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Multiple Realizability

First published Mon Nov 23, 1998; substantive revision Thu Jul 27, 2006

In the philosophy of mind, the multiple realizability thesis contends that a single mental kind (property, state, event) can be realized by many distinct physical kinds. A common example is pain. Many philosophers have asserted that a wide variety of physical properties, states, or events, sharing no features in common at that level of description, can all realize the same pain. This thesis served as a premise in the most influential argument against early theories that identified mental states with brain states (psychoneural identity theories). It also served in early arguments for functionalism. Nonreductive physicalists later adopted it (usually without alteration) to challenge all varieties of psychophysical reductionism. The argument has even been employed to challenge the functionalism it initially motivated.

Reductionists have offered numerous responses. Initial responses either attacked the argument from the multiple realizability premise to the anti-reduction/identity theory conclusion or proposed revisions to classical reductionism that accommodated the premise. More recently, some reductionists have questioned the truth of the multiple realizability premise itself.

1. Multiple Realizability Arguments

1.1 What is Multiple Realizability?

The multiple realizability thesis about the mental is that a given psychological kind (like pain) can be realized by many distinct physical kinds: brain states in the case of earthly mammals, electronic states in the case of properly programmed digital computers, green slime states in the case of extraterrestrials, and so on. Correctly characterizing the realization relation remains a contentious matter in analytic metaphysics (Gillett 2003, Polger 2004). But whatever the correct account turns out to be, the multiple realizability thesis about the mental is that a given psychological kind (like pain) can stand in that relationship to many distinct physical kinds.

In a pair of examples illustrating multiple realizability in special sciences (economics and psychology), Jerry Fodor (1974) implicitly distinguished between two types of the relation. Call the first type, illustrated in the examples provided at the end of the previous paragraph, multiple realizability "over physical structure-types": creatures with distinct physical structures realizing their psychological states can nevertheless entertain the same psychological states. A more radical type of multiple realizability would obtain if a token physical (e.g., nervous) system can realize a single mental kind via distinct physical states of that same system at different times. Call this second sense multiple realizability "in a token system over times." (These terms are from John Bickle 1998, Chapter 4.) This second sense is more radical because there could be a disjunction of physical states realizing each mental kind for every existing cognizer. The importance of the more radical type is discussed further (section 1.5 below).

1.2 Arguments Against “Reductive” Mind-Brain Identity Theories

In a series of papers published throughout the 1960s, Hilary Putnam introduced multiple realizability into the philosophy of mind. Against the "brain state theorists," who held that every mental kind is identical to some as-yet-undiscovered neural kind, Putnam (1967) notes the wide variety of terrestrial creatures seemingly capable of experiencing pain. Humans, other primates, other mammals, birds, reptiles, amphibians, and even mollusks (e.g., octopi) seem reasonable candidates. But then for the “brain state theory” to be true, there must be some physical-chemical kind common to this wide variety of pain-bearing species, and correlated exactly with each occurrence of the mental kind. (This is a necessary condition of the hypothesized type-identity.) But comparative neuroanatomy and physiology, facts about convergent evolution, and the corticalization of function (especially sensory function) as cortical mass increases across species all speak against this requirement.

In addition, early mind-brain identity theorists insisted that these identities, while contingent, hold by virtue of natural (scientific) law. But then any physically possible cognizer (e.g., pain-bearer) must also be capable of possessing that physical-chemical kind. Here the well-known philosophers' fantasies enter the discussion. Silicon-based androids, artificially intelligent electronic robots, and Martians with green slime pulsating within their skulls all seem to be possible pain realizers. But they lack “brain states” comparable to ours at any level of physical description. Further still, these mind-brain identity theories were supposed to be completely general. Every mental kind was held to be identical to some neural kind. So the critic needs to find only one mental kind, shared across species yet realized differently at the physical-chemical level. Putnam acknowledges that the early identity theories were empirical hypotheses. But one of their consequences was "certainly ambitious" and very probably false.

Stated in canonical form, Putnam's original multiple realizability argument draws an anti-identity theory conclusion from two premises:

  1. (the multiple realizability thesis) All mental kinds are multiply realizable by distinct physical kinds.
  2. If a given mental kind is multiply realizable by distinct physical kinds, then it cannot be identical to any specific physical kind.
  3. (the anti-identity thesis conclusion) No mental kind is identical to any specific physical kind.

In this simple form, this is a deductively valid argument.

Fodor (1974) extended Putnam's initial argument by arguing that reductionism imposes too strong a constraint on acceptable theories in special sciences like psychology. According to Fodor, reductionism is the conjunction of "token physicalism" with the claim that there are natural kind predicates in an ideally completed physics corresponding to each natural kind term in any ideally completed special science. He characterized "token physicalism" in turn as the claim that all events that science talks about are physical events—a weaker thesis than reductionism or type-type physicalism. Consider the following string of numerals:

1  1  2.

