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Mulla Sadra

First published Tue Jun 9, 2009

Sadr al-Din Muhammad b. Ibrahim b. Yahya Qawami Shirazi (ca. 1571–1636) is arguably the most significant Islamic philosopher after Avicenna. Best known as Mulla Sadra, he was later given the title of Sadr al-Muta’allihin (Master of the theosists) for his approach to philosophy that combined an interest in theology and drew upon insights from mystical intuition. He championed a radical philosophical method that attempted to transcend the simple dichotomy between a discursive, ratiocinative mode of reasoning and knowing, and a more intuitive, poetic and non-propositional mode of knowledge. He became famous as the thinker who revolutionized the doctrine of existence in Islamic metaphysics and extended the shift from an Aristotelian substance metaphysics to a (Neoplatonic) process metaphysics of change, from a metaphysics grounded in the primacy of substances as the stuff of existence to a metaphysics founded upon and moved by acts of being. A keen thinker who wrote works in philosophy, theology, mysticism, and scriptural exegesis, he attempted a wide-ranging synthesis of approaches to Islamic thought and argued for the necessity of the method of understanding reality through a mixture of logical reasoning, spiritual inspiration, and a deep meditation upon the key scriptural sources of the Twelver Shi‘i tradition in Islam. A key figure of a group of thinkers whom Nasr and Corbin referred to as the “School of Isfahan”, he played a major role in intellectual life during the revitalization of philosophy under the Safavid Shah ‘Abbas I (r. 996–1038 AH/1588–1629 CE) and later on in life was the most important teacher at the philosophical seminary known as Madrasa-yi Khan in his hometown of Shiraz.

1. Life and works

1.1 Life

Mulla Sadra was the sole child born into a courtly family in Shiraz, southern Iran, in around 979 AH/1571–72. A bright young man, his interest in intellectual pursuits was indulged by his father, and he moved first to Qazvin in 1000 AH/1591 and then to Isfahan in 1006 AH/1597, successive capitals of the Safavid empire, to pursue his study of philosophy, theology, the prophetic tradition, and Qur’anic hermeneutics and exegesis with the two pre-eminent teachers of his age, Mir Muhammad Baqir Damad Astarabadi, the grandson of the powerful jurist and statesman ‘Ali Karaki, and Shaykh Baha’ al-Din ‘Amili known as Shaykh Baha’i (d. 1030 AH/1620-21), who was the pre-eminent jurist in Isfahan during the reign of Shah Abbas I. With the former, he studied philosophy and theology, in particular the Peripatetic works of Avicenna (d. 428 AH/1037) and his student Bahmanyar (d. 458 AH/1066), the pseudo-Aristotelian Plotiniana Arabica (in particular the so-called Theology of Aristotle), and the Illuminationist works of Suhrawardi (d. 586 AH/1191). With Shaykh Baha’i, as was the case with a number of other students, he studied the scriptural sciences of Qur’anic exegesis and the traditions of the Shi‘i Imams. Contrary to what Corbin and others have claimed (Corbin 1971: 58; Nasr 1977: 32), there seems to be no evidence that he studied with another intriguing scholar from Astarabad and associate of Mir Damad, Mir Findiriski (d. 1050 AH/1640-41), an itinerant scholar who spent much time studying Indian philosophies and religions. Certainly the story recorded by some of the later biographical dictionaries that claims that Mulla Sadra was advised by Mir Fendereski to study with Mir Damad is apocryphal. We do not have a formal license (ijaza) from his teachers that has survived, which could attest to his study with them and to the content of the curriculum; certainly, we know that both Mir Damad and Shaikh Baha’i granted a number of these licenses and attestations of study to their students as compiled by Majlisi II (Mulla Muhammad Baqir Majlisi, known as ‘Allama-yi Majlisi, 1036–1110 AH/1627–99) in Bihar al-anwar [Seas of Lights]. However, we have one very valuable source that records the intimate relationship of his study and even spiritual discipleship in a literary-poetic collection of the early 17th century from Qazvin known as the Jung-e Qazvin. This codex (which is in the National Library in Tehran) includes autograph notes of Mir Damad, Shaikh Baha’i, and Mulla Sadra. Among these notes are short ijaza-like statements for Mulla Sadra. Shaikh Baha’i quoted some narrations of the Imams and wrote that he did so at the bequest of his “illustrious and most excellent, intelligent and witty and pure son Sadra” (Khamenehi 2000: 59). Similarly, in a note Mir Damad referred to Sadra as his spiritual son (Khamenehi 2000: 56). The dual influence of his teachers can be gauged in his early notes that reveal an interest in Sufism, especially Sufi poetry and the law. These notes were probably written in Shiraz in 1016 AH/1607–8. However, interest in Sufism does not entail affiliation to a Sufi order, a practice which, in any case, was highly controversial in this period: the claim of the 19th-century Ni‘mat-Allahi Sufi Ma‘sum-‘Ali-Shah that Mulla Sadra was a Nurbakhshi Sufi cannot be substantiated.

Completing his training and possibly prompted by the death of his father in 1010 AH/1601–2, he returned to Shiraz to work and teach; but, failing to find an adequate patron and facing the opposition and criticism of a city that had forgotten the value of the study of philosophy, he retreated to Kahak, a small village outside the holy city of Qom, to meditate upon his inquiries and initiate the composition of his main works, especially his philosophical and theological summa, al-Hikma al-muta‘aliya fi-l-asfar al-‘aqliyya al-arba‘a (Transcendent wisdom of the four journeys of the intellect), popularly known as al-Asfar al-arba‘a (The Four Journeys). His retreat (khalvat) lasted probably five years. He then began an itinerant life, teaching and writing in Qom, visiting and corresponding with Mir Damad in Isfahan until the latter's death in 1040 AH/1631, and spending time at his family estates in Shiraz. Manuscript evidence attests to his itinerant life until 1040 AH/1630–1. His relationship with Mir Damad was particularly important: he began espousing his teacher's ideas until he changed his views later in life, but Mir Damad remained his spiritual master. His devotion was expressed in the letters that they exchanged. In a letter dated 1018 AH/1609–10 from Shiraz, Mulla Sadra described Mir Damad as “the apportioner of grace to the hearts of the wise, the eleventh intellect, he who masters the theory and practice of the sciences, the lord (sayyid) of philosophers and the master of the jurists, the most noble of scholars, the civiliser of Islam” (Khamenehi 2000: 109). In another letter dated 1037 AH/1627–8 probably from Qom, he complained of their separation and expressed concern for the health of Mir Damad describing him as “our master and lord (sayyid), may God preserve his shadow over his separated disciples by preserving his noble existence and his honour and the light of the illumination of his light that enlightens the hearts of spiritual wayfarers” (Khamenehi 2000: 113).

He trained a number of significant philosophers in the period in Qom, the most important of whom were Muhsin Fayz-i Kashani (d. 1090 AH/1680–1), who studied with him between 1030 AH/1620–1 and 1038 AH/1628–9, as attested in Fayz's autobiographical treatise Sharh-i Sadr, and ‘Abd al-Razzaq Lahiji (known as Fayyaz-i Lahiji, d. 1072 AH/1661–2), both of whom became his sons-in-law. Other students included the philosophers Husayn Tunikabuni (d. 1105 AH/1693–4) and Muhammad Riza Aqajani (d. 1071 AH/1660–1). After his retreat to Qom, Mulla Sadra probably married in Shiraz. One modern source suggests that his wife was the daughter of Mirza Zia al-Din Muhammad Razi, which would mean that his wife and the mother of Fayz were sisters, suggesting a relationship that predates the teacher and student one. As an affluent man, Mulla Sadra had five children who survived and a large household, including retainers and students. His first-born Umm Kulsum was born in 1019 AH/1610–1 and later married his student Fayyaz-i Lahiji in Qom. Another daughter Zubayda was born in 1024 AH/1615 in Qom and later married Fayz-i Kashani. His third daughter Ma‘suma was born in Qom in 1033 AH/1623–4 and later married another student, Qutb al-Din Muhammad Nayrizi, about whom nothing is recorded. Mulla Sadra also had three sons who became scholars in their own right: Ibrahim, who was born in Qom in 1021 AH/1612–3, became a prominent theologian at court, and died in Isfahan in 1071 AH/1660–1: Nizam al-Din Ahmad, who was born in Kashan in 1031 AH/1621–2 and died in Shiraz in 1074 AH/1664; and his youngest son Muhammad Riza, who was probably born in Qom but about whom we do not have any biographical information.

