Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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The Nonidentity Problem

First published Tue Jul 21, 2009

The nonidentity problem probes some of our most intuitive beliefs regarding the moral status of acts whose effects are restricted to persons who, at the time the act is performed, do not yet but will exist. As we try to articulate just when, and why, some such future-directed acts are wrong, we find ourselves forced to think carefully about the structure of moral law: is it “person-affecting” in nature or is it “impersonal” in nature? Can, in other words, an act that affects no person who does or ever will exist for the worse be wrong? Or is the wrongness of any particular act dependent (at least in part) on something beyond what that act does, or can be expected to do, to any such person?

1. The Puzzle

Many of us believe that:

  1. some acts whose effects are restricted to persons who do not yet but will exist are morally impermissible, or wrong, and
  2. if such an act is wrong, it is wrong because it will affect some such person—some “future person”—in some adverse way; it is wrong because it will (predictably) harm one or more future persons, or make things worse for one or more future persons than things might have been. More generally, we are drawn to the “person-affecting intuition”—the idea, that is, that “bad” acts must be “bad for” someone (Parfit 1987, 363). The act that affects no existing person at all (or at least no existing person for the worse), and (predictably) maximizes wellbeing for each and every future person, cannot be wrong. That is so, even if that same act arguably makes the world “worse” in some impersonal sense—even if it, for example, creates less wellbeing in the aggregate when agents had the alternative of creating more.

The nonidentity problem argues that these two beliefs cannot both be correct. The argument turns on a phenomenon Gregory Kavka described as the “precariousness” of existence (Kavka 1982, 93). We understand that the identity of each person who ever comes into existence—the coming into existence, that is, of any one particular person in place of a “nonidentical” other—depends, among other things, on just who the genetic parents of that person happen to be. As Parfit observes, the woman who wonders who she would have been had her “parents married other people” “ignores the answer,” which is “no one” (Parfit 1987, 351). But there is a more subtle point: the identities of those who will come into existence also depend on the exact timing and manner of conception. When the act of conceiving a child is moved forward or backward in time by months or even moments, or when the manner of conception is itself altered (accomplished, e.g., via in vitro fertilization in the lab rather than in some more ordinary way), the result, very probably, will be the conception of a distinct child altogether. After all, any difference in timing or manner very probably will place a distinct inseminating sperm cell (out of hundreds of millions!) in proximity to the ovum or even result in a distinct ovum being inseminated. And a distinction in gametes would seem to mean a distinct child (Parfit 1987, 351–55). Moreover, the exact timing and manner of conception is itself highly susceptible to variations in whatever complex chain of acts and events it is that has happened to come before. Much of what has been done in human history, had it been done differently, would surely have undone the conceptions of vast numbers of persons. “[H]ow many of us could truly claim, ‘Even if railways and motor cars had never been invented, I would still have been born’?” (Parfit 1987, 361).

Consider, then, an act A that is performed at a possible world w and that there yields low wellbeing levels for one or more persons who will but do not yet exist at w—one or more persons who are future at w. Suppose that act A performed at w causes those persons to endure pain, misery, disease, deprivation and limitation. And suppose that those low wellbeing levels cannot readily be justified (on the ground, for example, that they save many, many existing persons from still lower wellbeing levels), and that we are accordingly convinced that act A is wrong. What the precariousness point tells us is that that same act A may also be critical to bringing the very future persons who endure low wellbeing levels into existence to begin with. Perhaps an alternative act B also was available to the agents at the time just prior to choice; and perhaps B strikes us as more benign, in the sense that it would have yielded higher wellbeing levels for whatever future persons may happen to exist if B is performed in place of A. The problem is that performing B in place of A very probably would also have varied the timing and manner of the conceptions of the persons who exist and suffer under the choice of A. Then, instead of making things better for those persons, act B would have left them out of existence altogether. The same point holds for any other seemingly more benign act. Assuming (here and throughout) that the existence is worth having—assuming that those persons who are brought into existence are not so miserable that we think that never existing at all would have been better for them—we now find it very hard to see how act A has genuinely harmed, or made things worse for, or is “bad for,” those persons (Parfit 1987, 361–63).

This leaves us with the result that at least some “bad” acts are “bad for” no one at all (Parfit 1987, 363). If we accept (1) above, we seem forced, in other words, to reject (2).

That result leaves us with a secondary problem: where an exclusively future-directed act is wrong, what makes it wrong, if not that it is “bad for” someone or another? What theory explains why it is wrong? The nonidentity problem seems to show that “Theory X will not take a person-affecting form” (Parfit 1987, 378). What form, then, will Theory X take? The answer is not obvious since, as Parfit has also demonstrated, the nonidentity problem is not our only problem. Thus, many impersonal (or hybrid) theories purport to explain how an act that is “bad for” no one can be wrong. But at least some of them immediately generate—for example—the repugnant conclusion (Parfit 1987, 381–90; and see the entry repugnant conclusion). Fashioning a cogent response to the nonidentity problem that does not create at least as many problems as it solves has thus emerged as a critical challenge for contemporary moral philosophy.