This string contains two types of numerals (1 and 2), but three tokens of the two types (two tokens of the numeral type 1 and one token of the numeral type 2). Mental states admit of a similar ambiguity. When you and I both entertain the belief that Fodor advocates a Language of Thought, one type of mental state is entertained, but two tokens of that type (your belief state and my belief state). Type-type physicalism insists that types of mental states are identical to types of physical states; this view runs afoul of multiple realizability. But token physicalism only insists that each token occurrence of each type of mental state is identical to some token occurrence of a physical state type—not necessarily an occurrence of a token of the same physical state type on each occasion.

Fodor gave reductionists the best-developed theory of reduction at the time: Ernest Nagel's (1961) "derivability" account of intertheoretic reduction. Nagel's account "connects" disparate elements of the reduced and reducing theories' vocabularies via "bridge laws" (not Nagel's term!) and claims a reduction when the laws of the reduced theory are derived from the laws of the reducing and the bridge laws. According to Fodor (1974), if reductionism is to establish physicalism, these cross-theoretic bridge laws must assert (contingent) identities of reduced and reducing kinds. But given multiple realizability, the only way this can obtain is if the physical science constituent of a psychophysical bridge law is a disjunction of all the terms denoting possible physical realizations of the mental kind. Given the extent and variety of actual (not to say possible) physical realizations, it is overwhelmingly likely that the disjunctive component will not be a kind-predicate of any specific physical science. It is also overwhelmingly likely that the disjunctive component will not appear in any genuine law of a specific physical science. Multiple realizability thus demonstrates that the additional requirement of reductionism (beyond token physicalism) is empirically untenable.

1.3 Arguments for Functionalism

The multiple realizability premise has also been used, albeit more indirectly, in early arguments for functionalism. Functionalism in the philosophy of mind individuates mental states in terms of their causes and effects. Pain, for example, is caused by tissue damage or trauma to bodily regions, and in turn causes beliefs (e.g., that one is in pain), desires (e.g., that one relieves the pain), and behaviors like crying out, nursing the damaged area, and seeking out pain relieving drugs. Any internal state that mediates a similar pattern of causes and effects is pain—regardless of the specific physical mechanisms that mediate the pattern in any given case. Ned Block and Jerry Fodor (1972) note that the multiple realizability of mental on physical types shows that any physicalist type-identity hypothesis will fail to be sufficiently abstract. Functionalism, on the other hand, seems to be at the next level of abstraction up from explanation of behavior based on physical mechanisms. In addition, it seems sufficiently abstract to handle multiple realizability. Block and Fodor also note that multiple realizability at the level of physical description is a common characteristic of ordinary functional kinds, like mousetraps and valve lifters. Characterizing mental kinds as functional kinds thus appears to be at exactly the right level of abstraction to handle multiple realizability. It is a reasonable empirical hypothesis in light of this feature of mental states.

Notice that this argument for functionalism is explicitly non-deductive, in contrast to the deductive (and valid) nature of Putnam's original argument against identity theories. It is important to keep the anti-identity theory argument separate from the pro-functionalism argument, as some criticisms of multiple realizability may be telling against one but irrelevant against the other.

Many contemporary nonreductive materialists deny that mental kinds can be identified with functional kinds. Some of their criticisms of functionalism hinge on issues about individualism in psychology. But Putnam has used multiple realizability to argue against functionalism itself. In specifying the nature of mental kinds, many functionalists followed Putnam (and Fodor) by adopting "Turing machine functionalism": mental kinds are identical to the computational kinds of a suitably programmed universal Turing machine. Putnam (1988), however, has argued that mental kinds are both "compositionally" and "computationally" plastic. The first point is his familiar multiple realizability contention of the mental on the physical. The second contends that the same mental kind can be a property of systems that are not in the same (Turing) computational state. In this work, multiple realizability strikes back at the very theory of mind it initially motivated. 

1.4 The Argument from Psychological Explanation

Psychologist Zenon Pylyshyn (1984) appeals to multiple realizability to ground a methodological criticism of reductionism. He described a pedestrian, having just witnessed an automobile accident, rushing into a nearby phone booth and dialing a 9 and a 1. What will this person do next? Dial another 1, with overwhelming likelihood. Why? Because of a systematic generalization holding between what he recognized, his background knowledge, his resulting intentions, and that action (intentionally described).

We won't discover that generalization, however, if we focus on the person's neurophysiology and resulting muscular contractions. That level of explanation is too weak, for it cannot tell us that this sequence of neural events and muscular contractions corresponds to the action of dialing a 1. A given physiological explanation only links one way of learning the emergency phone number to one way of coming to know that an emergency occurred to one sequence of neural events and resulting muscular contractions producing the behavior (nonintentionally described). However, the number of physical events constituting each of these cognitive classes—the learning, the coming to know, and the action of dialing—is potentially unlimited, with the constituents of each class often unrelated to each other at the physiological level of description. (This is Pylyshyn's appeal to multiple realizability.) So if there is a generalization at the higher level of description available for capturing (and in the pedestrian example there surely is), an exclusively reductionist approach to psychological explanation will miss it. Thus because of multiple realizability, reductionism violates a tenet of scientific methodology: seek to capture all capturable generalizations. (Fodor 1975, Chapter 5, and Terence Horgan 1993 raise related methodological caveats about reductionism resting ultimately on multiple realizability. Bickle 1998, Chapter 4, responds to these.)

