Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Parenthood and Procreation

First published Fri Oct 4, 2002; substantive revision Tue May 30, 2006

Social changes often throw into question a phenomenon that previously seemed natural or trivial, turning what was an uninteresting subject of philosophical discussion into a topic of controversy. The rise of “Assisted Reproductive Technologies” (ARTs), increasing multiculturalism, and the explosion of interest in “applied” philosophy have all contributed to a rise of interest in philosophical questions surrounding parenthood and procreation. Contemporary discussions center around the following foci:

What are the grounds of parenthood? What is it that makes someone a parent? In what respects is parenthood a biological or natural relationship, and in what respects a social one?

What are the scope and limits of parental rights and responsibilities? What does parenting involve? What should parents be allowed to do/not do, and when may/must public agencies intervene?

Are there any procreative rights? If so, what are they? What, if anything, limits them? When is it morally permissible to procreate?

What is the relationship between procreative rights and responsibilities and parental rights and responsibilities?

1. Foundations

Parenthood inhabits the intersection of two distinct relationships: that between parent and child, and that between the parent (or family) and the larger society or other collective. Each of these involves two morally significant kinds of claims, one covering the parent's duties, the other the parent's rights. We call these relationships, respectively, the custodial relationship and the trustee relationship.

The custodial relation between parent and child involves a set of rights and duties aimed at, and justified by, the welfare of the child. A full account of the custodial relationship requires a theory of the good, although many writers follow Feinberg (1980) in working at a “meta-level”: parents owe their children an “open future,” understood as one where they become adults capable of choosing their own conception of the good. (Though Feinberg refers to the putative right to an open future as a right in trust, specifically for the adult the child will become, we regard it as part of the custodial relationship in light of the continuity of personal identity.) As custodian, the parent is under a limited obligation to work and organize his or her life around the welfare and development of the child, for the child's sake. Concomitantly, the parent is endowed with a special kind of authority over the child.

Societies, families, and cultural groups also have significant and sometimes compelling interests in the welfare of children, and when the relationship between parent and any of these other subjects is considered, the parental relationship is a kind of trustee relationship. Trusteeship differs from custodianship: in the former, it is to the trustor that one owes the object's welfare; in custodianship, it is to the object of the custodial right that one is obligated in seeking that object's welfare. For instance, the state has a compelling interest in the reproduction of its workforce and its citizens; hence parental decisions that threaten the child's chances of becoming a fully participating citizen may come under special state scrutiny. Distinct groups, such as the state and cultural groups, may make conflicting claims on the parents as trustees. For instance, in order to promote culturally prescribed norms, parents may seek to remove their child from school, or have their daughter undergo clitoridectomy; yet the state may claim that such a decision violates the parents' trustee relationship on grounds that the state has a compelling interest in securing the full citizenship capacities and rights of each of its citizens (Galston 1995, Tamir 1996, Nussbaum 1996). As trustee, the parent has a limited right to exclusivity in determining the child's life over the course of childhood, but this determination is to be aimed at shaping the child into (for instance) a productive citizen and community member.

(Historically, parenthood has often been regarded as a possessory (or proprietary) relationship. We regard this as a mistake that arises from undue emphasis on parents' limited rights to exclusivity and authority, to the exclusion of the special kinds of responsibilities that attach to these rights. Nonetheless, it would be possible to suggest that the nexus of relationships that constitutes parenthood is grounded in property rights. But since our aim in this section is merely to explicate the concept of parenthood rather than its grounding, we postpone further discussion of property to the next section.)

Many debates about the nature of parenthood can be seen as attempts to establish relations of primacy — on the one hand, between trusteeship and custodianship, and on the other, between parental rights and responsibilities. Though the two debates are strictly distinct, they often come wrapped together. Ever since Plato's Republic, one school of thought has prioritized the trustee relationship — the reproduction of the guardians or, more recently, of good citizens — and has treated parental responsibilities as prior to rights (Plato 1993). Contemporary communitarians and multiculturalists agree on both counts, but have focused on the competition between two or more putative trustors such as the state and a cultural sub-group. Such writers are particularly concerned to curb the state's ambition of being the sole trustor (Galston 1995). The liberal tradition has also been characterized by an emphasis on trusteeship, although with much greater emphasis on parental rights. Classical liberal writers emphasized exclusivity while also articulating a powerful requirement to educate the next generation of liberal citizens (Locke 1988 and 1989). Contemporary liberals have split along the seam. Some authors, appealing to self-ownership, self-determination, or freedom of contract, emphasize exclusivity and argue that parents have a right to fashion families however they like (Robertson 1999, Hall 1999); others emphasize obligations, defending, for instance, a policy of licensing parents (LaFollette 1980).