2. Nonidentity Cases

Many nonidentity cases that have been most persuasive on the point that some “bad” acts are “bad for” no one were constructed by Parfit:

2.1 Depletion

Suppose that agents as a community have chosen to deplete rather than conserve certain resources. The consequences of that choice for the persons who exist now and who will come into existence over the next two centuries will be “slightly higher” than under a conservation alternative (Parfit 1987, 362). Thereafter, however, for many centuries the quality of life would be much lower. “The great lowering of the quality of life must provide some moral reason not to choose Depletion” (p. 363). Surely we ought to have chosen conservation in some form or another instead. But at the same time depletion seems to harm no one: while distant future persons, by hypothesis, will suffer the adverse effects of choice of depletion, it is also true that a conservation choice very probably would have changed the timing and manner of the conceptions. Future persons, in other words, owe their suffering but also their very existence to the depletion choice. Provided that that existence is worth having, we seem forced to conclude that depletion does not harm, or make things worse for, and is not otherwise “bad for,” anyone at all (p. 363).

The risky policy example, also from Parfit, has a similar structure (pp. 371–72). John Broome has shown that the phenomenon of global warming gives rise to a parallel nonidentity problem (Broome 1992).

2.2 The slave child

Gregory Kavka shows how a parallel problem can arise at the local level. In exchange for $50,000, a couple enters into a binding, enforceable contract with a wealthy man according to which the couple will conceive and bear a child who will be transferred at birth to the wealthy man as a slave (Kavka 1982, 100). The child is conceived and born pursuant to the contract—and, as a slave, suffers in various ways. We think what the couple has done is “outrageous” (Kavka 1982, 101). And we think that that is so because of what the couple's choice does to the slave child. But can the latter view be correct? Does the couple's choice truly harm the slave child? Is there anything else the couple could have done instead that would have made things better for that very same child? The couple certainly had alternatives. They could have, e.g., not entered into the contract and not taken steps to produce a child, and they could have not entered into the contract and still taken steps to produce a child. The former alternative, of course, would not have been better for the slave child. (We are still assuming that the particular existence is itself worth having.) But nor is the latter, since, had the couple not entered into the contract and still taken steps to produce a child, the timing and conditions of conception would then have changed, and it would have been “enormously improbable that the couple … could [have succeeded] in producing the same child …” (Kavka, 1982, 100 n. 15). Their choice thus would not have made things better for the slave child but would have left that child out of existence altogether, producing a nonidentical (but better off) child in his or her place. Once we appreciate that fact, it becomes hard to see how what the couple has done harms, or makes things worse for, or is otherwise “bad for” the child. Kavka's “pleasure pill” case parallels the slave child case (Kavka, 98).

2.3 The 14-year-old girl

Another classic case from Parfit focuses on the simple fact that the egg cell a young girl will produce soon after she becomes capable of conceiving a child will not be the same egg cell as the one she will produce a decade or more later. “This girl chooses to have a child” (Parfit 1987, 358). We think that it would have been better for the girl to wait “for several years” to have a child, and that, barring exceptional circumstances, what the girl has in fact done is wrong (p. 358). We also think that the reason her choice is wrong is that it causes the child the girl in fact bears to be given a “bad start in life” (p. 358). On closer inspection, however, we see that that particular child would never have existed at all had the girl waited until she was older to have a child. Given that the child's life is worth living—given, that is, that it would not have been better for the child that he or she never have existed at all—it seems that the child has not been harmed, or made worse off, by what the girl has done, and that her act is not otherwise “bad for” the child.

2.4 Wrongful life

Since Parfit first described the 14-year-old girl case, technology has advanced. The option of cryo-preserving gametes and newly formed human embryos now means that there is at least a theoretical possibility that the 14-year-old girl really could have produced the very same child—or at least a child from the very same gametes—many years later. But not all things are possible in the world of new technology. Consider, e.g., the case of “wrongful life,” which presents problems for both moral theory and the law:

Through medical negligence, or parental choice, it may happen that a child is born with a chromosomal or genetic disorder, such as Down syndrome, Huntington's disease or hereditary deafness, when parents or other agents could have caused to have been born a (presumptively) better off, but nonidentical, child instead. We now have the technology to avoid producing children with such disorders in many cases. Parents can be screened pre-conception; in vitro fertilization can be followed by pre-implantation genetic diagnosis; and amniocentesis can now be performed as early as the 14th week of pregnancy. But we do not yet have the technology to correct those disorders. We thus can be confident, at least for the moment, that any child born with any such disorder could not have existed at all and not had the disorder. We also think that in the vast majority of cases the life, despite the disorder, will be unambiguously worth living (In fact, following Buchanan et al., the cases under this heading may be better described as “wrongful disability” rather than “wrongful life,” since by hypothesis the disorders at issue here are not so severe that we think it would have been better for the child had he or she never have existed at all (Buchanan, et al. 2000, 222–57). On those facts, it becomes very hard to say just how the act that produces the impaired child can harm, or make things worse for, or otherwise be “bad for” that child.