1.5 Multiple Realizability in a Token System Over Times

Recent anti-reductionists have stressed the more radical type of multiple realizability, in a token system over times. As far back as the late 1970s, Block (1978) insisted that the required narrowing of psychological kinds due to the more radical type of multiple realizability renders psychology incapable of capturing whatever generalizations hold across species. Ronald Endicott (1993) gives Block's reply an empirical twist by noting detailed facts about plasticity in individual human brains. The capacity for distinct neural structures and processes to subserve a given psychological function owing to trauma, damage, changing task demands, development, and other factors is extensive. These facts count further against any reduction of or identities between psychological and physical kinds. Horgan (1993) clearly appeals to this radical sense of multiple realizability when he writes:

Multiple realizability might well begin at home. For all we now know (and I emphasize that we really do not now know), the intentional mental states we attribute to one another might turn out to be radically multiply realizable at the neurobiological level of description, even in humans; indeed, even in individual humans; indeed, even in an individual human given the structure of his central nervous system at a single moment of his life. (p. 308; author's emphases)

This radical sense has become to default position for nonreductive physicalists, whose solution to the mind-body problem still dominates Anglo-American philosophy of mind. Putnam's original multiple realizability remains central to this solution, with the second premise now replaced with:

(2′) If mental kinds are multiply realizable (in the radical sense), then psychology cannot be reduced to a physical science;

and Putnam's original conclusion is replaced with:

(3′) Psychology cannot be reduced to a physical science.

2. Reductionist Replies

2.1 One-Way Nagelian Bridge Principles

Robert Richardson (1979) suggests that the Putnam-Fodor challenge to reductionism results from a misunderstanding of Ernest Nagel's actual account of intertheoretic reduction. Although Nagel's detailed examples of historical cases all involve biconditional cross-(reduced and reducing) theory “conditions of connectivity,” one-way conditional connections expressing sufficient conditions at the reducing level are all that his "principle of derivability" requires. Richardson even cites passages from Nagel (1961) indicating that Nagel himself saw this point. Multiple realizability only challenges necessity (and nondisjunctive) reducing conditions, and so is not a challenge to even a projected Nagelian reduction of psychology to the physical sciences.

2.2 Domain-Specific Reductions

David Lewis (1969) argues that the inconsistency between the reductionist's thesis and multiple realizability evaporates when we notice a tacit relativity of the former to contexts. A common sense example illustrates his point. The following three claims appear inconsistent:

(1) There is only one winning lottery number.

(2) The winning lottery number is 03.

(3) The winning lottery number is 61.

These three similar claims likewise seem inconsistent:

(1′) (the reductionist thesis) There is only one physical-chemical realization of pain.

(2′) The physical-chemical realization of pain is C-fiber firing.

(3′) The physical-chemical realization of pain is … (something else entirely).

((2′) and (3′) reflect the multiple realizability contention.) But there is no mystery in how to reconcile (1) – (3). Append "per week" to (1), "this week" to (2), and "last week" to (3). Similarly, append "per structure-type" to (1′), "in humans" to (2′), and "in mollusks" to (3′). Inconsistencies evaporate. Lewis's point is that reductive identities are always specific to a domain.

Many reductionist philosophers have elaborated on Lewis's point with scientific examples. Patricia Churchland (1986, Chapter 7), Clifford Hooker (1981), Berent Enç (1983), and other philosophers of science have described historical intertheoretic reductions where a given reduced concept is multiply realized at the reducing level. A common example is the concept of temperature from classical equilibrium thermodynamics. Temperature in a gas is identical to mean molecular kinetic energy. Temperature in a solid, however, is identical to mean maximal molecular kinetic energy, since the molecules of a solid are bound in lattice structures and hence restricted to a range of vibratory motions. Temperature in a plasma is something else entirely, since the molecular constituents of a plasma have been ripped apart. Even a vacuum can have a (“blackbody”) temperature, though it contains no molecular constituents. Temperature of classical thermodynamics is multiply realized microphysically in a variety of distinct physical states. Yet this is a "textbook" intertheoretic reduction and cross-theory identification. The reductions and identifications are specific to the domain of physical state.

Lewis's original insight also underlies Kim's (1989, 1992) appeals to structure-specific "local reductions." Kim agrees that multiple realizability rules out a general reduction of (structure-independent) psychology to physical science. But it permits (and even sanctions) a local reduction to a theory of the physical mechanisms of a given structure-type. (Kim admits that the relevant structure-types here will probably be narrower than biological species.) Local reductions involve "structure-specific bridge laws" where the mental-physical biconditional occurs as the consequent of a conditional whose antecedent denotes a specific structure-type (e.g., “if X is a member of structure type S, then X is in mental state M iff X is in physical state P”). Conditionals whose antecedents denote different structure types will typically have biconditionals as consequents whose mental term- constituents are co-referential but whose physical term- constituents denote different physical events. Multiple realizability forces this much revision to the bridge laws of classical reductionism. But according to Kim, local reductions are the rule rather than the exception in science generally, and are sufficient for any reasonable scientific or philosophical purpose. Kim's approach is another way to express the tacit domain specificity in scientific reductions.