In 1040 AH/1630–1, Mulla Sadra moved permanently to his hometown at the request of (possibly his former student) Imamquli Khan (d. 1042 AH/1633), the extremely powerful governor-general (beglerbegi) of Sadra's home province Fars and son of the celebrated Georgian military commander Allahvirdi Khan. The Madrasa-yi Khan seminary, founded by Imamquli's father and completed in 1024 AH/1615, had been established with an express purpose of teaching philosophy and science. Mulla Sadra was the clear choice for teaching there, and it is possible that he had begun his association from the inception of the institution. He completed his major work, the Four Journeys (al-Asfar al-arba‘a) in Shiraz in 1038 AH/1628 and in the same year the English traveller Sir Thomas Herbert described the Madrasa: “and [indeed] Shyraz has a colledge wherein is read Philosophy, Astrology, Physick, Chemistry and the Mathematicks; so as ‘tis the more famoused through Persia” (Herbert, Some Years Travel, London, 1634, p. 129). This late period of his life was productive, and he was much respected as a teacher in his hometown. After an illustrious and prolific career, he died in Basra on his way to his seventh pilgrimage to Mecca. The traditional date given for his death is 1050 AH/1640–1. However, there is no clear evidence in support of this date. His grandson Muhammad ‘Alam al-Huda, the son of Fayz-i Kashani, reported that his grandfather died in Basra in 1045 AH/1635–6 and was buried in Najaf in the precinct of the shrine of the first Shi‘i Imam ‘Ali b. Abi Talib (Khamenehi 2000: 414). This seems to be corroborated by the fact that the date of completion for his last works, including those left incomplete, is 1044 AH/1635.

1.2 Works

Mulla Sadra wrote over forty-five works. His magnum opus, al-Hikma al-muta‘aliya fi-l-asfar al-‘aqliyya al-arba‘a, known as al-Asfar al-arba‘a (The Four Journeys), is a large compendium of philosophy and theology that, instead of following the traditional divisions of logic, physics, and metaphysics, maps intellectual inquiry upon a mystical metaphor of the soul's journey in this world. Hence it is popularly known as the Four Journeys. He began writing it in 1015 AH/1606 in Kahak and completed it in Shiraz in 1038 AH/1638. The first journey from this world to God provides the seeker with the intellectual principles for understanding philosophy such as the basic definition of philosophy and metaphysics, the significance of metaphysics and the question of being for this study. In this journey, the seeker moves away from multiplicity and phenomenal deception towards unity and an awareness of the underlying nature of reality. The second journey in God with God is a discourse on the nature of God, the divine attributes and significantly including his famous proof for the existence of God. It is the stage of the mystic's absorption in the divine essence and his effacement of the self. The third journey from God to this world explains the God-world relationship, nature, time and creation and ontological categories in this world. For the mystic, this is the return to sobriety and a realisation of the duties of moral agency in this world. The final journey in this world with God is a description of human psychology focusing on soteriology and eschatology and reveals most clearly the significance of Twelver Shi‘ism to his thought. This is the final stage of the mystic's journey, a recognition that everything as a unified whole reflects the ontological unity of the divine and that the realised human recognises a desire to return to the principle, the one who is the source of being, God.

The Four Journeys is a major source for the history of Islamic philosophical traditions: it reveals the strong influence of an Avicennan structure with major contributions from the critiques of Avicennism by Suhrawardi and the Sufi metaphysical monism of Ibn al-‘Arabi (d. 1240). But it is not just the arguments of thinkers, well known in academic and scholarly circles, who are considered. He also addressed the positions of some major philosophers of Shiraz, who remain little known even to specialists studying Islamic philosophy, such as Mir Ghiyath al-Din Mansur Dashtaki (d. 948 AH/1541) and Shams al-Din Muhammad Khafri (d. ca. 957 AH/1550).

His other works mainly deal with philosophical theology, such as al-Hikma al-‘arshiyya (Wisdom of the throne) and al-Shawahid al-rububiyya (Divine witnesses). One work, al-Masha‘ir (Inspired recognitions) stands out as a dense epitome of his doctrine of being as expressed in the first part of the Four Journeys on the semantics of existence. As a religious thinker, Mulla Sadra was also keen to come to terms with his scriptural heritage, and he wrote three works on the hermeneutics of the Qur’an as a preparation for his own incomplete mystical and philosophical commentary on the text: Mafatih al-ghayb (Keys to the unseen), Asrar al-ayat (Secrets of the verses/signs), and Mutashabihat al-Qur’an (Allegories of the Qur’an). As a Shi‘i thinker, he also wrote an incomplete commentary on the main doctrinal collection of tradition, Usul al-kafi of Kulayni (d. 329 AH/941), as an attempt to grapple with the question of what it means to be an intuitive philosopher in the Shi‘i tradition. He also wrote a number of other treatises on particular issues, such as creatio ex nihilo (huduth al-‘alam), the resurrection, the nature of knowledge, logic, and the relationship between existence and essence. But the Four Journeys remains his most important work and the key to understanding his philosophy as he repeatedly cited it in his other works for a more extended discussion of an issue.

2. Philosophy

2.1. Defining philosophy

Common with other pre-modern traditions of philosophy, Mulla Sadra conceives of philosophy as more than a ratiocinative inquiry. It is a mode of being and a way of life whose goal is wisdom and the cultivation of a holy life in which the sage strikes a resemblance to the divine (cf. Plato's Theaetetus). His thought is clearly located within a Neoplatonic paradigm of understanding philosophy as espoused by Pierre Hadot and others. Philosophy is the pursuit of metaphysical truths that are not merely understood and grasped through cognition, but are lived realities, in which philosophers, again following the Platonic tradition, are integrated souls who combine theoretical and practical knowledge and its implementation to effect a holistic ethics of living.

Inquiry entails a two-fold discipline of the mind through logical training and the mental exercises of argumentation, analysis, division and refutation, and the disciplining of the soul through spiritual exercises that facilitate the inhering of divine qualities of knowledge, justice and piety. In the Four Journeys, Mulla Sadra provides this critical definition of philosophy that in itself combines a characteristically Neoplatonic vision of philosophy that reconciles Plato and Aristotle:

Know that philosophy is the perfecting of the human soul, through the cognition of the true natures of existents, as they truly are, through judgements concerning them that are ascertained through apodeixis, and not understood through conjecture, or adherence to prior authority, insofar as is humanly possible. Through philosophy, man acquires a resemblance to the Creator and ascribes a rational order to the cosmos. (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, I: 23)

A number of elements in this definition require some commentary.

2.2. Doing philosophy

Mulla Sadra's method of philosophizing is predicated upon three key modes of acting. First, as we discussed above philosophy is a way of life, a lived mode of being and a process that involves spiritual exercises. For Mulla Sadra, philosophy pursues the summum bonum of enlightened engagement (ma‘rifa) and goodly action, worthy not only of the Aristotelian but also the pious Muslim scholar. To philosophise is to cultivate piety, since the end of philosophy is the higher pious life, a reflection of a Hermetic ideal trope. The more truth one knows, the more pious one becomes. In fact, the more intense one's being, the better one is and the more felicitous. Philosophy is a religious commitment that obscures the conceptual boundary between theory and doctrine. The very pursuit of intellectual inquiry and discourse is itself the greatest good and the means through which one knows how to live a good life, and enables one to ascend to the highest heavenly host. The disciplining of the mind cures the soul of incorrect doxa and the disease of irrationality. It cures the suffering of the soul insofar as it reduces the alienation of the soul from the truth and ultimately from God through the journey of the intellect back to the One. The dynamic of this journey involves the performance of spiritual exercises. Mulla Sadra urges the reader to practise philosophy as an art and a method of self-improvement and spiritual enlightenment (Mulla Sadra 1986: 232-3). The act of meditation is not irrational detachment but rather the exercise of reason (Hadot 1995: 59). Asceticism is a prerequisite for philosophy following the famous saying of first Shiʿi Imam ‘Ali b. Abi Talib: ‘the study of wisdom requires spiritual exercise and forsaking the world.’ In the introduction to the Four Journeys, he urges self-purification and the pursuit of perfection to obtain divine grace and knowledge. True pedagogy allied with divine grace leads man to perfection and self-realisation. In his commentary upon Qur’anic chapter entitled the Event (al-Waqi‘a), he writes,

The perfection of man lies in the perception of universal realities (al-haqa’iq al-kulliyya) and disposition towards divine cognition, and transcendence above material sensibilia, and self-purification from the restraints of carnal and passionate appetites. This can only be acquired through guidance, teaching, discipline, and formation of righteous character (Mulla Sadra 1988, VI: 132).