The question wrongful life (or we might say wrongful disability) raises in the law is whether a gynecologist or obstetrician who has failed to communicate the advisability of genetic testing, or the lab that has negligently generated a falsely reassuring test result, can be held liable to the impaired child under a claim of negligence. In the absence of the negligent act or omission, that particular child would never have existed at all. Yet in the vast majority of cases the child's life is unambiguously worth living. It seems, then, that we are forced to say that the negligent act has not harmed the child. Harm being an essential element of any claim in negligence, it also seems that the child's action against the doctor or lab should be dismissed as legally invalid. Yet we may well think that the tort law system is properly viewed as a way of incentivizing medical personnel to work to insure that the children whom their efforts help to produce are born free of impairment. And we may also think that the parents' claim—called “wrongful birth”—against those same medical personnel for the additional expense of caring for an impaired child is not an adequate incentive—especially in light of statutes of limitation that cut off the parents' claim (in contrast to the child's) soon after the child is born. Legally, then, we face a dilemma—a case where the law of negligence should be incentivizing medical personnel to be vigilant in advising and conducting genetic testing, but where, thanks to the logic of the nonidentity problem, those same individuals and organizations are in a position to understand in advance that the child who appears to be their most plausible victim has, in fact, not been harmed and hence has no valid claim for damages.

2.5 Historic injustices

The nonidentity problem raises the issue of whether historic injustices can properly be said to harm, or make things worse for, persons who exist today (Sher 2005; Cohen 2009). According to the nonidentity problem, historic injustices—including, e.g., U.S. slavery and the Holocaust—lead to the very existence of many of the persons whom they have also caused to suffer in various ways. Persons conceived well after the events themselves take place are thus not, according to the nonidentity problem, victims of those events at all, but rather, if anything, their beneficiaries. “[H]ow can any person have a claim to compensation for a wrong that was a condition of her existence?” (Cohen 2009, 81) If we think that the taking of funds from presumptively innocent existing and future persons so that those funds can be paid in compensation for historical injustices to still other persons can be justified only to the extent that those other persons really are victims—really have been harmed or damaged in some way that those funds can then be paid in compensation—then we seem forced to conclude that such takings cannot themselves be justified.

3. Proposed solutions to the nonidentity problem

3.1 Seemingly wrong act is in fact permissible

This proposal “bites the bullet.” It retains the person-affecting intuition (“bad” acts are “bad for” someone; an act that harms, or makes things worse for, no existing or future person cannot be wrong at all), and also accepts the argument that the acts under scrutiny are not "bad for" the persons they cause to exist. The future person whose existence depends on a given act has “no moral status of any kind, not even a weak one,” relative to that act; we cannot genuinely “harm” the persons who depend on our choices for their very existence (Heyd 1992, 99–106). It then accepts the result that the acts under scrutiny are not wrong.

Some of the resistance this proposal has encountered can be easily explained. If forced to choose between the vaguely put and unproven person-affecting intuition and the concrete moral judgment that what the agents have done in the depletion or slave child case is wrong, we may well choose the latter. Moreover, it seems implausible that whatever we do is automatically made morally permissible so long as more benign alternatives very probably would have led to variations in the timing and manner of conception and thus have changed the identities of future persons.

Advocates of this proposal, however, point out that in many cases an act that adversely affects the future person it causes to exist will often adversely affect others as well. If one buries glass in the wood prior to conceiving a child, then even if that “bad” act cannot harm one's own child it may still, quite predictably, harm a neighbor's. On those grounds, the act can be declared wrong (Heyd 1992). Wrongful life, as well, can be expected to have effects on persons other than the impaired child (Roberts 2008).

In fact, Parfit himself points out that the 14-year-old girl's choice to have a child has “effects on other people” besides the girl's child (Parfit, 1987, 361). However, as Parfit also points out, the problem arises in a “purer form,” e.g., the depletion example (Parfit, 1987, 361).