2.3 Neuroscience's Successes

Kim (1992) suggests and Bickle (1998, Chapter 4) emphasizes that guiding methodological principles in contemporary neuroscience assume continuity of underlying neural mechanisms. This assumption informs most experimental techniques and theoretical conclusions drawn from experimental results. Continuity is assumed both within and across species. If radical multiple realizability really obtained among species in the actual world, contemporary neuroscientific experimental techniques built upon this assumption should bear little fruit. Why study the macaque visual system to investigate human visual processing, for example, if we can't safely assume some continuity across species? Why should positron emission tomography (PET) and functional magnetic resonance imaging (fMRI) reveal common areas of high metabolic activity during psychological task performance, both across and within individual humans—now down to a millimeter of spatial resolution? Standard neuroscientific experimental procedures and even clinical diagnostic tools would be hopelessly naïve in the face of significant multiple realizability. But these procedures and tools do work (and are not hopelessly naïve).

Kim and Bickle insist that these successes are evidence that psychological functions are not as radically multiply realized as functionalists and anti-reductionists suggest. Even neural plasticity is systematic. It has a regular progression following damage to a principal structure; there are underlying neural mechanisms that subserve it. Furthermore, function following damage is often seriously degraded. Persons can still talk, manipulate spatial representations, or move their extremities, but their performance is often qualitatively and quantitatively less than normal. This fact gives rise to tricky questions about individuation of psychological function. Are these alternative neural structures realizing the same psychological function—the same mental kind—as before? (This last response has been further developed. See the next section below.)

Bechtel and Jennifer Mundale (1999) provide the most extensive empirical details about hypothesized or assumed brain type-identities across species in neuroscientific practice. Their explicit target is a methodological consequence sometimes drawn from the multiple realizability premise: if psychological states are multiply realized across biological species, then neuroscience—the scientific study of brains—will be of little use toward understanding cognition. But as details of the neuroscience of vision demonstrate, neuroscientists have successfully used understanding of the brain to decompose cognitive visual function. The neuroscientific goal has been to

show how functional considerations get built into developing the structural taxonomy and how that taxonomy in turn can be a heuristic guide in developing information-processing models. This project has not been impaired by multiple realization of psychological states; rather, it relies on the assumption that there is a common realization of mechanisms for processing visual information across species. (1999, 201)

It is difficult to argue with the empirical successes that have obtained. So even if one accepts the multiple realizability contention, one should be hesitant to draw strong consequences about psychology's methodological autonomy from it.

2.4 Questioning the Individuation of Mental Kinds

In recent years critics have begun to challenge the truth of the multiple realizability premise. One approach challenges the way that mental kinds are individuated by multiple realizability proponents.

Nick Zangwill (1992) was the first to suggest that multiple realizability across biological species has never “been proven.” The multiple realizability contention assumes a type-identity of mental kinds across species. According to Zangwill this assumption is problematic, given that the obvious sensory and motor differences across species by themselves yield different cause-and-effect patterns at all but the grossest level of description. If successful, this challenge undercuts the multiple realizability argument by denying that the same mental kinds obtain across species, to be realized by different physical mechanisms.

Lawrence Shapiro (2000) also contends that philosophers are too quick to claim that a given kind is multiply realized. Some properties of the realizers are relevant to the purposes, activities, or capacities that define a given functional kind, but others are not. Consider corkscrews. That functional kind can be “multiply realized” in two tokens that differ only in their color. That physical difference does not make them genuinely different realizations of corkscrew, however, because it makes no difference to their performance as corkscrews. Similarly for two corkscrews that differ only in that one is made of aluminum and the other of steel. Although that compositional difference might matter for some functional kinds, it doesn't for corkscrews. As Shapiro notes, “steel and aluminum are not different realizations of a waiter's corkscrew because, relative to the properties that make them suitable for removing corks, they are identical” (2000, p. 644). Establishing genuine multiple realizability takes argument—one must point to property differences in the realizers that make for a functional difference.

Shapiro argues that this requirement sets up a dilemma. Consider what appears to be a genuine case of multiple realizability, that is, two objects that “do the same thing” but in very different ways. Either the realizing kinds genuinely differ in their causally relevant properties or they do not. If they do not, then we don't really have a case of multiple realizability (like the corkscrews that differ only in color or composition). If they do, then they are different kinds. But then they are not the same kind and again we don't have an instance of multiple realizability—of a single kind with distinct realizations.