This is the preliminary stage through which everyone must pass, but a philosopher, and a divine philosopher (hakim muta’allih) at that, must go beyond this stage in pursuit of the quest for reality. It is this quest that leads the wayfarer to a higher philosophy, a hikma muta‘aliya as he describes it in the title of his major work.

Second, he integrates philosophical and spiritual reasoning because, as was common among Islamic Neoplatonists and especially in the method of Suhrawardi, he insisted that philosophy was a mode of Prophetic knowledge inherited in an initiatic chain from Adam down through the Biblical prophets, Greek philosophers, Indian and Babylonian sages through to the Prophet Muhammad and then on through the Muslim philosophers and Sufis. In his treatise on creation (Risala fi huduth al-‘alam), Mulla Sadra summaries this genealogy of philosophy from Adam and the East to the Greeks:

Know that philosophy first issued from Adam, the chosen one of God and from his progeny Seth and Hermes and from Noah because the world can never be free of a person who establishes knowledge of the unity of God and of the return [to God]. The great Hermes disseminated it [philosophy] in the climes and in the countries and explained it and gave benefit of it to the people. He is the father of philosophers and the most learned of the knowledgeable…

As for Rome and Greece, philosophy is not ancient in those places as their original sciences were rhetoric, epistolatory and poetry…until Abraham became a prophet and he taught them the science of divine unity. It is mentioned in history that the first to philosophise from among them [the Greeks] was Thales of Miletus and he named it philosophy. He first philosophised in Egypt and then proceeded to Miletus when he was an old man and disseminated his philosophy. After him came Anaxagoras and Anaximenes of Miletus. After them emerged Empedocles, Pythagoras, Socrates and Plato. (Mulla Sadra 1999a: 153-4)

Third, in terms of method, one needs to integrate ratiocinative, propositional knowledge and a linear mode of reasoning with more intuitive and non-propositional modes of knowing, including in particular what is termed ‘immediate’ or ‘presential’ knowledge. The knowledge of higher metaphysical realities, similar to the Platonic tradition, requires the cultivation of character and surpassing ratiocination. Just as Porphyry and others before had delimited lists of virtues, for Mulla Sadra, the sage possesses the qualities of generosity, good humour, fine judgement, and a pronounced taste and experience of spiritual disclosure (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, VI: 6). Truth must derive its legitimacy and foundation from grace and revelation, and can never find fertile soil merely in the rehearsal of the doctrines of previous philosophers. Phenomenological experience is the ground for philosophy. In the Four Journeys, Mulla Sadra writes:

Know that metaphysical doctrines can only be grasped by inner revelation (mukashafat batiniyya), secret contemplation (mushahadat sirriyya) and existential investigations (mu‘ayanat wujudiyya) and cannot be really known through rehearsing discursive doctrines (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX: 146).

But he is no mystical obscurantist nor does he privilege spiritual intuition above demonstration; rather he argues for their complementarity since ‘demonstration does not conflict with inner disclosure.’ The study of texts moves the seeker to construct a world, to make an intelligible order of the propositions and aporiai that he encounters.

3. Metaphysics

3.1. Being and Existence

Mulla Sadra is often described as a metaphysical revolutionary because of his uniquely posited doctrine of existence. The analysis of existence commences with the ontological distinction between the Necessary (the principle, God) and the contingent. God is pure existence without essence, quality or property that undergoes change or motion. The origins of this doctrine lie in Avicenna's account of radical contingency that considers the distinction between Necessary and contingent to lie in the simplicity of existence of the Necessary producing the complexity of the existence and essence of the contingent, where the contingent is an existent to whom accidents pertain bundled in what is known as their ‘essence’. Contingents are conceptually dyads of existence (the fact that they are) and essence (bundles of properties that define what they are, Mulla Sadra 2001-5, I: 289-92). Since God bestows existence upon contingents, or rather because causally contingents derive their existence from their principle, existence is ontologically prior to essence. Analytically, it may seem to us that the reverse is true because our encounter with things and events takes the phenomenal form of acquaintance with the form and essence of that thing first. But in fact, Mulla Sadra's position on existence is even more radical than the Aristotelian doctrine of pros hen homonymy. Substances are not the primary sense of existence but rather ‘acts of existence’ or processes. In this, and in his doctrine of substantial motion that is discussed below, one can see a systematic rejection of Aristotelian category theory.

Before examining the twin doctrines of the fundamental reality of existence and its modulated but singular character at the heart of his metaphysics, it is worth mentioning some of the preliminary positions that he holds on the nature of existence:

For Mulla Sadra, existence is ontologically prior, a unified reality graded in degrees of intensity and an elusive reality that cannot be fully grasped. Any attempt to conceptualise existence falsifies it through reification that determines an essence grasped in the mind (Mulla Sadra 1964: 6). A reified, fixed and immutable concept cannot capture the nature of existence, which is dynamic and in flux. Ultimately, essences are privative and, citing Ibn al-‘Arabi, they ‘have never smelt the fragrance of being’. They are merely posited in the mind as modes of making sense and of determining reality as ‘beings of reason’. Unpacking this metaphysical package, one can discern three distinct doctrines of existence that draw upon his intellectual influences, which include Avicennan philosophy, the intuitive philosophy of the ishraqi school associated with Suhrawardi, and the Sufi metaphysics of being of Ibn al-‘Arabi.

The first doctrine is the ontological primacy of existence (asalat al-wujud), a doctrine that is located within the debate on the Avicennan distinction between existence and essence in contingent beings as seen through the prism of the Sufi metaphysics of ontological monism (wahdat al-wujud). If contingents are composites, then one element of the composition is active and ontologically prior. Is it the case that there are essences in some of being, such as humanity, that wait for a divine agent to actualize and individuate them through the bestowal of existence, an essentialist doctrine that posits a rather paradoxical existence of an essence before it comes to exist? Or as Mulla Sadra suggests, the divine agent produces existences in this world that take on the “garb” of some particular essence. Existence must be ontologically prior not only because of the absurdity of an existence before existence, but also because God is devoid of essence, and his causal link to the world can only be existential if one wishes to avoid the contamination of the divine nature with essences that are composites of different and multiple properties and features. Mulla Sadra uses this doctrine as part of his own ontological proof for the existence of God known as the Proof of the Veracious (burhan al-siddiqin). The monism of the doctrine is expressed in the phrase basit al-haqiqa kull al-ashya’ (‘The simple reality is all things’, a doctrine predicated on the Neoplatonic notion of the simple One): God, the One is simple and pure Being and thus as such is the totality of existence.