Parfit, moreover, has suggested a more subtle critique of this proposal. He argues that, other things being equal, we do not believe that the fact that one act affects particular persons for the worse and another does not makes a difference to the moral status of two acts. Parfit's argument on this point relies on the following case:

The “two medical programs” example. We are comparing two “rare conditions,” J and K (Parfit 1987, 367). Condition J will cause pregnant women to bear impaired offspring; it can be easily treated. Condition K causes the same impairment; condition K cannot be treated but “always disappears within two months” (p. 367). Two medical programs are currently in place: one that tests and treats pregnant women for condition J and another that tests women before they become pregnant for condition K and warns those women to delay conception for two months. The two programs yield the same (reduced) incidence of impairment and have exactly the same effects on persons other than the children. The only difference, then, is that the condition J program makes particular children better off than they would have been without the program, while the condition K program means that better off but nonidentical children will be brought into existence instead. Suppose, now, that we must cancel one of the two programs. Canceling the one program will make things worse for particular children and canceling the other will make things worse for no one at all. Does it make a difference, morally, which program we cancel? Or do we instead think the two programs are “equally worthwhile”? (p. 367)

The person-affecting intuition implies that it is morally permissible to cancel the condition K program. Putting person-affecting principles to work beyond the “person-affecting intuition” itself (which itself is just a necessary condition on wrongdoing), we might also say that it is wrong to cancel the condition J program. But those results are contradicted by what Parfit and many others find the more plausible response to the two medical programs case—that is, the “No-Difference View”, according to which the two programs are equally worthwhile (p. 367).

3.2 Act is wrong in virtue of impersonal effects

This proposal accepts the nonidentity problem as a counterexample to the person-affecting intuition. The success of this take on the nonidentity problem will depend in part on whether we can plausibly account for an act's being wrong in cases in which it is clear to us that the act both really is wrong and not worse for any person who does or will exist. Several such accounts have been proposed. Each can be described as “impersonal” at least in part, in virtue of the fact that it rejects the person-affecting intuition and, generally, the attempt to explain why the act is wrong by reference to its making things worse for particular persons.

3.2.1 Traditional consequentialist approach

Traditional forms of consequentialism, including both the total form of consequentialism (“totalism”) and the average form of consequentialism (“averagism”), have the resources to explain how an act can be wrong while making things worse for no one. If, by waiting a few years to have a child, the 14-year-girl could have produced a better off but nonidentical child, both totalism and averagism will imply (other things being equal) that it was wrong for the girl not to wait (Singer 1999, 122–25). The key for both both views is the focus on the maximization of aggregate wellbeing. Whether we do that (a) by creating additional wellbeing for a particular person, or (b) by bringing a nonidentical but better off person into existence instead, is immaterial. If we have no way of accomplishing the former, then we must do the latter. (See the entry on consequentialism.)

The nonidentity problem thus provides a measure of support for moral theories that rely on an aggregative approach in ethics. However, as Parfit has argued, totalism faces the “repugnant conclusion.” Averagism, which nicely addresses the repugnant conclusion but seems to prohibit our having a very happy child, or another very happy child, if it so happens that prior generations have had especially wonderful lives, has been criticized as well (Parfit 1987, 420; Feldman 1995, 192–93). Both totalism and averagism, moreover, face objections based on considerations of justice, fairness and equality.

3.2.2 Pluralistic and restricted forms of consequentialism

In response to objections, some contemporary consequentialists have described theories that embrace a plurality of values. Such theories retain the aggregative element we see in totalism and averagism—and hence the ability to address the nonidentity problem—but incorporate other values as well into their tests for determining whether one outcome is morally better than another and, indirectly, the moral status of acts. Such additional values, or “ideals,” may include fairness, desert, equality, human flourishing and the prioritization of the needs of the least well-off (Temkin 1993, 221-27; see also Broome 1991, and Feldman 1997).

Still other philosophers have suggested that both the nonidentity problem and the repugnant conclusion can be avoided by principles that require agents to create additional wellbeing “for persons” (even if not for particular persons) but restrict that obligation to the case where they can substitute in a single, better off, nonidentical child in place of the less well off child. The agent may, in other words, be obligated to bring the better off child into existence in place of the impaired child in, e.g., the context of wrongful life but avoid the general obligation to create more wellbeing on an aggregate basis by bringing ever more people into existence (Holtug 2009; see also Peters 2004, 27–39 (concept of “injury by failure to substitute”), and generally Parfit, 1987, 369–71 (discussion of Principle Q)).

3.2.3 Hybrid views

Some pluralistic theories incorporate both person-affecting and impersonal elements. The impersonal elements of such an approach may take either (a) an aggregative form or (b) a restricted form, where the obligation is limited to the case where the agent can substitute the single, better off, nonidentical child in place of the impaired child. Consider whether a parent ought to have, e.g., a third child, who would certainly be very happy if he or she were to exist. Then, (a) we might say that the goal of maximizing wellbeing in the aggregate provides that parent with a reason to have the third child, while the person-affecting goal of avoiding the imposition of burdens on the two already-existing children will (depending on the facts) provide the parent with a reason not to have the third child, however happy that child might be. What the parent ought to do will then be determined by how these opposing reasons balance against one another (McMahan, 2006; McMahan 2009). Buchanan, et al., propose the more restricted hybrid approach. On their view, many of our obligations are person-affecting, including the obligation to avoid making a particular person worse off, or to avoid causing that person to suffer a “serious loss of happiness or good,” when the agent can do so without imposing “substantial burdens” on others. This is their “Principle M” (Buchanan, et al. 2000, 226). In some cases, however, we will have obligations that go beyond Principle M. It is here that their “Principle N” is triggered, prohibiting agents from letting their dependents—including their children—“experience serious suffering or limited opportunity or serious loss of happiness or good,” if “they can act … without affecting the number of persons who will exist and without imposing substantial burdens … on themselves or others …” (Buchanan, et al. 2000, 249).