The usual justification for grouping distinct realizers under a single functional kind is that the classification reveals interesting similarities, of the sort we expect to be captured by laws or generalizations of higher level science. But according to Shapiro, when the realizing kinds differ significantly in their causally relevant properties for the function at issue, any shared laws or generalizations are “numbingly dull” (2000, p. 649): e.g., all realizers of mouse traps are used to catch mice; both camera eyes and compound eyes have the function to see. Shapiro remarks: “If [functional kinds] share many causally relevant properties, then they are not distinct realizations … If they have no or only few causally relevant properties in common, then there are no or just a few laws that are true of both of them” (2000, p. 649). The first horn acknowledges a single functional kind but denies that it is multiply realized. The second undercuts the principal reason for grouping genuinely different physical kinds under a single functional kind. Shapiro concludes that taken together these two horns blunt any claim of multiple realizations of the same functional type.

Mark Couch (2004) presses a similar dilemma. Defending a claimed multiple realization involves two steps. Proponents must show (i) that the physical states (of the realizers) are type distinct, and (ii) that the functional properties are type identical. Challenges to claimed multiple realizations can attack either step and, most importantly, the step challenged can differ from case to case. (Successfully challenging either blocks the multiple realizability argument.) As we saw in the previous section, Bechtel and Mundale (1999) describe cases in which cognitive neuroscientists treat the physical realizers (brain states) as type-identical across species (attacking step i). In other cases—Couch's example is primate versus octopus eyes—one can appeal to easily-found differences in functional properties (attacking step ii). The two eyes have different visual pigments in their photoreceptors, different retinas, and different ways of focusing light. These physical differences lead to straightforward input-output (functional) differences: in the optic stimuli the two eyes respond to, in reaction times, and more. Their functions may be similar, but similarity isn't identity and multiple realization requires the latter. Cross-species functional similarities are often quite superficial, especially across species from widely differing taxa (a point shared by Couch and Shapiro). In actual scientific practice, discovered physical (neural) differences typically incline psychologists to seek out functional differences. Couch's point is that the individuation of psychological states, like the individuation of brain states, is an empirical issue. Shapiro and Couch hint that claims to multiple realizability rely heavily on “folk” psychological intuitions about individuating mental kinds.

Bechtel and Mundale (1999) note that multiple realizability proponents appeal to different amounts of “granularity” in individuating mental and neurobiological kinds. Proponents are content to analyze psychological states at a coarse-grained level, in which only the loosest input-output similarities across species are sufficient for mental kind identities. Yet they insist on very fine-grained individuation for brain states, in which small differences across species are sufficient for neural type-difference. But psychological ascriptions admit of finer grains and neural ascriptions admit of coarser grains. Bechtel and Mundale insist that when a common grain is chosen for both, mental-neural type-identities holding across species are found. In any case, it is unfair to hold neural type-individuation to a very fine grain, while adopting a very coarse grain for mental type-individuation.

Some of these arguments quickly attracted critical attention. For example, Gillett (2003) argues that Fodor and other proponents of multiple realization assume a ‘Dimensioned’ view of realization that allows realizer/realized properties to be instantiated in the distinct individuals that bear part-whole relations. Shapiro and other recent challengers assume a ‘Flat’ view of realization, which demands that realizer/realize properties be instantiated in the same individual. Gillett shows first that critical arguments like Shapiro's do not go through under the Dimensioned view of realization; and second, that the critics have not defended the Flat view over the Dimensioned view. Gillett concludes that failing to directly address the nature of realization relation vitiates critiques like Shapiro's and others, who are simply left begging the question against original defenses of multiple realization like Fodor's.   

2.5 Denying Projectibility

Besides his appeal to species-specific bridge laws and local reducibility, Kim (1992) offers two additional replies to the multiple realizability argument. His "denying projectibility" reply starts from the familiar fact that the kind "jade" fragments into jadeite and nephrite. Jade is thus incapable of passing the projectibility test for nomicness because of its genuinely disjunctive nature. Multiple realizability of psychological kinds yields the same consequence. Instead of rendering psychology an autonomous special science, multiple realizability implies that there is no structure-independent scientific psychology. There are only "local" scientific psychologies, each reducible to the theory of the underlying physical mechanisms of the structure-type in question.

Closely related is Kim's "causal powers" reply. Scientific kinds are individuated by their causal powers, and the causal powers of each instance of some realized kind are identical to those of its realizer. From these principles it follows that instances of a mental kind with different physical realizations are distinct kinds. Thus (structure-independent) mental kinds are not causal kinds, and hence are disqualified as proper scientific kinds. Multiple realizability yields the failure of structure-independent mental kinds to meet the standards of scientific kinds. Notice that Shapiro's “dilemma” (discussed in section 2.4 above) is in the spirit of Kim's “causal powers” argument.

