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Peter John Olivi

First published Tue Nov 2, 1999; substantive revision Fri Jan 4, 2008

Peter John Olivi must be considered one of the most original and interesting philosophers of the later Middle Ages. Although not as clear and systematic as Thomas Aquinas, and not as brilliantly analytical as John Duns Scotus, Olivi's ideas are equally original and provocative, and scarcely known even to specialists in medieval philosophy.

1. Life and Work

Olivi (1248–1298) was born in Sérignan, in the Languedoc region of southern France. He entered the Franciscan order at the age of 12, studied in Paris from 1267 to 1272 without becoming a master of theology, and spent the remainder of his life teaching at various Franciscan houses of study in southern France, with a stay in Florence from 1287–89. (For biographical details, see Burr 1976 and 1989, and especially Piron 1998, 1999.) Olivi's outspoken originality led him into conflict with religious authorities: his writings were condemned by the Franciscan authorities in 1283, and this obviously limited the influence he would have on posterity. Although his philosophical views were controversial, what drew the most attention was his attacks on Church authorities. As an early leader of the so-called "Spiritual" reform movement within the Franciscan order, Olivi attracted both fervent followers and implacable enemies (see Burr 1989, 1993; Douie 1932).

Olivi produced a large and wide-ranging body of work, much of which has survived. By far his most important philosophical text is his Summa of questions on Peter Lombard's Sentences, a massive work he began working on soon after leaving Paris, and which he seems to have completed only in the mid-1290s. This masterpiece of medieval philosophy remains still entirely untranslated, and edited only in part. His views on metaphysics and human nature are mostly founded in his questions on Bk. II (ed. Jansen, 1922–26). Material on the virtues is found in Bk. III (ed. Emmen and Stadter, 1981). Other important works include his Quodlibeta from 1289–95 (ed. Defraia, 2002), a set of questions on logic (ed. Brown, 1986), as well as many biblical commentaries and various texts pertaining to his condemnation. In this article I will focus on just a few of Olivi's interesting philosophical views, summarizing material in Pasnau 1993, 1997a, 1997b, and 1999.

2. Human Freedom

Olivi devotes several extended questions to the topic of human freedom, beginning with the question of whether human beings even have free will (liberum arbitrium). Olivi's own argument for the affirmative begins by listing seven pairs of attitudes (affectus), each of which testifies to the existence of free will (Q57, p. 317):

  1. Zeal and mercy
  2. Friendship and hostility
  3. Shame and glory
  4. Gratitude and ingratitude
  5. Subjugation and domination
  6. Hope and distrust
  7. Providence and negligence

Each of these attitudes, Olivi claims, is intelligible only given the existence of free will. More specifically, they are "its distinctive products, or its distinctive acts and habits" (ibid.). As he runs through the list, explaining how each attitude entails free will, it becomes clear that many of these claims are familiar ones. Zeal, for instance, is an angry reaction to bad deeds, motivated "only against the bad that one judges to have been done voluntarily, and thus which could have been freely avoided" (p. 318). Without free will, this attitude is based on an assumption that is "thoroughly false and grounded on a thoroughly false object" (p. 317). As zeal goes, so do the related phonemona of accusations, excuses, blame, and guilt. Generally, "a human being could no more be accused of some vice than he could be accused of death, for he could avoid the one as little as the other" (p. 336). Providence and negligence, the last pair on the list, likewise become meaningless : "For it is foolish to be careful about things that will occur necessarily" (p. 323). It becomes pointless to be careful about deliberation, for instance, "because the deliberation itself will or will not happen necessarily, and even one's carefulness will or will not occur necessarily" (p. 323).