3.2 Monism and pluralism

The second doctrine is the modulation and gradation of existence (tashkik al-wujud). The semantics of the term ‘existence’ and its modulated singularity commits Mulla Sadra to a reality that is equally modulated and singular. Existence is a singular reality, as the phenomenal experience of existence as multiple is illusory. But multiplicity in this world still needs to be explained. Different existents in this world are thus different, intense degrees of a single whole. Thus there is a horizontal and a vertical hierarchy of existence that is connected and involved in a whole chain of existence. The particular degrees of existence are not stable substances in the Aristotelian sense, and thus neither is Sadrian ontology concerned with a multiplicity of substances or the problem that would be raised by the objection: how can all things be one substance? Gradation addresses one of the key problematics of metaphysics that arise from Aristotelianism: “being is predicated in many ways” (Aristotle, Met. 1028a10). Being is a common term that is applied to a number of contexts and expressions: the mental context (mental being, conceptual being), the spoken context (being in speech), the written context (inscribed being), and the real context (concrete, extra-mental being). In all these contexts, being is a shared notion and reality expressed in different ways. But perhaps the most intriguing aspect of the doctrine is the claim that, not only is being the source of commonality, the focal meaning of the instances of being as the Aristotelian tradition would have it, it is also the source of metaphysical variance or distinction, because the hierarchy of being is differentiated through degrees of intensification and debilitation of being (ishtidad wa tada‘‘uf). Thus the old metaphysical debate about the One and the many is settled in favour of both: being or existence is both singular and multiple. The doctrine of the gradation thus provides an explanation for the nature of spiritual hierarchies and the different abilities and dispositions of people but also insists upon the ultimate singularity of human existence. Thus the ethical implications of the doctrine are a thorough social and ontological equality of existents (including humanity, animals, and so forth) coupled with an intellectual and spiritual hierarchy, order, and inequality. Mulla Sadra summaries modulation in the following manner:

Existence is a single, simple reality having neither genus nor differentia, nor a definition or a demonstration or a definiens. It only admits of degrees by perfection and deficiency (bi-l-kamal wa-l-naqs), by priority and posteriority (al-taqaddum wa-l-ta’akhkhur) and by independence and dependence (bi-l-ghina wa-l-haja). (Mulla Sadra 1964: 68-9)

This leads us to the third doctrine that all individuals in existence undergo motion and flux, namely, substantial motion (haraka jawhariyya). The doctrine follows from his position on existence and his rejection of Aristotle's category theory. It also demonstrates how he privileges becoming over static, immutable being. Substantial motion is not the same as substances being in motion, which is considered obvious (Rahman 1975: 95-108; Jambet 2006: 191-223; ‘Ubudiyyat 2006: 309-85). Within an Aristotelian framework, there are two types of change: instantaneous such as the move from potentiality to actuality, and gradual such as the ageing process in things that undergo generation and corruption. This raises two objections to substantial motion: first, if existents are constantly motive, how can there be a subject that we recognise as undergoing change? Second, substances are manifest in essences and these cannot be identified in their species form since motion denies the fixity of the species (and genus) boundaries that define the essence. For Mulla Sadra, the second point is easier to treat: essences are not fundamental to which existence is accidental so the boundaries of what we may conceive an essence to be should not limit existence. On the former, existence is its own subject. Drawing upon Aristotelian hylomorphism, he argues that it is the matter of existence that acquires forms as it constantly changes. An existing entity is not a stable substance constant in time to which change occurs as an accident, such as a young Zayd becoming old and greying; rather, it is a structure of unfolding, dynamic events of existence. The young Zayd is thus literally not the same existent as the old Zayd, since the change in him is substantial and existential. One implication of this doctrine is that at every instance each existent is renewed and thus provides a solution to the old problem of time and creation by asserting that the world is created in time, because at each instant all existence is new in time. As such consistent with other Safavid philosophers and in distinction from the earlier Avicennan tradition, he upholds a philosophical account of the theological doctrine of God's creation of the world from nothing in time. Another implication is to consider time as a dimension of existence, as an analytic property of substantial motion, having no existence independently.

3.3 Proof for the existence of God

These doctrines establish the basic principles for Mulla Sadra's argument for the existence of God. There are many proofs for the existence of God because as Mulla Sadra says there are many signs that indicate Him and facets about Him (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, VI: 15). Kalam cosmological proofs began with the intuition of phenomenal existence requiring a cause; there was a creation which needed a cause to be. There had to be a reason why there was something rather than nothing. Avicenna's famous proof for the Necessary Being began with the concept of existence, proceeded with a modal distinction between necessity and contingent, and arrived at the exigency of a Necessary Being. Avicenna himself called his argument the ‘proof of the veracious’ (burhan al-siddiqin) and his commentator Tusi provided a typology of three proofs for the existence of a Creator, which in turn are the kalam cosmological argument, the proof from motion that derives from Aristotle's Physics, and the Avicennan ontological argument:

The systematic theologians infer from the origination of bodies and properties [pertaining to them] the existence of the Creator and from considering the states of the creation to his attributes one after another.

The natural philosophers also infer from the existence of motion a Mover and from the impossibility of linking motive beings in a chain infinitely the existence of the First Mover who is unmoved. Then from that they infer the existence of the First Principle.

However, the metaphysicians infer from their reflection upon being that it is either necessary or contingent to prove the Necessary. Then by reflecting upon what is entailed by necessity and contingency, they infer his attributes and from his attributes they infer the nature of the emanation of his acts from him one after another.

The master mentioned the preponderance of this method over the others because it is more reliable and nobler. That is because the more excellent of demonstrations is one that yields certainty and it is the inference from the cause to the effect; however, its opposite which is the inference from the effect to the cause may yield certainty and that is if the thing sought has a cause that can only be discerned through it as has been explained in apodeixis. These two levels are posed in his saying — exalted is He: ‘We shall show them our signs in the horizons and in their souls until it is clear to them that He is the Truth. Is it not enough that your Lord is witness for everything?’ [Q. 41:52] (Avicenna, al-Isharat wa-l-tanbihat, Qum, 1996, III: 66-7).

Tusi mentions two types of argumentation that the tradition describes as assertoric proof or quia (burhan inni) and demonstrative proof or propter quid (burhan limmi), the former is an inference from effect to cause and the latter is from cause to effect. The demonstrative proof for Mulla Sadra is the one that is ‘most reliable, most illuminating and most noble’ and it involves an inference of reality by taking God, Existence, as a witness to the totality of existence. This is what he calls the ‘way of the veracious’ (sabil al-siddiqin). What he means by siddiq is not the same as Avicenna and the gap in meaning is a good illustration of the difference in their philosophical method. For Mulla Sadra, the siddiq is one who possesses intuition and inner disclosure that is attained through grace and spiritual exercise. In the exegesis of Q. 57:19 on the phrase ‘those who believe in God and His messengers are the veracious ones and witness before their Lord’, he argues that the siddiq is characterised by witnessing the truth through inner revelation:

What is meant by faith in God and his messengers is a perfect degree of knowledge that is only realised in true knowers. True, inner revealed faith is meant which the saints and mystics possess especially because they are the veracious ones and witnesses due to the utmost level of their attestation [of truth] acquiring through inner revelation (kashf) and due to their self-annihilation acquired due to their inner spiritual struggle against the carnal forces of their souls (Mulla Sadra 1988, VI: 229).

The Avicennan argument was insufficient because it provided an assertoric not a demonstrative proof and because it engaged with the concept but not the concrete reality of being. The Sadrian proof of the veracious is a natural corollary to his position on the fundamental reality and modulation of existence; in fact the latter is significant for its proof.

Existence is a concrete reality that is simple and unique and there is no distinction among its individuals essentially except by perfection and imperfection and intensity and debilitation (Mulla Sadra 1964: 69).

These degrees of existence are acts of the divine essence such that even cosmological proofs are ultimately ontological. Ontological proofs depend on the intelligibility of the concept of being, which must be shared between our notion of our existence and God's existence. This is precisely the point made earlier about the possibility of theology depending upon the concept of modulation.

Journey III of the Four Journeys begins with a discussion of the ways of proving the existence of God. Having discussed previous cosmological and ontological proofs, Mulla Sadra expresses his own ‘method of the veracious’ (manhaj al-siddiqin) in the following manner as a ‘detailed thought experiment’:

The reality of existence (haqiqat al-wujud), by virtue of its being a simple thing (amran basitan), not possessing an essence or a constituent property or a means of being defined, is identical to the Necessary, requiring the most complete perfection that is infinitely intense, because every other degree [of existence], which is weaker in intensity is not the pure reality of existence. Rather, it is existence with deficiency since the deficiency of everything is other than that thing necessarily. The deficiency of existence is not existence itself but rather its privation and this privation is merely attached to existence concomitantly and not the foundation of existence, due to its actuality in a subsequent degree [of existence] and what comes after that. Deficiencies and privations comprise secondary [entities] insofar as they are secondary, but the First is its complete perfection, which has no definition and nothing may be conceived that is more perfect than it. Deficiency and ontological indigence issue from emanation and existentiation and are perfected by it [the Necessary]. The haeccity of these secondaries is attached to the First. So he treats their deficiencies with his perfection and their ontological indigence with his ontological richness.