Kim's argument has attracted critical attention. As part of their defense of the autonomy of the mental, Louise Antony and Joseph Levine (1997) insist that it is not vast multiple realizability that makes a property unprojectible—for a property like “having mass of one gram” is the former but isn't the latter. The projectibility of a nomic property only guarantees the projectibility of shared properties that “are constitutive of or nomically connected to it” (p. 90, authors' emphases). This renders Kim's appeal to the jade analogy problematic for mental properties. Block (1997) argues that kind-ness is both relative and graded, and so projectibility is always with respect to particular types of properties. Specifically, Block distinguishes two types: D properties, which are selected (though not necessarily selected for) and whose physical realizations are subject to constraints imposed by laws of nature; and realization properties, which are due to the peculiarities of some specific realization. Block argues that Kim's unprojectibility argument is correct (and important) for realization properties of mental kinds; but there are also genuine D properties of mental kinds (not yet well understood) and these do project from one realization to others, even in light of vast realization differences.

Fodor (1997) distinguishes disjunctive from multiply realized properties. The former, like jade, are neither projectible nor nomic; but the latter, like mental properties (as construed by functionalists) are both. Kim's analogy between jade and pain breaks down, and thus so does his conclusion about the unprojectibility of the latter. This undercuts the remaining steps in his argument for reduction. Gene Witmer, on the other hand, (2003) accepts Kim's “linking hypothesis” connecting the unprojectibility of the disjunctive sum of physical realizers with the unprojectibility of the functional kind itself. Instead he challenges the unprojectibility of the disjunctive sum. There are categories whose instances share nothing in common except abstract relational features whose denoting expressions occur in generalizations that are confirmable by their positive instances (the key feature of projectibility). Witmer cites examples like “papers written after brainstorming,” “products produced by the same company,” and “a good night's sleep.” An argument might overturn our intuitive verdict of confirmability by positive instances for generalizations containing these terms but the burden is on the denier. This is Witmer's “Moorean” premise: “it is a Moorean fact that we have good reason to believe, on the basis of a number of positive instances, generalizations about pain” (67). Now the linking hypothesis turns Kim's argument on its head. By modus tollens, the disjunctive sum of physical realizers of pain is likewise projectible. (Witmer also provides various readings of Kim's “Inexplicability argument” based the causal exclusion principle and argues that each reading fails.) 

2.6 Reduction and Identity Theory Reconceived

The more radical type of multiple realizability seems to force increasingly narrower domains for reductions to be relativized—at the extreme, to individuals at times. This much “local reduction” seems inconsistent with the assumed generality of science. To avoid this problem, some philosophers have suggested more revolutionary changes to the “accepted” account of (intertheoretic) reduction.

Following suggestions by Clifford Hooker (1981) and Enc (1983), Bickle (1998, Chapter 4) argues that the radical type of multiple realizability (in the same token system over times) is a feature of accepted historical cases of scientific reduction. It even obtains in the “textbook” reduction of classical equilibrium thermodynamics to statistical mechanics and microphysics. For any token aggregate of gas molecules, there is an indefinite number of realizations of a given temperature—a given mean molecular kinetic energy. Microphysically, the most fine-grained theoretical specification of a gas is its microcanonical ensemble, in which the momentum and location (and thus the kinetic energy) of each molecule are specified. Indefinitely many distinct microcanonical ensembles of a token volume of gas molecules can yield the same mean molecular kinetic energy. Thus at the lowest level of microphysical description, a given temperature is vastly multiply realizable in the same token system over times. Nevertheless, the case of temperature is a textbook case of reduction. So this type of multiple realizability is not by itself a barrier to reducibility.

To accommodate this feature, Hooker (1981, Part III) supplements his general theory of reduction with an account of “token-to-token” reductions. His supplement builds the possibility of multiple realizability (including the strong type) directly into the definition of the reduction relation. Let S be the predicate, “satisfies functional theory F,” T be the class of systems to which the token system in question belongs, S′ be an appropriate predicate in some lower level theory of T-system causal mechanisms, and T* be the class of systems to which S′ applies. Then, according to Hooker, “systems of type S of class T are contingently token/token identical with systems of type S′ in class T* =df every instance (token) of a type S system externally classified as in class T is contingently identical with some instance (token) of a type S′ system externally classified as in class T*” (1981, p. 504). By “externally classified,” Hooker refers to the sort of cross-classification that holds across different determinable/determinate hierarchies.

To address some acknowledged shortcomings in Hooker's formulation of his general theory of reduction, Bickle (1998) reformulates Hooker's insights (including his token-token reduction supplement) within a set-theoretic “semantic” account of theory structure and relations. The technical details are complex and don't bear repeating here, but the basic idea is straightforward. Bickle's “new wave” account construes intertheoretic reduction as the construction of an image of the set-theoretic structure of the models of the reduced theory within the set comprising the models of the reducing, modulo a number of conditions on the resulting mapping. Elements of the sets of models include token real-world systems to which the theories apply (the theories' “intended empirical applications”).