For Olivi, these and other data stand as unshakeable evidence for the existence and nature of free will. He makes this clear from the beginning of his reply, when he introduces two premisses that "no one of sane mind ought to doubt" (p. 317). First, it is "impossible" for all of the attitudes of one's rational nature to be "thoroughly false and perverse and grounded on a thoroughly false and perverse object." Since Olivi thinks that the attitudes that distinguish us as rational creatures are founded on free will, giving up on free will would be to abandon most of what makes us human. We would become, he later says, "intellectual beasts" (p. 338). Second, it is impossible for attitudes to be entirely illusory when human beings improve and perfect themselves by assuming those attitudes (p. 317). If the practices of zeal, deliberation, friendship, love, etc. were all founded on a false assumption, then surely these practices would not be so crucial to human well-being. Thus "no one of sane mind will believe that something could be the truth which so sharply puts an end to all good things and brings on so many bad things" (p. 338). In the face of these implications, we should reject whatever stands in the way of free will, whether that be the authority of Aristotle or some abstruse principle of metaphysics. "Even if there were no other argument establishing that [the denial of free will] is false, this alone ought to be sufficiently persuasive" (p. 338). Moreover, as he explicitly notes, we should be persuaded not just of our own free will, but of the free will of all human beings, since these arguments are based not on private experience, but on our relationships with others.

This top-down approach, beginning with the ethical and experiential data, leads Olivi to some provocative conclusions about the nature of will. He does not merely conclude that the will's choices are not necessitated; the further conclusion Olivi reaches is that the will, until it makes a choice, is entirely undetermined one way or another, and that it determines itself in the direction it chooses. This is something "every human being senses with complete certainty within himself" (p. 327). In arguing that the will determines itself, he means that it is a first mover, in need of no efficient cause other than itself. "Its free power is the cause of its motion, when it is moved, and the cause of its rest, when it rests" (ad 5, pp. 341–42). If the will did not have this capacity for self movement, then the will would have to be determined by something else, hence it would not be making its own choices. But this violates the unshakeable assumptions from which Olivi begins, because it would then turn out that the will is not autonomous, not making its own choices, hence not a suitable object of one's zeal or friendship, among other things.

Olivi is well aware that the lack of autonomy does not entirely preclude a sort of pseudo-zeal or pseudo-friendship. One might be angry with someone, for instance, not out of the conviction that the bad action was that person's fault, but simply in an effort to change that person's ways. But this line of thought does violence to our conceptions of ourselves and our fellow human beings. We want people to do the right thing not because they have been effectively manipulated, but "solely and purely because of the love of justice" (ad 22, p. 368). Further, when we urge a person to do the right thing, "we do not intend simply to move someone toward what is good, but rather to make it that he voluntarily moves himself toward the good" (p. 369).

Olivi's view obviously belongs within the libertarian camp in the free will debate. Indeed, it is arguable that Olivi deserves credit as the founder of this view. Although John Duns Scotus is better known as an early proponent of libertarian freedom, Scotus's views seem heavily indebted to Olivi (see Dumont 1995). An English translation of Olivi's writings on human freedom would be of enormous value.

3. Soul and Body

With the rediscovery of Arisotle's metaphysical and ethical works, thirteenth-century theologians devoted an increasing portion of their time to interpreting and developing Aristotelian accounts of human nature. Olivi was very far from a slavish admirer of Aristotle's — indeed, he was if anything rather hostile to the Philosopher's pervasive influence, once remarking that "without reason he is believed, as the god of this age" (Q58 ad 14, p. 482; see Burr 1971). This hostility manifests itself in many ways, one of the most notable being his attempt to rework Aristotle's account of the soul-body relationship.

Olivi questions a central strand of the Aristotelian account, arguing that it is "not only contrary to reason but also dangerous to the faith" to hold that "the [soul's] intellective and free part is the form of the body per se and considered as such" (Q51; p. 104). Others had questioned the extent to which soul and body could be analyzed in terms of form and matter. But Olivi goes farther because he explicitly denies that one part of the soul, the rational part, can be understood as the form of the body. As a consequence, he was condemned by the Council of Vienne in 1312. Pope Clement V, in the bull Fidei catholicae fundamento, declared it a heresy to hold that "the rational or intellective soul is not per se and essentially the form of the human body" (Denzinger 1965, n. 902).