3.3 Act is “bad for” future person without making that person worse off

The hybrid approaches noted under clause (a) in part 3.2.3 above, by recognizing the value of increasing wellbeing in the aggregate, are vulnerable to an objection based on what McMahan calls the “asymmetry,” which states that, while we have good moral reason not to bring a miserable child into existence, we have no reason at all to bring the additional happy child into existence. (McMahan 1981, 100) Some theorists will see no difficulty in denying the asymmetry and accepting that we have a moral reason to bring the additional happy person into existence. Still others consider the asymmetry a part of common sense that a plausible moral theory will preserve.

The approaches noted under clause (b) in part 3.2.3 are restricted in a way that enables them to reject the second half of the asymmetry. A related question, however, emerges for those views: why, if the agent is prohibited from bringing the impaired child into existence in place of the better off child, is the agent not also required, more generally, to create additional wellbeing in the aggregate?

These concerns seem rooted in the hope that the nonidentity problem can be addressed within the scope of a person-affecting approach without taking the extreme step of denying that the acts under scrutiny in the nonidentity cases are wrong. The result has been a collection of views that aim to describe some respect or another in which the act under scrutiny—the wrong act—can be said to be “bad for,” without making things worse for, the person it causes to suffer.

3.3.1 Act violates future person's rights

Several theorists have argued that what makes the act under scrutiny wrong is that it violates the individual's right against being brought into a certain kind of existence (Velleman 2008; Smolkin 1999; Woodward 1986; for discussion of children's rights in the context of historical injustices, see Cohen 2009). Consider, for example, the slave child case. According to the nonidentity problem, the couple's not entering into the slave child contract would not have made things better for that child; if anything, it would have made things worse for that child by, very probably, leaving that child out of existence altogether. Yet we nonetheless agree (if we accept rights, or rights-talk, in any form at all) that everyone has a right not to be made, or born, a slave. The couple's entering into the slave child contract and then proceeding to have a child thus violates a right that that child has; what they have done wrongs, and is “bad for,” the child. That is so, even though the couple's choice does not make things worse for that child than (very probably) does any more benign alternative. Similarly, the ticket agent who refuses to sell an airline ticket to a customer, Smith, on the basis of race violates Smith's right against racial discrimination even in the case where the plane subsequently “crashes, killing all aboard” (Woodward 1986, 810–11, citing Adams). “What makes racial discrimination wrong is that it is unfair and that it stigmatizes … and an action may have this character—and be wrong for this reason—regardless of how it affects [a person's] other interests” (Woodward 1986, 811). The adverse effects imposed by the bad act are not “canceled or removed” by the fact that the act under scrutiny maximizes overall wellbeing for a person (p. 810). But in neither the slave child case nor the airline ticket case does the act under scrutiny make things worse for the person whose right is violated.

Is the act that does not make the child worse off properly said to “harm” the child? Woodward goes so far as to say that it does, under a “nonconsequentialist approach” to harm (p. 818). Parfit, in contrast, suggests that we ought to “revise” the ordinary sense of the term “harm” and say that one who is not made “worse off” is not harmed in a “morally relevant sense” (Parfit 1987, 374). Whatever we say on that particular point, however, the proposal here is that we can give a thoroughly person-affecting account of what makes the act wrong in virtue of what the act does to the child: it violates that child's right.

The rights-based account does not require that we compile a defined list of rights. We might take the more general view that each person has a right to be created with “due consideration for his or her humanity”; we can understand that life itself is a “predicament” for which one's children need to be well-equipped (Velleman 2008, 266 and 276). A “child has a right to be born into good enough circumstances, and being born to [e.g.] a fourteen-year-old mother isn't good enough” (Velleman 2008, 275). That a child was “glad to be born” doesn't mean that that child has waived “his birthright” (p. 277). If we find this unclear, we might alternatively take the position that it is wrong to bring a child into existence when many of his or her rights as outlined, e.g., in the United Nations Convention, would be violated (Archard 2004, 403–20).

The rights-based solution faces at least three challenges. The first, from Parfit, is that it is questionable whether an act an individual would not “regret” and would even applaud can violate a right. If it can, surely it does so only in some formal way but not in a way that is sufficient to show that the act is genuinely morally wrong. When respect for the right can be seen in advance not to promote the interests of the rights-holder in any way, the better view might be that the right has been implicitly “waived” or the violation implicitly consented to (Parfit 1987, 364–65 and 373–74). Similarly, the right against bodily injury may be considered implicitly waived, or the violation implicitly consented to, when one arrives at the hospital unconscious and in immediate need of open heart surgery. We don't think, in such cases, that whatever formal rights violation there may have been supports the inference that what the surgeon has done is morally—or even legally—wrong.