Other new conceptions of both reduction and the mind-brain identity theory have been proposed. Elliott Sober (1999) insists that a reductionist thesis actually follows from the multiple realizability premise. He begins by attacking Putnam's (1967) “objective” account of superior explanation, namely that one explanation is superior to another if the former is more general. According to Putnam, superior explanations “bring out the relevant laws.” But Sober reminds us that explanatory generalizations at lower levels bring out more details. Science “aims for depth as well as breadth” and there is no “objective rule” concerning which endeavor is “better” (1999, 550). Both reductionists and anti-reductionists err in privileging one aim at the expense of the other. Sober then notes that multiple realizability presupposes some form of asymmetric determination: the lower level physical properties present at a given time determine the higher level properties present. But this assumption commits its proponents to the causal completeness of physics (a doctrine that Sober sketches toward the end of his 1999). If one is also concerned with causal explanation—if one holds that singular occurrences are explained by citing their causes—then the causal completeness of physics in turn commits multiple realizability proponents to physics' possessing an important variety of explanatory completeness that all other sciences lack. This is “reductionism of a sort” (1999, 562).

William Bechtel and Robert McCauley (1999) develop a version of “heuristic” mind-brain identity theory (HIT) and defend it explicitly against multiple realizability. HIT insists that identity claims in science typically are hypotheses adopted in the course of empirical investigations, which serve to guide subsequent research. They are not conclusions reached after empirical research has been conducted. Concerning the multiple realizability of psychological on brain (physical) states, cognitive neuroscience's heuristic identity claims assert type-commonalities in comparative studies across species, not type-differences. Bechtel and McCauley illustrate their hypothesis with case studies: Brodmann's early 20th century work mapping the brain into functionally relevant areas; Ferrier's late-19th century work employing electrical stimulation to cortex; and more recent detailed maps of visual processing regions in the primate brain. All of these landmark functional anatomical studies used multiple species. As Bechtel and McCauley remind us,

when they consider theories of mind-brain relations, philosophers seem to forget that the overwhelming majority of studies have been on non-human brains. … Although the ultimate objective is to understand the structure and function of the human brain, neuroscientists depend upon indirect, comparative procedures to apply the information from studies with non-human animals to the study of the human brain. (1999, 70-71)

Heuristic psychoneural type-identity claims across species are key components of these standard neuroscientific procedures.

Thomas Polger (2004) handles multiple realizability by developing a “non-reductive mind-brain identity theory.” He insists that appeals to stronger kinds of multiple realizability are only plausible under prior commitment to functionalism, and so beg the question if employed against the identity theory. Weaker claims can be handled in a fashion akin to Bechtel's, McCauley's, and Mundale's strategy: “the fact—if it is a fact—that many different systems can have the same kinds of mental states does not show that they do not all do so in virtue of having something in common” (2004, 10). (One can plausibly read Bechtel, McCauley, and Mundale as providing the empirical details for Polger's assertion of realization-level commonality.) For the remaining (moderate) forms of multiple realizability, Polger insists: “either the [cognizing] thing shares some properties in common [with us] or else it does not have [our] mental states after all” (2004, 11). Polger adopts a reply akin to Couch's to functionalist “empathetic” intuitions that we share mental states with a wide range of terrestrial creatures: he denies that we really attribute the same (as compared to similar) mental states to other species (2004, 15).

In response to recovery of function following massive brain trauma, Polger  adopts Bechtel and Mundale's line (and perhaps Bickle's): “Rather than supporting multiple realizability, these cases suggest that we do not understand how the brain works—how to individuate brain processes, events, states, and properties” (2004, 17). In response to “standard” multiple realization claims, he avails himself of Bechtel and Mundale's “different grains” response (2004, 21-26). In the end, Polger countenances some multiple realizability, but argues that this much does not threaten his “nonreductive” version of mind-brain identity theory:

Particular kinds of sensations, S1, …, Sr, are identical to particular kinds of brain states, B1, …, Br. Sensation kinds may cluster into coarser, more general species-specific mental state kinds, … but insofar as they do, we expect that their members will share physical properties … Creatures that are similar physically … may also have relatively similar mental state kinds. … We should expect human beings and higher primates to have similar conscious mental states because their brains are quite similar to our own. And we should expect the experiences of octopi or aliens to be different from ours to the extent that their brains are quite different from our own. (2004, 30)

When reduction or identity theory gets reconceived in ways built to accommodate multiple realizability, are reductionists/identity theorists and their critics simply talking past one another? It is worth reminding ourselves that many nonreductive physicalists have employed multiple realizability to argue against all forms of psychophysical reductionism. If better general accounts of scientific reduction or identity theory make room for multiple realizability, these demonstrations count against this broader challenge. (If “nonreductive” physicalism were to oppose only a specific brand of psychophysical reductionism, that would weaken the position significantly, so that it would be compatible with other forms of “reductive” physicalism.) In fact, this broader challenge to psychophysical reductionism traces back to Fodor (1974). While his arguments explicitly targeted a reductionism built on the classical Nagelian account, Fodor suggested in footnote 2 that “what I shall be attacking is what many people have in mind when they refer to the unity of science, and I suspect (though I shan't try to prove it) that many of the liberalized versions of reductionism suffer from the same basic defect as what I shall take to be the classical form of the doctrine.” 