Thus through this demonstration is the existence of the Necessary proven (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, VI: 17-8).

The Sadrian argument may be summarised as follows:

  1. There is existence
  2. Existence is a perfection above which no perfection may be conceived
  3. God is perfection and perfection in existence
  4. Existence is a singular and simple reality; there is no metaphysical pluralism
  5. That singular reality is graded in intensity in a scale of perfection (that is, a denial of a pure monism).
  6. That scale must have a limit point, a point of greatest intensity and of greatest existence.
  7. Hence God exists (= existence).

Thus the proof begins with the concept and reality of existence and of God and ends with it. It displays an apparent similarity with the argument for the existence of God by intensity or the limit case argument found in Aquinas and discussed in Miller 1996.

Nevertheless, the Sadrian proof remains susceptible to the common criticisms of ontological proofs. It actually seems to be tautological. Because he argues that the reality of being eludes human ability to confine it to discourse, it is not perhaps surprising that the manhaj al-siddiqin is not in strictu sensu an apodeictic proof. In a perceptive gloss, Tabataba’i (d. 1981), the eminent philosopher and commentator, argues that Mulla Sadra does not provide a demonstration but rather an assertoric argument because in effect all proofs for the existence of God begin with his effects and deduce his existence as the cause of those effects. This is because existence is an a priori intuition that all sound intellects possess and within that intuition, the existence of a Necessary Being is logically necessary. Proofs for the existence of God, therefore, are not attempts at producing demonstrations that convince or even fulfil the scientific parameters within proof theory, but are mere reminders to what we already know in our souls and hence corroborate and support faith in the One. This perhaps why Mulla Sadra never refers to his argument as a ‘demonstration’ but as a way (manhaj) of understanding and as a thought experiment (tadhkira). Thus the ‘argument’ may be a useful means for the exposition of a theistic viewpoint but does not fall into the category of persuasion.

3.4 The Simple existence

The argument for the existence of God is relationship to a key doctrine that explains the relationship of the One and the many through the notion of the ‘simple reality’. This is central to Sadrian philosophy, drawing upon the simplicity of the prior One in Enneads V.4[7].1.5–15,

For there must be something prior to all things which is simple, and this must be different from all that comes after it, being by itself, not mixed with those that come after it; yet being able to be present in the others in a different way, being truly one, and not something else which is then one.

In his Treatise on the union of the intellecting subject and object, Mulla Sadra draws on the Plotiniana and states that the Active Intellect is all things. This follows from his doctrine of the primacy and logical priority of existence. In the Four Journeys, he quotes the following text from the tenth chapter of the Theologia Aristotelis, an extract that exemplifies how the doctrine of the simple reality reconciles monism and pluralism by advocating neither.

The Pure One is the cause of all things and not of all things. Rather it is the beginning of everything and not all things. All things are in it and not in it. All things flow from it and subsist and are sustained by it and return to it. So if someone says: how is it possible that things are from a simple one that has no duality or multiplicity in it in any sense? I say: because a pure simple one has nothing in it, but because it is a pure one, all things flow from it. Thus when there was no existence (huwiyya), being flowed from it (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, VII: 351).

In his commentary, Mulla Sadra espouses a form of Neoplatonic procession and doctrine of the intellect-psuchē that is at odds with most of his philosophical discourse in the Four Journeys. First, he accepts the standard account of the Theologia. Nous as the first existent flows immediately from the One and from it, existents proceed through the mediation of the intelligible realm. Second, the One is itself above perfection and plenitude. The first existent and the first perfect being is nous. This Neoplatonic background is significant because it seems to cause a problem for modulation. Can this simple reality be modulated and if that is the case does it not entail multiplicity in the godhead? The second part of the objection is answered in the quoted objection in the passage above. But for the first, following Enneads VI.2.20 it is clear that being is a quasi-genus in which the whole is prior to its parts but, because of its ‘potency’, remains unaffected by any procession. This refers to the One, nous and all beings.

The doctrine of the simple reality is difficult but central to Sadrian philosophy. The argument presented in the Wisdom of the Throne concerns the nature of God as that simple being and illustrates His knowledge of things through it (Morris 1981: 98-99). The concept is central to resolving many theological problems relating to the nature of God. Indeed, it is an important ontological proof for the existence of God through an analysis of simplicity.

Every simple reality is, by virtue of its unity, all things. It is not deprived of any of these things except by way of imperfections, privations and contingencies (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, VI: 185).

God is simple being because He is described by being, and being is a unique, simple reality. It is simplicity devoid of essence (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, VI: 45-51). That simplicity is uncontaminated by multiplicity, privation, imperfection or any such negative property. God's existence is pure and unencumbered by complexity such as an essence that might raise questions of genera, division, composition and definition.

This is God without multiplicity, at the level of singularity that encompasses the attributes considered intrinsically and not manifested towards and manifesting the cosmos. The concept of a thing does not entail or include either its privation or its imperfection as there is ‘no alterity in being since alterity is privation’. Thus the simple reality that is God does not include or entail imperfections or privations. An objection to this could be that negative attributes are affirmed in theology, especially in the Shiʿi tradition in which one emphasises those concepts and properties that cannot be predicated of Him such as ‘He is not a body’, nor ‘confined in a space’ and so on. The answer is that since these properties are negative, privative and imperfect, one can affirm them because ‘the negation of negation is being and the negation of imperfection is perfection in being’.

Mulla Sadra then proceeds to an analysis of language and signification:

Thus [taking the example] you say C is not B. In this context, if that with respect to which C is C is exactly the same as that with respect to which C is not B, so that C in itself would in its very essence be the referent for the negation, then [if this were so] the essence of C would be privative fact since everyone who intellects C would also intellect not B. But the consequent is invalid so the antecedent must be too. Thus it is established that [for every C] the subject of C-ness is a composite essence. Thus the mind distinguishes an existential meaning by which C is and a privative meaning by which C is not B or anything else negated of it.

The point being made concerns the existence-essence distinction. Everything that is not simple but complex is a composite pair of existence and essence. But it also illustrates how the simple reality is an existence and encompasses things qua their existence and not their essence. Even more so, the simple existence has nothing to be negated because simplicity cannot be analysed into parts or components.

If anything can be negated of an existential factor, then it is not a simple reality. Every simple reality is all things with respect to their existence and completeness and not with respect to their privation and incompleteness.

A simple reality cannot be predicated of anything since it is simple and unconditioned. This affirms diversity-in-unity since if nothing can be predicated of God, then it follows that the cosmos cannot be predicated of Him. Thus, it denies existential monism.

The final part of the argument then relates this to the nature of God's knowledge and His immediate presence to things such that the ‘claim of the unjust’ that He does not know particulars cannot arise. This is, of course, a reference to the dispute between Avicenna and al-Ghazali on God's knowledge of particulars.

It is established that His knowledge of all things is a simple knowledge and their presence in Him is a simple reality. Knowledge is only an expression for existence on the condition that it not be mixed with matter.

Thus simplicity defines the nature of God's knowledge.

The doctrine of the simple reality has two further roles. First, it provides a proof for the existence of God by perfection, as the most intense limit case, given that simplicity is an attribute of perfection. Second, it affirms his necessity in every sense thus negating the famous doubt of Ibn Kammūna [d. 1284] of the postulation of two necessary existences. Simplicity denies any contingent facet to God, who is necessary in every sense. God is simple existence as He is uniquely necessary in and by Himself.