But it would be a mistake to suppose that liberals ignore custodianship. Some liberals emphasize parental responsibilities for child welfare, arguing that parental rights — if they even deserve the name — exist only insofar as they are justified by the welfare of children (Archard 1990, Montague 2000). Many feminists have also focused on custodial relationships, arguing that emphasis on the trustee relationship is a strategy of exercising control over women's reproduction (Brazier 1998).

One particularly active site of debate has to do with the scope of legitimate parental discretion. Parental discretion exists in a world of competing agencies and conceptions of the good, and philosophers differ on the extent to which the fact that a decision is a parental decision inoculates it against intervention. There are live debates about whether parents may choose (male) circumcision, clitoridectomy, congenital deafness, marrow donation (perhaps “harvesting” is the better word), and other interventions (see, e.g., Benatar and Benatar 2003 on circumcision; Tucker 1998 and Levy 2002 on deafness), and whether parents can be held responsible for such things as the obesity of their children (Lotz 2004). Obviously, as children age they typically become increasingly competent, and the scope of parental discretion shrinks in favor of autonomy; yet until the child reaches moral or legal competence, issues of substituted judgment and surrogate decision-making remain (Buchanan and Brock 1989). Debates about the scope and limits of parental discretion typically resolve into debates about the relative weight of the custodial, trustee and possessory aspects of parenthood (for a variety of issues see e.g. Harris and Holm 2003, Brake 2005, Coleman 2003, Rossi et al 2003, Mills 2003, Heyd 2003, Ross 2002, Vehmas 2002).

Discussions of legitimate parental discretion have taken on an added complexity in recent years due to the fact that would-be parents can exercise early discretion in increasingly robust and precise forms: they may choose their gamete “donor,” select sperm on the basis of sex, or obtain pre-implantation genetic diagnosis of their embryos and thereby reduce or eliminate the risk of dread diseases. These developments raise new ethical challenges, as parents possess ever-increasing powers to determine the nature of their children. (We discuss some of these challenges in section 4.).

To be a parent is thus to attempt to maintain an equilibrium among the rights and responsibilities associated with two kinds of relationships that sometimes seem to pull in different directions. But what makes someone a parent in the first place?

2. The Grounds of Parenthood

In virtue of what does one become a parent, where by a “parent” we mean someone who is a primary bearer of one or both of the above-discussed relationships to a particular child? We can distinguish four general answers to this question: genetic accounts, gestational accounts, intentional (or voluntaristic) accounts, and causal accounts. Some authors hold monistic versions of these, according to which only one of these properties generates parental relationships. Other authors hold pluralistic accounts, according to which more than one of these relations — and quite possibly each of them — can make someone a parent.

These are accounts of natural parenthood; they are not intended to ground forms of parenthood — such as adoption — that are conventional on their face, although both the intentional and causal accounts could easily be extended to cover such parents. By describing the target of the analysis as “natural parenthood” we do not mean to deny that the assignment of parenthood rests on conventions; in some sense, it is clear that parenthood is a socially constructed relation. But unlike the conventions that govern (say) linguistic meaning, it is widely assumed that the conventions that govern the assignment of parental relationships are constrained by certain natural relations. This assumption has been challenged (Thompson 2005), but it is a plausible one.

2.1 Genetic accounts

Genetic theories ground parenthood in the relation of direct genetic derivation. In recognizing genetic relations as a ground of parenthood, geneticism places parenthood in the nexus of other familial relations, such as being a sibling, a cousin, and so on, which appear to have a genetic basis.