2.7 Lower Level Reductive Unity

In searching for reductive unity underlying the variety of cognitive systems, Paul Churchland (1982) once recommended descending “below” neurobiology and even biochemistry, to the level of nonequilibrium thermodynamics. He insisted that finding reductive unity there was more than a bare logical possibility because of some parallels between biological processes, whose multiply realized kinds find reductive unity there, and cognitive activity (especially learning).

Concerning Pylyshyn's (1984) attack on reductionist methodology, Patricia Churchland (1986, Chapter 9) suggests that functional theories are constructed in lower level sciences. New levels of theory thus get inserted between those describing the structure of the lower level kinds and those of purely functional kinds: between, for example, the physiology of individual neurons and cognitive psychology. We might find a common neurofunctional property for a given type of psychological state across a wide variety of distinct brains. And if the scope of the macro-theory doesn't extend beyond that of its microfunctional counterpart, then reduction will be achieved despite vast multiple realizability at the microstructural level. Neurocomputational approaches that have blossomed since the early 1990s give real empirical credence to Churchland's suggestion.

Bickle (2003) claims that if we leave our neuroscientific understanding at the systems level, psychoneural multiple realizability seems obvious. Neural systems differ significantly across species. But neuroscience does not stop at the systems level. As it moved further down, into cellular physiology and increasingly the molecular biology of nervous tissue, type-identities across species have been found. Many molecular mechanisms of neural conductance, transmission, and plasticity are the same in invertebrates through mammals. This matters for psychology because mechanisms of cognition and consciousness are increasingly being found at these levels. Bickle's key example is memory consolidation, the conversion of labile, easily disrupted short-term memories into more durable, stable long-term form. Work with fruit flies, sea slugs, and mice has revealed the role of the cyclic adenosine monophosphate (cAMP)-protein kinase A (PKA)-cAMP responsive-element binding protein (CREB) signaling pathway in key forms of experience-driven synaptic plasticity. Across these very distinct taxa, this molecular circuitry has also been implicated experimentally in memory consolidation. By altering a single protein in this cascade (using biotechnology and molecular genetics), experimenters have built mutant organisms whose short-term memory remains intact (as does their sensory, motor, and motivational capacities), but which cannot consolidate these short-term memories into long-term form. Bickle quotes with approval statements like the following, from insect biologists Josh Dubnau and Tom Tully:

In all systems studied, the cAMP signaling cascade has been identified as one of the major biochemical pathways involved in modulating both neuronal and behavioral plasticity. … More recently, elucidation of the role of CREB-mediated transcription in long-term memory in flies, LTP and long-term memory in vertebrates, and long-term facilitation in A. californica [a sea slug] suggest that CREB may constitute a universally conserved molecular switch for long term memory (1998, 438).

Memory consolidation is just one psychological phenomenon, and so its ruthless reduction to molecular events doesn't establish a general claim about unitary mechanisms across widely divergent taxa for other shared cognitive kinds. For that argument, Bickle turns to principles of molecular evolution. The first principle holds that evolution at the molecular level—changes to the amino acid sequence of a given protein—is much slower in functionally important (“constrained”) domains than in functionally less important ones. The second principle is that molecular evolution is much slower in all domains of “housekeeping” proteins, especially in ones that participate in cell-metabolic processes in many tissue types. These two principles imply that these molecules, their domains, and the intracellular processes they participate in will remain constant across existing biological species that share the common ancestor first possessing them. (This is what Dubnau and Tully refer to above as a “universally conserved” molecular switch.) In the end, any psychological kind that affects an organism's behavior must engage the cell-metabolic machinery in individual neurons. In the brain, causally speaking, that's where the rubber meets the road. But that's the machinery conserved across existing biological species—changes to it, especially its functionally constrained domains, have (almost) inevitably been detrimental to an organism's survival. So we should expect that the molecular mechanisms for any causally efficacious cognitive kind be “universally conserved.” The discovery of these shared mechanisms of memory consolidation is not some isolated case, but follows from the core principles of molecular evolution. As ‘molecular and cellular cognition’ proceeds, we should expect more examples of unitary realizers (reductions) of shared psychological kinds

3. The Legacy of Multiple Realizability

At present, nonreductive physicalism is (probably still) the dominant position in Anglo-American philosophy of mind. Its proponents appeal to the multiple realizability argument to challenge all versions of psychophysical reductionism and identity theory. Ernest LePore and Barry Loewer (1989) have even called the nonidentity of mental content with any physical properties “practically received wisdom” among philosophers of mind. They cite multiple realizability as one of the principal arguments for this conclusion. At the same time, the literature now contains challenges to the validity of multiple realizability arguments against reductionism and identity theory. It contains assaults on the multiple realizability premise itself. At the time of this present writing, many of these criticisms are recent—interest in multiple realizability took an upturn at the turn of the 21st century—so published replies are only beginning to appear. It is reasonable to expect that renewed interest in the realization relation more generally will yield new insights into these challenges. The fate of nothing less than one of the most influential arguments in late-20th century analytic philosophy hangs in the balance.


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functionalism | physicalism | reduction