren't Nagel's concepts, on this view. Thus, according to Moore, there is no contradiction in our everyday commitments.

Now those who think we are naturally drawn to the Control Principle can respond by pointing out both the intuitive plausibility of the principle in the abstract and the cases described earlier that seem to support it. They might then accept the alternative principles suggested by Adams and Moore while claiming that the Control Principle is true as well. Again, differing intuitions about cases and about the Control Principle itself have the potential to make a big difference to one's view at this point.

There is a final argument in favor of the acceptance of moral luck of a very different kind that might ultimately help decide the issue in one direction or the other. It explicitly encompasses every kind of luck and thus poses a deep and difficult challenge to moral luck skeptics, particularly the large group who focus exclusively on resultant luck. The main idea is that rejecting resultant luck, but not other sorts of luck, is an unstable position (Moore 1997). In a nutshell, one cannot find a principled place to draw the line at refusing to accept moral luck. In effect, this argument is Nagel's argument in reverse. Begin by observing that we lack control over everything: the results of our actions, our circumstances, our constitution, and our causal history. If we are to avoid moral skepticism, then we must accept moral luck in some areas, and if we do that, then we ought to accept it in the area of results. Particularly if we accept that we are not predisposed to accept the Control Principle in the first place, then we ought to accept luck in all areas, thereby avoiding moral skepticism.

Now even if no one has adequately defended a way of drawing a line between different sorts of luck, it is not obvious that the door has been closed on all future attempts. Thus, one way of seeing this argument is as a shift-the-burden one. Those who wish to draw a line between different sorts of moral luck must offer a deeper rationale for doing so than has yet been offered.

4.3 Incoherence

According to this approach, it is simply incoherent to accept or deny the existence of some type(s) of moral luck. This approach has been used for constitutive luck in particular.

Among those who wish to preserve the centrality of morality in our lives, many have appealed to an idea formulated by Nicholas Rescher (1993), according to which “[o]ne cannot meaningfully said to be lucky in regard to who one is, but only with respect to what happens to one. Identity must precede luck” (155). It is easy to take Rescher's point out of context without realizing that he is working with a notion of luck that differs from the notion of “lack of control.” According to Rescher, something is lucky if (i) it came about “by accident” where this seems to mean something like “unplanned” or “unexpected” or “out of the ordinary” and (ii) the outcome “has a significantly evaluative status in representing a good or bad result, a benefit or loss”(145). Taken this way, it does seem at least very odd to say that one's identity is (or is not) a matter of luck. But it is less clear that there is anything odd — let alone incoherent — about saying that one's identity is not a matter within one's control.

Could there nevertheless be some truth to Rescher's claim even if we understand “luck” as “out of one's control?” Perhaps it does not make sense, for example, to say that a person is in control of who she is. For one could argue that this would amount to saying that a person is a self-creator. And in fact the Control Principle, taken to its logical extreme, seems to lead to just such a requirement (see, e.g., Browne 1992, Nagel 1986, 118). If it turns out that self-creation is conceptually impossible as many argue (e.g., Galen Strawson 1986), then perhaps there is a sense in which it is right to say that being in control of one's constitution makes no sense. But it does not follow from this that it is meaningless to deny that one can control one's constitution.

Perhaps the best way of deploying the insight that there is something special about luck and constitution is not to say that it is meaningless to discuss it, but to say that constitutive moral luck is simply unproblematic for morality in the way that resultant moral luck is. This would be to take up the “line-drawing” challenge as described in the last section. On this line of reasoning, for purposes of moral assessment, it does not matter how you came to be; what matters is what you do with what you are. Of course, as we saw,this requires defense and explanation, but it is a way of capturing the insight that constitutive luck is relevantly different from the resultant luck that has captivated a number of commentators.

5. Conclusion

The problem of moral luck is deeply unsettling. Naturally, there is a wide variety of responses to it. On the one extreme are those who deny that there is any sort of moral luck, and on the other are those who accept every sort of moral luck. Most writers who have responded to the problem fall somewhere in between; either they explicitly take a mixed approach or they confine their arguments to a carefully delineated subset of types of moral luck while remaining uncommitted with respect to the others. The extreme positions are vulnerable to the objection that they have left some consideration or other completely unaccounted for. But those who occupy the middle also face a formidable challenge: where can one draw a principled line between acceptable and unacceptable forms of luck? As we have seen, one apparently natural place to draw a line is between resultant luck and all of the other sorts. On this view, there is no resultant moral luck, despite initial appearances, although there is moral luck of all the other kinds. Thus, occupiers of this position face the challenge of setting out a plausible rationale for drawing the line where they do. But they also face the challenge of where precisely to draw another line, namely, the line around what counts as “results.” For we can ask on which side of this line do intentions, willings, bodily movements, and so on, fall. Do results include everything that happens after the formation of an intention or the exertion of the will, for example? Or everything that follows the beginning of the formation of an intention or the beginning of the exertion of the will? Or everything that follows the “affection of the heart” of which Adam Smith wrote so eloquently? These are difficult questions for those who would draw a line at resultant luck. But difficult questions await every other proposal, too. Fortunately, there is a rich and growing literature providing a full spectrum of responses to explore.


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Aristotle, General Topics: ethics | causation: in the law | character, moral | compatibilism | determinism: causal | egalitarianism | free will | incompatibilism: (nondeterministic) theories of free will | moral responsibility | punishment | punishment, legal


I am very grateful to David Brink, Nina Davis, Derk Pereboom, and Sam Rickless for their very helpful input and constructive suggestions. I also benefited greatly from participation in the University of San Diego Institute for Law and Philosophy Roundtable on Moral Luck in April 2003.