The second objection asks whether the rights-based approach “proves too much.” Consider the case where the couple produces a slave child, not because they have entered the slave child contract, but rather because they themselves are slaves and have no means, at the time of choice, of escaping that status. If producing a child who will be born into slavery in the context of the nonidentity problem counts as a violation of the child's right and is, for that reason, wrong, despite the fact that that child very probably cannot exist and not be enslaved, and despite the fact that the child's life is worth living, it seems we must say the same thing in this new version of the slave child case as well. But that result may seem implausible.

A third objection notes that, if the child has the right not to be brought into an existence of a certain sort, it is plausible that the child's parents have various rights as well. Thus, the couple who opts to produce a child with Huntington's disease or hereditary deafness in place of a relatively unimpaired child may be simply exercising their right of procreative liberty; they may be using their gametes and their labor, as a matter of right, in a way that suits them. We quickly see that the offspring's rights and the couple's rights cannot both be respected—a fact that may be construed to mean that the underlying account of rights is itself internally inconsistent (Persson 2009).

3.3.2 Act harms, or wrongs, by causing future person to suffer; non-comparative harm account

The nonidentity problem takes it for granted that an act harms a person only if an act makes that person worse off than he or she would have been under an alternative act. On this view, an act, e.g., that maximizes wellbeing for a person cannot harm that person—at least not in a “morally relevant sense” (Parfit, 1987, 374). This proposal argues that the term “harm” should not be construed so narrowly and that a strictly comparative account of harm is mistaken. As Shiffrin has argued, if you are hit on the head by a gold bar dropped from the sky, you have been harmed, even if you have been more than compensated for that harm in virtue of the fact that you are now in possession of the gold bar (Shiffrin 1999, 120–135).

In the wrongful life case, a child is born with a serious genetic or chromosomal impairment, an impairment that we cannot eliminate if the child is to exist at all. But in the cases of interest here the child's life is worth living. Hence, the act that leads to the existence of that child rather than a better off but nonidentical child—whether it is a negligent act on the part of the woman's doctor or an intentional act on the part of the parent—does not make things worse for that child than any alternative act would have made things for that child. But it does cause the child to experience “pain, mental or physical discomfort, disease, deformity, disability, or death”; more generally, it produces a state that is bad for the child to be in—a “bad state” (Harman, 2009; Harman 2004). According to this proposal, the act harms the child, but in a non-comparative, rather than a comparative, sense.

A related strategy is to argue that, even if the act does not genuinely harm the child, the fact that it causes the child to suffer in defined ways means that it wrongs the child. Whether the correct position is that the child is harmed, or instead that the child is wronged though not harmed, certain further moral distinctions may well be considered important. Thus, the woman whose illicit drug use during pregnancy has caused her baby to be born with asthma and the woman whose genetic makeup causes her baby to be born with the identical condition have equally, in a non-comparative sense, harmed their offspring (Steinbock 2009). But the moral status of their acts seems very different.

One way to recognize that difference is to incorporate both senses of “harm” into the moral analysis. We could then say that the reasons that would justify acts that impose harm in both forms (other things being equal) will need to be weightier than reasons that justify acts that impose harm in the non-comparative sense alone (Harman 2009). This view will give us a way of distinguishing between the situations of the two women who produce asthmatic offspring without abandoning the view that it is wrong for the parent to bring a seriously impaired child into existence in place of a better off but nonidentical child. This view will also suggest that, where the countervailing reasons are relatively slight or nonexistent, the choice that imposes non-comparative harm alone would be wrong even if the pain or limitation is not severe.

A second way to distinguish between the acts of the two women would be to restrict the claim that the child is non-comparatively harmed—or, alternatively, the claim that the act wrongs that child—to the case where that existence remains worth having but falls below a certain threshold (Meyer, 2004). The result that the child is harmed—or wronged—could then be avoided in cases where, for example, the child's existence meets or exceeds either a “decent minimum” (achieved “only if life holds a reasonable promise of containing the things that make human lives good,” such as “an ability to experience pleasure, to learn, to have relationships with others”) (Steinbock 2009) or the average expected wellbeing (Tooley 1998); or if the child will not face unusual or severe hardships (Kamm 2002; Benatar, 2000).

A related issue is whether an act that causes a person to endure even serious hardship necessarily harms that person, even if we agree that that person suffers harm (in a non-comparative sense). It has been argued, for example, that an act harms a person only if the agent to stand in some “appropriate relation” to the harm that is suffered, where that relation will involve a counterfactual element and accordingly may not obtain if the suffering is due to a genetic disease or disorder (Hanser 2009). This view bifurcates the nonidentity cases, by suggesting one analysis of wrongful life case and another of, e.g., the depletion case: the future persons will all be deemed to have suffered harm but only the victims of depletion will be deemed to have been harmed by the choice under scrutiny.

