Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Moral Responsibility

[1.] In an effort to streamline the following introductory discussion I have ignored several complications, some of which will be discussed at the end of this entry. For example, I've chosen initially to restrict my focus to morally significant actions (and possibly other items—e.g., traits—subject to moral evaluation) and have assumed that moral responsibility involves both positive and negative reactions like praise and blame. In doing so, I set aside for the moment two important ways of understanding the notion of responsibility, advocates of which might object to these introductory remarks. First, some think that the scope of responsibility is not restricted to actions (and other items) subject to moral evaluation but in principle applies to all intentional actions (as well as other items that may be linked to such actions. See e.g., Fischer and Ravizza, 1998: 8, nt. 11). Second, some contend that the idea of moral responsibility, properly explicated, involves reference to forms of blame alone (see e.g., R. J. Wallace: 12).

[2.] For further discussion of various kinds of responsibility, see Hart: ch. 9; and Feinberg: 130–9.

[3.] The term, ‘person,’ is here being used as a technical term. This is important to realize because it is an open question whether the class of persons is co-extensive with the class of human beings. This may be either because there are (or someday may be) persons who are not human beings or because not all human beings qualify as persons in the relevant restricted sense.

[4.] For discussion of a challenge to this claim, see Bernard Williams: ch. 2–3.

[5.] Curren (1989; 2000) and Roberts have challenged the traditional view that Aristotle was discussing a conception of moral responsibility similar to our own. For a noteworthy defense of the traditional view in the face of such challenges, see Meyer 1993: chs. 1–2.

[6.] This way of dividing control and epistemic conditions on responsibility continues to be influential. For excellent treatments of Aristotle's account, see Broadie: ch.3; Curren 1989 and 2000; Everson 1990; Irwin 1980; Meyer 1993; and Roberts.

[7.] The ambiguity displayed in Aristotle's conception of moral responsibility is linked to another—how to interpret the condition that the action or trait be up to the agent. Some believe that the action (or trait) needs to be up to the agent in the sense that she could have, at the time of action (or development of the trait), either performed it or not performed it (or developed it vs. not developed it). Others believe the action or trait need be up to the agent only in the sense that it follows from the agent's desires/emotions/beliefs in such a way that had she decided otherwise, she would have done or been otherwise. Those who adopt the former reading of Aristotle's account adopt the merit reading of Aristotle's conception of responsibility while the latter often adopt the consequentialist reading.

[8.] Until recently, this classification was parasitic upon and parallel to a more fundamental distinction between 1) those who believed that it could not both be true that persons sometimes acted freely and that persons were causally determined; and 2) those who believed that both of the former could be true. That is, acting freely—in the sense of being able to do otherwise—was assumed to be a precondition of being morally responsible for an action, so one's view of the compatibility of freedom and determinism was thought to entail one's view about the compatibility of moral responsibility and determinism. These assumptions have been called into question in recent years (see Frankfurt), opening up the possibility of views which are incompatibilist in one sense but compatibilist in another (see Fischer 1994: 178–183). This recent wrinkle is ignored in the text for ease of exposition.

[9.] For helpful discussions of Strawson's view, see Bennett; Watson 1987; Russell: ch.5; Fischer and Ravizza 1993: 14–22; R. Jay Wallace; Magill 2000 and 1997: 19–22; Ekstrom: ch. 5; McKenna; and the introduction to Mckenna and Russell.

[10.] Note how this addresses one of the concerns motivating reflection on moral responsibility (see the introduction to this entry). If Strawson is correct, then his view helps to explain one reason why persons are unique—namely, only they can be proper recipients of the reactive attitudes.

[11.] A more particular criticism of Strawson's aimed at consequentialist interpretations of the concept of responsibility has also been influential. This criticism follows from his account of the kind of attitudes involved in holding someone morally responsible and is nicely captured by Jonathan Bennett: “Displays of indignation or of gratitude often produce good results: but such feelings cannot be motivated by the desire to produce good results, nor, it seems, are we able closely to control them by thoughts of what will bring best results (p. 22).” In other words, Strawson denies that our practice of holding responsible is being driven by a desire to bring about good results and a judgment that our reacting in certain ways will bring about that result (and/or that we could comprehensively adjust our reactions in accordance with such a goal), as the traditional consequentialist view seems to suggest. To be preoccupied with the goal of achieving the best results is to regard the candidate as an object of manipulation or treatment, a stance which precludes the participant reactive attitudes altogether. According to Strawson, any view that fails to acknowledge the essential role of the reactive attitudes within the participant perspective can no longer claim to be an account of moral responsibility, as we know it. (20–21). Others, building on Strawson's account, have argued that the consequentialist account also fails to capture the inherent backward-looking focus of the reactive attitudes (e.g., they are often reactions to what someone has done), focusing as they do on the achievement of some future goal (see Bennett: 37; and R. Jay Wallace: 56–58). To criticisms of this kind, some consequentialists have argued that one must not confuse the intentions of the person engaged in the practice of holding responsible with the function of the overall practice. On this view, the consequentialist account is aimed at describing and justifying the function of holding a person responsible, not the intentions involved in doing so (see e.g., Kupperman: 60–64). For a recent attempt to extend Strawson's original argument to show also that consequentialist accounts of moral obligation offer reasons “of the wrong kind,” see Darwall.

[12.] Terminology in marking this and similar distinctions varies. Here I adopt the terminology used in Watson 1996. For some debate about whether the distinction between these two senses of responsibility is a meaningful one, see Levy and a reply by Smith, 2008.

[13.] For views that deny that responsibility in this sense entails an evaluative judgment, see Fischer and Ravizza 1998: 8, nt. 11; Haji: 8; and Scanlon 1998: 248.

[14.] Some, while granting that the folk concept of accountability may rest in this way on a notion of fairness as desert, argue that the relevant notion of desert is itself open to moral objections (Scanlon 1998: 274; Kelly) and/or that the relevant notion of fairness need not be understood as desert (Scanlon 1998: 283–7).

[15.] The issue of concept individuation is a difficult one. In this paragraph, it is assumed that a revisionist account of the concept of responsibility entails revision of the conditions of the applicability of the concept and vice versa. However, another type of revisionist might hold that while the conditions of applicability are in need of revision, this entails no revision of the concept of moral responsibility itself.