4. Noetics — Epistemology and Psychology

Mulla Sadra applies his metaphysics to problems in psychology and eschatology as well. Just as the totality of existence is singular with degrees of intensity, similarly intellect and the soul are singular realities with grades of intensity, since there is an intimate connection among existence, the intellect, and the soul as the concrete, intellectual, and psychic aspects of being. This entails a thoroughgoing pan-psychism in which for Mulla Sadra all existents are sentient beings that aspire to be "more intense" than they are, to a higher ontological level. Everything that exists thus possesses consciousness. Since all levels of intellect are connected, knowledge is an existential relationship of identity and the cognition of certainty in which the intellecting subject becomes identified with the intellected object (ittihad al-‘aqil wa-l-ma‘qul). Further, he uses his doctrine of modulation to explain physical resurrection, a theological doctrine that traditionally could not be philosophically demonstrated. He distinguishes two levels of resurrection that involve two "types" of body, a purely physical one and an “imaginal” body that is as real as the physical. The imaginal body is at first resurrected and can be demonstrated. This is predicated upon the existence of an ontological state of being known as the imaginal (mithali) that mediates between an intelligible world of concepts and the sensible world of things. It is used to explain those traditions that discuss abstract concepts such as fear and desire as having physical or corporeal features in resurrection. Concepts from the intelligible world can mimic the physicality of this world through the mediation of the imaginary realm of being.

4.1 The Nature of the Soul

The soul is an eternal and independent immaterial substance for Mulla Sadra. It is separate from (but attached to) the body and is the true bearer of identity (Mulla Sadra 2004: 467). As we saw above in the doctrine of substantial motion, the soul is on the path of perfection towards simplicity and unity and its reversion to its origins in the One. In itself the soul is eternal and incorruptible and does not die with the body but reverts to its origins with the One (Mulla Sadra 2004: 515). Where does the soul come from? Given the Neoplatonic influence on Mulla Sadra, one would expect him to insist upon the pre-existence of the soul and various texts are adduced in favour of such a position. However, he makes a distinction between the species ‘soul’ which he calls the ‘Adamic soul’ and the individual human soul. The basic problem with allowing for the pre-existence of the individual soul is that it potentially opens the way for a belief in metempsychosis which he rejects, as we shall see. In the Wisdom of the Throne, he argues for the pre-existence of the human soul as a category:

The Adamic soul has an existence preceding the body without this entailing metempsychosis or necessitating the pre-eternity of the individual soul, which is the well-known doctrine of Plato. This mode of pre-existence does not require the multiplicity of individuals of a single species or their differentiation without reference to matter or any disposition towards matter. Nor does it entail the soul's being divided after it had been one in the manner of continuous essences. Nor does it suppose the soul's inactivity before being united with bodies (Mulla Sadra 1981, 140-1).

The individual soul is the bearer of its body, its vehicle (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX: 63-4). It comes into existence with the body and still retains the sense of being the entelechy of the body which is why the two cannot be detached (Mulla Sadra 2004: 240). Just as existence is not an accident of essence but is the principle to which an essence is attached, similarly the soul is not an accident of the body (Mulla Sadra 1981: 139).

4.2 The Soul-Body relationship

The central feature of the soul-body relationship in Mulla Sadra is expressed in the phrase that the soul is ‘corporeal in its origination and spiritual in its survival’ (jismaniyyat al-huduth wa-ruhaniyyat al-baqa’). In the Wisdom of the Throne, he describes the birth of the soul and its relationship to the body through its progression to the afterlife:

The human soul has many stations and degrees from the beginning of its generation to the end of its goal and it has certain essential states and modes of existence. First, in its state of attachment to the body it is a corporeal substance; then it progresses gradually in intensity and develops through stages of its creation until it becomes self-subsistent and separates from this world to the next and returns to its Lord.

It is corporeal in its origination but spiritual in its survival. The first thing to be generated in its state of attachment is a corporeal faculty, then a natural form, then a sensing soul in its levels, then the reflective and recollective, and finally the rational soul. It acquires the practical and then the theoretical intellect to the limit of being an actualised intellect and finally the Active Intellect (Mulla Sadra 1981: 131-2).

The progress of the soul in this world is through the perfection of intellect that is the life and prime faculty of the soul. Its embodiment facilitates its acquisition of knowledge and the perfection of its intellect but also acts as a cage of restraint. What we see in this passage above is the progression of the soul-intellect through the five stages of the perfection of the intellect described in Avicenna. The soul begins as receptive potentially, then acquires the habit of learning and intellecting until this is perfected; then it is an acquired intellect properly trained. The next stage is the ability of the soul to produce knowledge actively, by being an active intellect; finally it acquires certainty through union with the Active Intellect, a transcendent principle of perfect knowledge which we discuss below. The distinction between the sphere of the intellect and that of the body constitutes a type of dualism that is reflected in Mulla Sadra's distinction between mental and extra-mental existence.

4.3 Mental Existence

For Mulla Sadra, the mind possesses an ontological realm that one calls mental existence, a concept that is equivalent to existence-knowledge (Rahman 1975: 215-20). He is a realist in the sense that every thought must correspond to a real object even if it is a Meinong object, that is, an unreal object of cognition. By positing a realm of mental reality, he is a dualist. But the existence of the mind and mental existence are not the same since the existence of the mind is itself an extra-mental reality, while mental existence is what refers to extra-mental existence. This is a subtle but significant distinction. He clarifies this in response to an objection that the existence of a thing cannot be analytically dissolved into the mental and extra-mental (i.e. concrete) being of a thing. Consequently, for Mulla Sadra, the ‘hard problem’ of mind-body does not occur since the existence of the mind is extra-mental existence. There are two primary modes of existence each distinct and radically non-interchangeable: being in re and mental existence.

The philosophers have agreed, in opposition to most of the speculative theologians that apart from this mode of existence, things have another mode of existence and manifestation that is similarly arranged and undergoes similar causation. [That mode] is called mental existence (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, I: 313).

Mental existence shares the same qualities, features and description as extra-mental existence because it is merely another mode of existence, a certain sense of the term. Just as extra-mental existence is not ambiguous, neither is mental existence. It is homonymous and modulated. Similarly mental existence is not a universal; we have seen above the argument denying that the concept of existence is a universal. The distinction between mental and extra-mental is rooted in the Platonic distinction between sensible and intelligible being, and in the Avicennan distinction between existence and essence in contingents.

4.4 The Nature of Knowledge

Mulla Sadra inherited a variety of theories ranging from Platonic recollection (anamnesis) and division to Peripatetic syllogistics, definitions and axiomatic science. Broadly speaking, our author recognises three different epistemological methods. The first is a co-relational model of knowledge (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, III: 317). In this model, knowledge is a relation between a subject and an object that is devoid of cognitive content in itself and is not intrinsically intelligible. It is a property of the knower and devoid of actual process. Knowledge is dispositional. As such, this theory is marked by radical internalism. This is a view associated with later mediaeval theologians (especially Fakhr al-Din Razi) and rejected. It is unacceptable to Mulla Sadra precisely because it is predicated upon a denial of mental being. According to this model, knowledge is negative insofar as it is solipsistic (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, III: 318).

The second model is the correspondence or representation theory of knowledge by apprehension (al-‘ilm al-husuli al-irtisami). ‘I know that P’ means that there is an external object P that corresponds to an internal concept P. The mind is thus the ‘mirror of nature’. It judges a relationship between the extra-mental object and the mental picture of it as described in Wittgenstein's picture theory. The inadequacies of this model are clear. It fails to account for conceivables that do not exist. Knowledge is the correspondence between the object and the subject, and mediated. It presupposes the existence of independent extra-mental entities ‘out there’ and is strongly dualistic. The mind abstracts the form from the matter of the thing and represents it. As such it is a negative fact. One can only grasp the form in the mind since the essences of things are not available to us. But Mulla Sadra argues that the consequent is clearly false, so the antecedent is as well (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, III: 316). They are available to us insofar as they exist and are present to us. Knowledge is not an abstraction. The accidental material forms of intelligibles thus grasped are not the true objects of knowledge; those are the pure intelligibles experienced directly (Ha’iri Yazdi 1992: 35). This Peripatetic doctrine is rejected. It is quite wrong to assume in this model that perception is so mediated that it requires an interface between the mind and external objects (often called qualia). This model does not actually yield the reality of the thing, though it does seek the essence of things. Mulla Sadra quotes Avicenna (from al-Ta‘liqat, Avicenna 1973: 34).