An ongoing controversy raised by the proposals described in this part is whether they successfully explain the wrongness of the wrong act in terms of the effects that act has on the child. So long as the child's life is itself, though flawed, worth living, it may seem that the difficulty the child will be forced to face is a “perfectly acceptable price to pay for a life he could not have without it” (Wasserman 2006, 145). The position that non-comparative harm, or the wrong that is done a child by acts that both cause the child to suffer but also are critical to the child's very existence, is better conceived as a constituent not of a person-affecting account of wrongdoing but rather of an impersonal account, sidesteps that controversy, and is reminiscent of Kavka's idea that such acts do not genuinely harm, or wrong, the child, but rather constitute instances of the agent acting (by creating a less “intrinsically desirable,” “restricted” life) “wrongly toward” the child (Kavka, 1982, 97 and 104–105).

3.3.5 Act harms, or wrongs, future person by making that person worse off than a person conceived from distinct gametes

Several proposals fall under this heading. (a) below accepts that the future person p is nonidentical to the person q conceived from distinct gametes and then exploits the fact that p and q may fall under the same description; (b) argues p and q may be identical despite a distinction in gametes (despite, that is, a distinction in the timing and manner of conception); and (c) exploits certain mistakes many people will make in thinking about the identity between p and q.

(a) Though discussed briefly by Parfit and set aside (Parfit 1987, 359–60), the descriptive proposal has been renewed in recent years (Hare 2007, 512–23, advocating concept of “de dicto” harm; Reiman 2007, 78–90, describing a “veil of ignorance” with respect to the identity of the person harmed). The descriptive proposal makes use of the fact that the same definite description can pick out distinct children in distinct scenarios. Consider the slave child case. Let p be the child who in fact exists and suffers as a result of the couple's entering into the slave child contract. And let q be any one of the children who might have existed had the couple not entered into the slave child contract yet still produced a child. The nonidentity problem argues (among other things) that p and q are, at least very probably, numerically distinct, that is, nonidentical. At the same time, on one construction, p and q, even if nonidentical, fall under a common description: they are equally, for example, “the child produced by the couple.” Moreover, since one choice makes p worse off than the other choice makes q, the one choice, on a certain construction, makes “the child produced by the couple” worse off than the other choice makes “the child produced by the couple.” And on that basis we can then say that the one choice makes things (“de dicto”) worse for “the child produced by the couple” than the other choice does.

Parfit's concern regarding this approach notes an explanatory gap between the claim that the couple's act makes things worse for “the child produced by the couple” and the result we seek to explain—that the act of entering into the contract is wrong. The question is whether there is anything we can grasp in what the couple has done to the child in fact produced that explains why the couple's act is wrong. No “familiar moral principle” takes us from the shorthand claim to the assessment we are aiming to explain (Parfit 1987, 359; Wasserman 2008, 529–35). If this proposal is construed, however, not as narrowly person-affecting, but as impersonal (though restricted, like some of the proposals described in part 3.2.2 above), the explanatory force of the claim may seem considerably stronger (Hare 2007, 513–14).

Another concern about this proposal is rooted in the metaphysical doctrine of actualism. If the merely possible, but better off and nonidentical child, is a mere figment of our imagination, then so (presumably) is the idea that the wrong act makes the person who in fact exists and falls under a certain description worse off than a more benign act makes a merely possible person who falls under that same description (Weinberg 2008).

(b) A second proposal challenges the metaphysical claims about cross-world identity that the nonidentity problem relies on. On this proposal, the slave child p, produced when the couple chooses to enter into the slave child contract, and the child q, produced when the couple refrains from entering into the contract but still produces a child, should not necessarily be considered distinct. p and q may, in other words, be the very same child, despite the fact that (due to variations in the timing and manner of their conceptions) they have ended up with distinct genomes (Wolf, 2009).

(c) The third proposal involves a form of rule consequentialism that, instead of struggling to avoid, simply exploits two naïve mistakes that it might be supposed many people will make when they first began to think about obligations in respect of future persons. The first is the mistake of thinking that the population produced when, for example, agents choose conservation will be identical, at least in part, to the population produced when agents choose depletion instead. The second is the person-affecting intuition itself—the idea that an act that makes things worse for, and harms, no one at all is not itself worse, or impermissible. Mulgan suggests that the “ideal code”—the code whose internalization by most of a given society will maximize wellbeing on an aggregate basis—will incorporate both these mistakes. Those mistakes are easily and efficiently “taught,” since (it can be argued) we are prone to make them in any case, and they in effect cancel each other out. The upshot is that the depletion choice—or the 14-year-old girl's choice to have a child—will violate the ideal code and thus declared wrong (Mulgan 2009; Mulgan, 2006, 155–56 and 204).