Olivi denies that "the [soul's] intellective and free part is the form of the body per se and considered as such" (Q51; p. 104). This matches fairly closely with the doctrine that was condemned. But it is easy to misunderstand what Olivi is saying. First, he is not denying that the rational part of the soul is a form, or even that it is the form of a human being. He in fact believes that the rational part, intellect and will, is the form of a human being's spiritual matter, and for that reason he thinks it acceptable to speak of intellect as the form of a human being (see Q51 appendix, p. 146). But he contrasts spiritual matter with corporeal matter, and as a result he denies that the rational part is the form of the body.

Second, Olivi is not denying that the soul is the form of the body. What he denies is that the rational part of the soul ("the intellective and free part") is the form of the body. Another part of the soul, the sensory part, is the form of the body, and for that reason it is acceptable to say that the whole soul is the form of the body:

It is said that the whole rational soul, rather than the sensory part, is the form of the body, even though it is informed by the whole only insofar as it is informed by the soul's sensory and nutritive part (Q51 app., p. 146).

We should say that the whole soul is the form of the body, in much the same way that we say a person talks, not a tongue (p. 144). But if we direct our attention to the various parts of the soul, then it is wrong to say that the rational part, "per se and considered as such," is the form of the body. The soul is the form of the body only with respect to its sensory and nutritive part.

Despite his anti-Aristotelian invective, Olivi might plausibly be said to be agreeing with Aristotle, who explicitly leaves room for parts of the soul that "are the actuality of no body" (De an. II 1, 413a7). Presumably, Aristotle is thinking of the intellect. But it's not at all obvious how that remark should be interpreted. Aquinas, for instance, holds without qualification that "the intellect... is the form of the human body" (Summa theologiae 1a 76.1c). So what is it that compels Olivi to drop intellect from the hylomorphic scheme?

Olivi writes that to identify the rational part — "per se and considered as such" — as the form of the body is "not only contrary to reason but also dangerous to the faith" (as above). More specifically, as he writes in a letter defending his views, he believes that that claim holds "the danger of destroying the soul's immortality, its liberty, and its intellectual nature" (Epistola n. 7). Each of these three consequences is based on one overarching assumption: that to make the soul's rational part the form of the body is to attribute to the body the distinctive capacities of the rational soul. Here is how Olivi puts that claim:

If the intellective part is the form of the body then, since all matter is actualized by its form, it follows that just as a human body is truly sensory and living through the sensory soul, so that body will be truly intellective and free through the intellective part (Q51; pp. 104–5).

If the intellect is the form of the body, then the body must have the capacities for intellectual thought and free decision. Olivi is of course going to reject that as absurd. Notice the form of this argument. First, Olivi asserts that to be the form of something is to impart actuality to that thing. This seems uncontroversial. Second, Olivi argues by analogy. Just as the sensory soul actualizes a body by giving it life and the capacity for sensation, so the intellective part — if it is the form of the body — should actualize the body by making it intellective and free. Here too, I think, Olivi's claim seems plausible. If one accepts the first step of the argument, that to be the form of something is to impart actuality to that thing, then the rational part must be giving something to the body. Olivi says, "every form imparts to its matter some operation, and some power for operating" (Q51; p. 109). So, if the rational part does not give the body the capacity for intellective thought, we have to provide some sort of account of what the rational part does give the body. But what else could the rational part of the soul do for the body, if not endow it with the power to be rational?

We might view this argument as posing a dilemma. If the rational part is the form of the body, then one must either understand this formal relationship in the ordinary way, in terms of actualizing the body, or one must concede that the rational part is not the form of the body in any ordinary sense. The first horn of the dilemma leads in the direction of materialism, because it forces one to claim that the powers of the rational soul are instantiated in the body. The second horn of the dilemma leads one toward retracting the original assertion: that the rational part, the intellect, is the form of the body. For it is not at all clear what that means, if intellect is not in any way actualizing the body.