The realities of things are not available to man; we only know the specific attributes, the concomitant attributes and the accidents of things, and we do not know the differentiae that are constituents of everything, one of which indicates its reality. Rather, we know that there are things that have specific attributes and accidents (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, I: 461).

It remains the case that Mulla Sadra accepts a correspondence theory of knowledge though it is not his preferred option for arriving at indubitable knowledge.

However, these models are insufficient and do not yield certainty, which is only available through the third model of knowledge by presence.

Being can only be known by visionary presential knowledge (al-‘ilm al-huduri al-shuhudi), and the inner-reality of light can only be perceived by an immediate illuminative correlation (al-idafa al-ishraqiyya) and actual presence (al-hudur al-‘ayni). If something is known by formal knowledge, it changes the reality of it (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, I: 489).

This formulation draws heavily upon Suhrawardi's earlier exposition of presential knowledge (e.g. Suhrawardi 1998: 79-81) but with the distinction that Mulla Sadra explicitly refers to reality in terms of existence whereas for Suhrawardi existence is an empty concept.

4.5 Identity of the Intellect and what is intellected

Critical to presential knowledge is the Porphyrian doctrine of the unity of the intellect, the intellecting subject and its intelligible object. Pure self-knowledge for Plotinus depends on union with the divine intellect that self-intellects. Such a noetic experience is non-discursive.

Avicenna strongly criticises this doctrine (Avicenna 1996, III: 292-93; Avicenna 1959: 239-40). One thing cannot become another substantially, nor can a rational soul unite with the Active Intellect which is indivisible. The human intellect cannot be united with intelligibilia. Rather one knows things by conjunction (ittisal) not union (ittihad) with the Active Intellect from whence one grasps the universals of things immanent in it. The soul receives the forms from the Active intellect but remains unchanged itself. The forms inhere in the soul-intellect through the material intellect. Avicenna criticises Porphyry for popularising the fallacy of union and change. But in doing so Avicenna marks a sharp distinction between God's knowledge and human knowledge. According to Mulla Sadra, one cannot hold such a view about God's knowledge because it violates both His unity and the fact of His knowledge of particulars.

Mulla Sadra's criticism of Avicenna is predicated upon two central doctrines of his that are intimately linked to the hermeneutic of modulation. First, the primacy (and modulation) of existence proves this union.

Existence in everything is foundational…It is the principle of individuality (mabda’ al-shakhsiyya) and the source of the essence of the thing. Existence can become more intense and become weaker, it can become more perfect and it can become imperfect, yet the individual remains who he is (al-shakhs huwa huwa). Do you not see that man from his beginning as a foetus to the end of his being intellects and is intellected while his contexts and situations change yet the mode of his existence and his individuality remain constant (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, III: 351).

Second, the doctrine of (trans-)substantial motion defends union. The soul is in motion as ‘pure act’ (fi‘liyya). Further, union is not a substantial or even conceptual one but an epistemic and referential union in which the components ‘become one existent insofar as a single intelligible notion refers to it.’ The ultimate nature of knowledge, like existence, does not distinguish strictly between the divine and human. Multiplicity in the intellect does not entail multiplicity in God because these intelligibilia are correlated as ‘illuminative relations’. Being-intellecting and being-intellected are correlatives that cannot exist independently.

The simple intellect (that is God) knows all things since all things are present in it and it is the ultimate referent for all concepts. This is the ‘internality thesis’, that all intelligibilia are internal to intellect and the objects of sense perception are external. Our philosopher strongly criticises Avicenna for holding the concept of the simple intellect (which for Avicenna is simple cognition that is non-discursive and without recourse to forms) whilst denying the union of the intellecting subject and its object. Furthermore, for the Peripatetic tradition, the human intellect in this life cannot attain the level of the pure simple intellect. Mulla Sadra refutes this:

If the simple intellect (al-‘aql al-basit) (which he believes exists in the human species and in separable substances) is not [all] intelligibilia, then how can souls benefit from what does not occur in them? How can souls move from potentiality to actuality from what is not in them? (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, III: 405)

The mode of the existence of things in this simple intellect is known as ‘the thing (or fact) itself’ (nafs al-amr) or the immanent object. This simple and higher intellect is not abstracted but contains all lower and complex forms and degrees of existence. It is in this sense that this nous is a ‘unity-in-plurality’. It is also the Aristotelian active intellect of De Anima III.5.

But how does one safeguard individuality and the ontological distinction of man and God? The solution is through the concept of intelligibility and forms. All intelligibilia and forms exist in the simple/active intellect in potentia, but their actualisations are individual existents extrinsic to the intellect. The Active intellect is thus the referent for the predication of intelligibilia. This union does not dissolve the individual existence of intellects.

The intellect is all things intelligible. This does not mean that it is all those things in their extra-mental individual modes of existence collected together as this is impossible. Rather it means that all essences that exist in extra-mental reality through many different existences exist in the intellect through multiple intelligible existences in a singular intelligible existence that in its unity and simplicity is all those meanings (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, III: 365).

True knowledge resides therefore in uniting with the Active Intellect. Distinction within this realm is by modulation, by varying motion and lights upon lights in order of nobility. In this model of knowledge, there is pure self-reflexivity, no doxa about forms and no epistēmē about sensibilia. It is a form of infallibilism. One cannot mistake state A for state B since one must first cognise state A. But is this form of knowledge useful and does it communicate? Or it is merely ineffable like so many beliefs and feelings that are important to the way we live our lives. In the simple intellect one knows things at once. Thus for a proposition A, we do not know S first and then P but both simultaneously. But the content of the simple intellect unlike Avicenna's account is not different to the discursive dianoic intellect. S and P are contents of A whether one knows A simply or discursively. This deals with one of the famous objections to non-propositional thought in Plotinus, that of entailing non-complexity. What is required is an adequate metalanguage of such experience since one can and does talk about such knowledge. One can forge a linguistic discipline to discuss it but the presential knowledge involved is not informational and cannot be grounds for public knowledge but indicators for initiates. The immediacy, infallibility and successful cognition of presential knowledge privileges it over other epistemological models.

5. Eschatology

For Mulla Sadra, the eschaton is merely a new mode or renewal of existence in a different level of manifestation and as such remains very much within the remit of metaphysics. The very discussion of eschatology within philosophy is significant. In the famous attack by al-Ghazali (d. 1111) in his Incoherence of the Philosophers, thinkers such as Avicenna were condemned for heresy for their failure to demonstrate the supposed Qur’anic account of physical resurrection and the reality of the afterlife. One of the features of Mulla Sadra's philosophy is to extend the remit of philosophy to cover issues on which the likes of Avicenna felt one needed to be silent. Therefore, Mulla Sadra set himself the tasks of proving physical resurrection, spending much time discussing what was meant by the resurrection body (and indeed the body of the afterlife), the refutation of metempsychosis and affirming the reality of the afterlife. His notion of existence as a constantly dynamic process of becoming and unfolding that remains a singular reality and process allows him to incorporate this world of generation and corruption and annex it to the higher plane of resurrection and finally the existence of the afterlife.

5.1 The Eleven Principles

The holism of Mulla Sadra's approach may be seen in his examination of eschatology. One of the key points of contention in mediaeval Islamic thought concerned the possibility of metempsychosis, an idea that had permeated through the Neo-pythagoreanising Neoplatonism of Late Antiquity into Islam. Previous Islamic philosophers had even demonstrated some sympathy with the idea. But Mulla Sadra, consistent with the tradition of Avicenna, rejected the notion as inimical to his vision of the nature of the soul, its pre-existence, its faculties and its afterlife. Before criticising metempsychosis, Mulla Sadra argued that a proper understanding of the principles of his philosophical method will make clear his objection to the idea. In the relevant section of the Four Journeys, Mulla Sadra (2001-5, IX: 261-72) sets these eleven principles:

First, existence is a foundational principle and essence is an accidental property that pertains specifically to an existent. Significantly, this also means that existence is not merely a concept that one ascribes to a property that pertains to essences that we analyse in extra-mental reality.