3.4 Inference to claim that act is not worse for future person is mistaken in some nonidentity cases

This proposal applies only to that class of nonidentity problems that reason from (a) the fact that any more benign act would have made it highly improbable that the future person who in facts exists and suffers would ever have existed at all and (b) that life is worth living to the conclusion that (c) the wrong act does not harm and is not worse for that person. Such cases include Kavka's slave child and pleasure pill cases, Parfit's depletion and risky policy cases and cases involving historical injustices. This proposal concedes that existence is highly “precariousness.” But it is then argued that that point applies, not just to the more benign act, but to the wrong act as well. At the time just prior to choice—which is the point at which claims about probability, in virtue of their implications for the calculation of expected value, are pertinent to the moral analysis—it is also highly improbable, for any particular person, including the person who eventually exists, that the coming into existence of that person will be the end result of any causal chain of events and acts that happens to be triggered by that wrong act. Yet, because the outcome for the future person—e.g., the slave child—will be better if the more benign act is performed and that same child exists than if the wrong act is performed and that same child exists, we should think that the wrong act is, after all, worse (at least in terms of expected value) for the child than is the more benign act. Moreover, since we also think the outcome in which the child exists as a nonslave is actually better for the child than the outcome in which the child exists as a slave, this is not a case where the risk created for the child by the wrong act never eventuates. The child who is in fact born a slave, by hypothesis, does not somehow luck out and come into existence as a nonslave. The upshot is that, whether we say that an act's being better or worse for a person is a matter of expected value, actual value or both, it is a mistake to think that the wrong act is no worse for the future person than is any more benign alternative. This proposal is grounded in the prior point that we should reject, as inherently unreliable, any attempt to determine that one act is better or worse for a person than another by comparing the expected value of one act (e.g., a more benign act) against the actual value of another (that is, the wrong act) (Roberts 2009; Roberts 2006; Roberts 2003; Roberts 1998).

This proposal is limited in scope. It has no application to nonidentity problems in which the agents have no way to bring the child into a better existence—variations in which the probability of the child's coming into existence is 0, given the performance of any more benign act. For example, in the wrongful life context, this proposal does not support the result that the genetically impaired child has been harmed or made worse off. The result that the act that brings such a child into existence in place of a better-off but nonidentical child is permissible will remain a controversial issue, notwithstanding the fact that many cases of wrongful life (as Parfit noted in connection with the 14-year-old girl case) involve harm to persons other than the impaired child and can on those grounds be deemed wrong (Roberts, 2009).

3.5 Act is wrong in virtue of agent's reasons, attitudes and intentions

3.5.1 Act violates principle of mutual respect

A contractualist approach to the nonidentity problem will focus on the legitimate expectations future persons have in respect of the agents whose acts cause them both to exist and suffer. Such expectations can be violated—and future persons wronged—even in cases where those persons have not been harmed, or made worse off, by what the agent has done. What is important is not the outcome for the person but rather the “culpable failure” on the part of the agent, including the failure to respect a future person's “value as capable of rational self-governance” by way of failing to take “risk-managing” measures (including, e.g, pre-conceptual genetic testing) on behalf of that future person (Kumar 2003, 104–114). An issue will be whether a measure that means that the person who will suffer can never exist at all is genuinely risk-managing in respect of that person. Again, however, that issue can be sidestepped to the extent this proposal is understood, given its focus on the agent's act and not how that act, in the end, affects or can be expected to affect any particular person, to reflect an impersonal rather than a person-affecting approach.

3.5.2 Act's agent fails to have appropriate concern for future person's plight

A second approach that shifts the analysis of wrongdoing away from what has been done to the future person and toward the situation of the agent focuses on the agent's reasons for making one choice rather than another. On this approach, whether the agent's act wrongs the future person will depend on whether the agent is motivated by an appropriate level of concern for the needs and interests of (among others) the future person. Is the agent appropriately sensitive both to the degree of suffering that person can be expected to endure and to the various aspects of that person's life that can be expected to render that life (on balance) worth living? (Wasserman 2006, 146) The parent may have (e.g.) a principled objection against pre-implantation genetic diagnosis but also have an appropriate level of concern for the child's plight. In that case, the parent's producing the impaired child in place of the better-off but nonidentical child does not wrong the impaired child. On the other hand, if a parent fails to undergo genetic testing out of laziness, and never considers the challenges that the child will have to face as a result of being born impaired, then what the parent has done is wrong. Thus, on this view, the act's permissibility is a function not of the expected good for the child in fact being counterbalanced by the expected bad but rather of the parent's careful determination of whether it does or not (Wasserman 2006, 146–151). Choices by policymakers (in, e.g., the context of the depletion example) can be similarly evaluated. The parent's and the policymaker's roles may differ in respect of the future persons their choices will cause to exist, but agents in both roles can plausibly be held to a role-appropriate standard of concern (Wasserman 2009).


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actualism | consequentialism | consequentialism: rule | intergenerational justice | parenthood and procreation | personal identity: and ethics | repugnant conclusion, the | value: pluralism