4. Cognitive Activity and Attention

One of the most interesting and original aspects of Olivi's philosophy is his critique of the standard Aristotelian model of cognition. The starting point of this critique is his insistence that sensation and intellection are active, not passive. On the conventional medieval view, a cognitive power simply receives impressions from the world, in the form of sensible or intelligible species. Olivi argues that such an account leaves out a crucial element, the focusing of the cognitive power's attention on the object to be cognized.

However much the cognitive power is informed through a disposition and a species differing from the cognitive action, it cannot advance to a cognitive action unless before this it actually tends toward the object, so that the attention of its intention should be actually turned and directed to the object (Q72, p. 9).

Olivi gives the kinds of examples that one would expect. The ears of someone sleeping, for instance, receive the same impressions as the ears of someone awake, but the sleeper does not sense these impressions. Even when we are awake, we sometimes don't perceive objects right in front of us when we are intently focused on something else (Q73, pp. 89–90).

Olivi argues that this kind of cognitive atttention requires a "virtual extension" toward the object. One striking consequence of this claim is that the object itself needn't exert any causal influence, not on the cognitive faculties nor even on the physical sense organs. The external object need only be close enough to be apprehended by the cognizer's spiritual attention. In the cases of both sensation and intellection, the efficient agent is the cognitive power. The external object is merely a kind of final cause or, more precisely, a "terminative cause." (Q72, p. 36; Epistola, n. 12). It is merely by being the object of the cognitive power's attention that the external object plays a role in cognition. Though Olivi accepts the traditional theory of species in medio, sensible qualities that fill the air between the senses and their objects, he denies that these species are the efficient cause of cognition.

Is a virtual extension, as Olivi describes it, some special (perhaps nonphysical) but perfectly real kind of extension or extromission to external objects? The bulk of the evidence seems to show that Olivi means ‘virtual’ and ‘virtually’ to contrast with ‘real.’ He explicitly denies, for instance, that this virtual extension involves "any real emission of its essence" (Q73, p. 61). Elsewhere, considering the claim that "our mind is where it fixes its intention," he says that "these words are metaphorical. For we are not there really or substantially, but only virtually or intentionally" (Q37 ad 13, p. 672).

Olivi treats virtual attention not as a sui generis activity of the mind, but as a general kind of causal relationship that can be applied to physical agents just as much as to mental ones. For Olivi, every natural physical agent has a virtual attention of this sort that extends as far as its causal force does (Q23, pp. 424–25). One authority comments that Olivi's virtual attention is "in fact equivalent to action at a distance" (Jansen 1921, p. 118), a characterization that seems just.

Olivi allows that the object itself, through species in medio, can indirectly act on our spiritual faculties, through what he calls the via colligantiae (way of connection). A flash of lightning will make a physical impression on our eyes, and this physical impression can, through the via colligantiae, affect the spiritual sensory powers. But, crucially, this connection is not what brings about sensation. We see this flash, as opposed to receiving merely a physical impression from it, when we direct our spiritual attention toward it (Quodlibet I.4). This via colligantiae plays an important role across Olivi's philosophy of mind and the will, being his general method of explaining the vexed connection between mind and body (see Q59, pp. 546–54, and Jansen 1921, pp. 76–90).

5. Direct Realism

Olivi's direct realism is central to his thinking about cognition. If he were willing to say that the object of our spiritual attention is not the external object but an internal species of the object, then he could reformulate his theory of cognitive attention in a more plausible way, as a matter of grasping an internal impression from the object. But Olivi works very hard to avoid falling into any kind of position that might be called representationalist — that is, a view on which the immediate objects of cognition are internal. It is this direct realism, above all else, that leads Olivi to reject the standard scholastic account of sensible and intelligible species. On that standard account, species serve as forms that provide the intentional content of sensation and thought. Although these forms were standardly described as merely the means by which we grasp external things, Olivi argued that in fact the proponent of species was committed to representationalism.