Second, and concomitantly, existence is the principle of individuation, not essence. This amounts to saying the existence is the prime determinant of identity and the bundled structure for various properties that pertain to an identity over time.

Third, it is in the nature of existence that it is singular but graded and modulated. It undergoes intensification and debilitation. The different essences that attach to existence in the mind are differentiated by species, genus and accident.

Fourth, and concomitantly, because existence undergoes intensification, substances that are manifestations of existence are constantly in flux and undergo motion.

Fifth, and related point, every composite essence is defined and identified by its form and not by its matter, because hylomorphism affirms that form is the active principle and matter the passive.

Sixth, following from the earlier point about identity, the identity of every single person is defined by its existence and this applies to heavenly bodies as well.

Seventh, the identity of the body is determined by its soul and not by its materiality. Human identity remains constant through the eternality of the soul from its form in the womb to childhood through to old age and into the grave and beyond into the world of the afterlife.

Eighth, the imaginative faculty (which in Mulla Sadra's epistemology following Avicenna is critical for the production of new knowledge) is an immaterial property that does not inhere in a particular part of the brain but rather transcends the body and hence (in Platonic terms) can unite with like immaterial intelligible in the higher noetic world.

Ninth, imaginative forms are produced by the soul and are not merely states in which the soul finds itself, that is, they are not passively received.

Tenth, corporeal and other physical forms became actualised through matter receiving dispositions and states.

Eleventh and final point, existence is graded and has three primary planes (defined again in Platonic terms): the world of material and sensible forms, the world of immaterial forms, and the world of intelligible forms. Humans, for example, retain the same existence and identity across these three planes of being hence denying the need for metempsychosis. Metaphysics therefore determines one's view of eschatology and the afterlife and provides the principles for understanding one's origins, present states and the future.

5.2 Eschatology as Completion of Metaphysics

However, the future is also the culmination and the perfection of the present. Existence is in motion towards perfection. The existence of a thing is associated with its perfected form in the future. In this sense, the afterlife is merely a relative concept. As we have seen, it is the intellect and the faculty of imagination that are the distinguishing features that constitute individual survival. Contrary to most philosophers before him, matter is not the principle of individuation and therefore individual identity and personhood can exist divorced from matter, and the soul is immaterial, as are the bodies of the afterlife (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX: 311).

One's existence is a process of reversion to the One, an unfolding of becoming that progresses from our corporeal incipience with the body through the perfection of the soul that gradually jettisons the physical body of this world in search of the beatitude and ecstasy of the intelligible world and of the afterlife (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX: 164). The existence of the afterlife is more subtle, more perfect and closer to the One. The pleasures and pains of the afterlife that are scripturally discussed are primarily spiritual and intelligible although they retain an attachment to a body, unlike the body of this world, one which is devoid of matter (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX: 165-6).

Matter is inert and pure potentiality and, since the existence of the afterlife is free from potentiality and baseness, the body of the afterlife cannot be material. It is an image of the body that a particular identity possessed. Mulla Sadra was keen to insist upon the Qur’anic account of bodily resurrection but he recognised that it was difficult to provide a philosophical account of the resurrection of this world's physical body. Hence his solution is to argue that humans have different bodies corresponding to different levels of existence, in itself an application of substantial motion. Corporeal existence is not eternal but mortal (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX: 167). Bodies in this world exist through sensible forms; but the existence of the afterlife involves spiritual bodies attached to intelligible forms (Jambet 2006: 394-6). A corollary of his position on the survival of the soul-intellect in the afterlife through its perfection is the recognition that some intellects that remain potential and un-actualised have no afterlife. They are prevented from sharing in the happiness of the afterlife because the existence of the afterlife has no place for the absence of active intellect and potentiality (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX: 183-8).

The key point for Mulla Sadra to save the appearance of the Qur’anic account is to assert that the scripture does not define the nature of the body that is resurrected. The body of this world has physicality, corporeality, volume and so forth and significantly is finite. The body of the afterlife is ‘born of the (perfected) soul’ and still retains the property of being a body but unlike one with which we are familiar (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX, 279-80). The second birth of the human is this new body and soul of the afterlife: he tries to settle his argument with a quotation from Jesus: ‘One who is not born twice will never reach the heavens of the afterlife’ (Mulla Sadra 2001-5, IX: 302).

6. Legacy and the school of Mulla Sadra

Mulla Sadra has become the dominant philosopher of the Islamic East and his approach to the nature of philosophy has been exceptionally influential. His real achievement apart from his doctrinal propositions was to effect a culmination of a tendency within the philosophical schools of the post-Avicennan period, namely to synthesize and reconcile reason and intuition, faith and rational inquiry, philosophy and mysticism within a largely late Neoplatonic paradigm of doing philosophy. Philosophy is thus a practice and a way of life in which reflection, reading, and learning are always complemented by spiritual practices and exercises. One cannot become a sage purely on the basis on one's own intellectual efforts, nor can one truly understand the nature of reality as an illiterate ascetic reliant solely on mystical intuition. In this way, Mulla Sadra, in a manner representative of a number of Muslim thinkers insistent upon the median way of their faith, represents a mean between ‘excessive’ ratiocination and the unfettered claims of pure experience made by mystics.

His influence on philosophical practice and learning is evident. His commentary on the peripatetic work al-Hidaya (The Guidance) of Athir al-Din Abhari (d. 662 AH/1264) became the cornerstone of the rationalist curriculum of the Indian madrasa from the 18th century. In Iran, the study of Islamic philosophy takes its cue from the study and commentary on his major works at least from the nineteenth century. The revival of Islamic philosophy in Isfahan ushered in by ‘Ali Nuri (d. 1251 AH/1836) and later Hadi Sabzavari (d. 1289 AH/1873), described as the ‘last great Islamic philosopher,’ established Mulla Sadra as the ultimate philosopher, whose thought and arguments ‘transcended’ discursive Peripatetic philosophy and also intuitive and allusive mystical arguments and discourse, in favour of a higher synthesis that combined ratiocinative arguments with mystical insight, complete syllogistic demonstrations with narrative, allusion, and allegory. In more recent times, some of the key thinkers involved in the Islamic Revolution of 1979, such as Ayatollah Khomeini and Mortaza Motahhari, were profoundly influenced by the thought of Mulla Sadra, and some have even attempted to appropriate Mulla Sadra as the ‘philosopher of the Revolution’ despite the distinct lack of an engagement with political philosophy in his work. The contemporary generation of seminary trained philosophers in Iran including the prayer leader of Qum, Ayatullah ‘Abdullah Javadi Amuli (who has a useful ten volume commentary on the Four Journeys), are all students of the late ‘Allama Tabataba’i (d. 1981) who wrote an influential set of glosses on the work of Mulla Sadra. His school dominates the Shi‘i seminary in Iran.

However, there are other philosophical trends in the contemporary period that are quite critical of Mulla Sadra's approach and metaphysics. Avicennans such as Mirza Abu-l-Hasan Jilveh (d. 1896) and his students continued to defend an ontology of substances and metaphysical pluralism, while monists such as Muhammad Riza Qumshihi (d. 1888) were equally dissatisfied with Mulla Sadra's attempt to reconcile monism and pluralism. The Shaykhi school established by Shaykh Ahmad al-Ahsa’i (d. 1826) took issue with the ontological commitments of Mulla Sadra's semantics of being. A more recent tendency, the so-called school of the separation of the religious and secular sciences (maktab-i tafkik), accuse Mulla Sadra of conflating the faith and the study of scripture with ‘Greek science’ and of violating the literal sense of scriptural verses in pursuit of his philosophical agenda; they argue that Mulla Sadra does not represent an ‘authentic’, scripturalist philosophy.


For basic guides to his life, works and thought, see:

A. Editions

The Sadra Islamic Philosophy Research Institute (Bunyad-i hikmat-i Islami-yi Sadra, SIPRIn) based in Tehran, Iran, has been producing critical editions of his works in recent years, following and coinciding with major conferences (1999, 2004). Translations into English have been commissioned for most of these works.

Works edited so far:

There are a few other critical editions:

B. Translations

C. Modern biographies

D. Modern studies

E. Other References

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Ibn Arabi | Suhrawardi