Olivi argues against the species theory by advancing through a series of ever-more-serious charges. First, the theory is committed to taking species as the objects of cognition:

A species will never actually represent an object to the cognitive power unless the power attends to the species in such a way that it turns and fixes its attention on the species. But that to which the power's attention is turned has the character of an object, and that to which it is first turned has the character of a first object. Therefore these species will have the character of an object more than the character of an intermediate or representative source (Q58 ad 14, p. 469; cf. Q74, p. 123).

His argument for this conclusion turns on the first sentence of the passage, in which he claims that a species could not represent an object to a cognizer unless the cognizer attends to the species. Olivi takes this attention to the object to be both a necessary and a sufficient condition for a cognition of that object. So if we do have to focus our attention in this way on species, he infers that those species will be the object of cognition, not merely causal intermediaries.

Next, Olivi argues that species would have to be the first object of cognition. To turn toward a species in the way that we must if that species is to represent the external world "is the same as to attend to it as a first object" (Q74, p. 123). Elsewhere, "we would always cognize the species before the thing itself that is the object" (Q58 ad 14, p. 469). The point Olivi wants to make is one more often made by denying that the world is seen directly or immediately. If we see the external world at all, we see it only at second hand, indirectly.

The argument goes one final step. Someone who wants to claim that our internal sensations are themselves perceived has to choose whether or not to claim that the external world is also perceived. Olivi takes it that it is not; on the species account, we would not perceive the external world at all, only images of it:

The attention will tend toward the species either in such a way that it would not pass beyond so as to attend to the object, or in such a way that it would pass beyond. If in the first way, then the thing will not be seen in itself but only its image will be seen as if it were the thing itself (Q74, p. 123; cf. Q58 ad 14, pp. 469–70, 487–88).

The argument is based on a dilemma. Granting that cognizers must attend to species, there either will or will not be a separate and further attention to the object itself. It would of course be quite odd to say that there is such a further attention. This would entail, as Olivi goes on to say, that one "considers the object in two ways — first through a species, second in itself" (Q74, p. 123). This seems too much at odds with the phenomenal feel of perception to be a serious possibility. The obvious way out of the dilemma, then, is to say that there will not be any further attention: one apprehends the external world, if one does at all, in virtue of attending to the species themselves. This is what the representationalist will likely say. But if this is the case, Olivi argues, then we won't be seeing the things in themselves but only their images. Memorably, he remarks that a species "would veil the thing and impede its being attended to in itself as if present, rather than aid in its being attended to" (Q58 ad 14, p. 469).

In place of the species theory, Olivi offers an interesting alternative. Rather than treat mental representations as something separate from an act of cognition, Olivi proposes identifying the two. On his view, an act of cognition is itself a representation of the object perceived. There is no need to postulate any further representation beyond the act itself: that inevitably results in the mediation that Olivi wants to avoid. This act theory would prove influential on later scholastics, most notably William Ockham. And in our own era it has been reinvented and renamed, as the adverbial theory of thought and perception.

6. Word and Concept

Olivi extends his critique of species to the mental word (verbum), which was standardly postulated as the product of intellectual thought. His treatment of the verbum raises different issues from those associated with species. Here the issue is not direct realism, precisely, but rather the nature of concept formation. Near the start of his commentary on the Gospel of John, Olivi describes the standard view as follows: "Our mental word is something following an act of thought... and formed by that thought.... After it has been formed... the [extra-mental] object is clearly understood or viewed in that word as if in a mirror" (Tractatus de verbo 6.1). This word, moreover, "is that which is first cognized by intellect and is its first object;" the extra-mental object is cognized secondarily. This description closely matches a characterization Olivi gives in his later Sentences commentary:

Some maintain that a kind of concept, or word, is formed through an abstractive, investigative, or inventive consideration, in which real objects are intellectively cognized as in a mirror. For they call this the first thing understood, and the immediate object; it is a kind of intention, concept, and defining notion of things (Q74, pp. 120–21).

This view has two characteristic features. First, its postulates a mental representation — a concept or word — that is the product of intellectual activity. Second, it supposes that we understand the world through these representations, in such a way that we get at the world indirectly, or secondarily, "as if in a mirror." Call this an object theory of the verbum.

Olivi's own view is that the verbum should be identified with a particular act of thought: "our mental word is our actual thought" (Tractatus 6.2.1). When we engage in abstract intellectual cognition, Olivi says, "nothing serving as an object is really abstracted or formed that differs from the act of consideration already mentioned" (6.2.3). The Sentences commentary offers a concise characterization:

This [sort of intervening concept] ought not to be called a verbum, nor can [such a concept] be anything other than the act of consideration itself or a memory species formed through that act (Q74, p. 121).

There are, then, acts of intellect, but there are no separate inner concepts that are the objects of those acts. Call this an act theory of the verbum.

Why is this act theory superior to an object theory? One line of argument holds that the object theory "contains in itself obvious absurdities and thus contradicts sound reason" (Tractatus 6.2.2). This claim is argued in different ways, with the following dilemma often playing a crucial role: On one hand the verbum is said to be the product of intellectual cognition. But on the other hand the verbum is said to be required for cognition as the "first thing understood." How can it be both? Olivi thinks his opponents will have to maintain that in some way the verbum is the product of one act of intellect and the object of a second. This leads him to argue that his opponents are treating the verbum as merely a memory. But Olivi is happy to countenance representations of this sort. Thus the object theory collapses into the act theory.

The second line of attack holds that the theory lacks support because "there is no necessity or utility in postulating such a verbum" (6.2.3). Here Olivi considers two parallel lines of argument that a proponent of the mental word might make against this charge of superfluity.

First,... we experience in ourselves that we form in our mind new concepts of many propositions and conclusions. These concepts remain in us later and we return to them when we want to remember such propositions.... Second,... from individuals seen or imagined by us we abstract and form defining characterizations of their universal features,... and we come back to these when we wish to view such universal features (6.2.3).

Each argument appeals to our experience of forming within ourselves abstract ideas: in the first case propositional ideas, in the second universals. Intellect in each case is said to form a verbum. Olivi replies that no such inner word is necessary. In each case we have an act of conceptual thought, but no object is formed in intellect over and above the act of thinking itself. Indeed, if anything, such an object "would be an impediment" (6.2.3) — alluding to the epistemological difficulties discussed in the previous section.

By eliminating the representations that might intervene between intellect and external reality, Olivi gives us what we might be tempted to think of as a direct realist theory of intellectual cognition. Yet direct realism faces a serious problem at the intellectual level, a problem that Olivi's discussion fails to acknowledge. Direct realism is attractive as a theory of sensation because it seems clear what the objects of sensation are. But what are we directly in touch with when our intellect thinks abstractly or propositionally? One answer to this question is Platonism: universals and/or propositions have some kind of abstract mode of existence, independently of the human mind. Like almost all the scholastics, Olivi firmly rejects this kind of account (Q13). Another kind of answer, sometimes called conceptualism, treats universals and/or propositions as mental constructs. Defenders of the object theory can take this approach. They can hold that although there are no universals or propositions in re, there are universals and propositions in mente. The verbum, serving as universal or as proposition, will (in some cautiously described sense) be the object of thought.

Olivi's act theory would seem to rule out this kind of conceptualism. But what then will Olivi put in its place? He speaks of intellect's "attending to and considering the real character of a common or specific nature" (376–379), as if he has an unproblematic account of intellect's relationship to the outside world. Yet he says nothing to clarify the status of this relationship. He simply does not seem to have recognized the problem of abstract knowledge as a fundamental metaphysical motivation for the object theory. In this respect his overall account, although conceptually innovative, remains fundamentally incomplete.


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