Hall (1999) defends the genetic account by appeal to the Lockean notion of self-ownership. Since the genetic parents own the genetic material from which the child is constituted, it follows that they have a prima facie parental claim to the child. There are a number of problems with this line of argument (Kolers & Bayne 2001). First, it subsumes parental relations under property relations, in that it attempts to derive a claim about parenthood from premises that involve claims about ownership. The plausibility of this derivation is based on playing up the rights associated with custodianship and trusteeship, and playing down the associated responsibilities. Those responsibilities — to both child and community — pull rather sharply against a property-based analysis of parenthood. Secondly, taking self-ownership seriously entails that children own themselves, and this surely defeats any proprietary claim that their parents might have in them (Archard 1993) — or at least, collapses the parent's proprietary claim into custodianship. Thirdly, it is not the case that the genetic parents provide the material from which the child is constituted in utero; that derives from the gestational mother, not the genetic parents (Silver 2001). Of course, the child's genetic make-up, which is derived from its genetic parents, structures that matter, but to argue for the priority of the genetic contribution over the gestational contribution is to argue for the priority of form over matter, and it is not obvious that this can be done.

Other arguments for the genetic account derive from the consideration of paternity, in that direct genetic derivation appears to provide the most plausible account of the basis of fatherhood in particular. Several recent legal cases have overturned adoptions on the grounds that the estranged father, unidentified at the time of birth, has returned to claim the child (Rosenman 1995). Supporters of these decisions endorse the view that unalienated genetic claims to children can override months or even years of rearing by the adoptive parents, as well as the earlier failure of the father to claim the child. Similarly, in “surrogacy” cases, many writers have argued—or simply assumed—that a genetic father may indeed have his own child by contracting with a surrogate mother. This view seems to presuppose a genetic account of paternity, at least; and it is perhaps a small step from a genetic account of paternity to a genetic account of parenthood: one need appeal only to the principle of “parity,” according to which the sort of relationship that makes one person a parent suffices to make anyone else a parent (Bayne & Kolers 2003, Austin 2004).

2.2 Gestational accounts

A number of authors have argued that the primary ground of parenthood is the gestational relation (Rothman 1989; Feldman 1992). In reproductive contexts in which a child's gestational mother differs from its genetic mother — as happens in egg (or embryo) donation and gestational surrogacy — it is the gestational mother who has the primary claim to parental rights and responsibilities.

Three lines of argument have been given for gestationalism. One is consequentialist and draws on the custodial aspect of parenthood: since the gestational mother, unlike the genetic mother, is guaranteed to be identifiable at birth it is in the best interests of the child that the gestational mother be regarded as the mother (Annas 1984, Charo 1990). But while it is surely the case that recognizing the gestational mother as the exclusive natural parent will sometimes serve the best interests of the child, it is implausible that this will always be the case; to the contrary, if one wants to ensure that children enter the world ensconced in a network of people who have an interest in, and responsibilities for, their welfare, one should endorse a pluralistic rather than monistic gestationalism. Moreover, when attached to a consequentialist orientation, custodianship itself seems open to challenge. Indeed, for the consequentialist it would seem necessary to endorse custodianship as either purely instrumental to, or only one part of, the larger aim of the general well-being; and this seems to support trusteeship rather than custodianship as the primary foundation of parenthood.

A second line of argument appeals to the unique relationship between gestational mother and child. This relationship has a number of facets. First, the mother and fetus are physically related. The fetus is inside — and perhaps even part of — the mother's body; it is also physically dependent on the mother in a way that it isn't dependent on anyone else (including its genetic parents). Second, the mother typically invests a substantial amount of effort — what we might call sweat equity — into the child. In Narayan's words, a gestational mother typically undergoes “considerable discomfort, effort, and risk in the course of pregnancy and childbirth” (Narayan 1999: 81). Third, and more controversially, gestation is a process that can foster emotional and affective bonds. It seems plausible to factor the relationship between gestational mother and child into an account of parenthood, but it's an open question whether the nature of this relationship is such as to give the gestational mother a unique claim to parenthood.

Finally, a third source of arguments for gestationalism is driven by case studies such as “surrogacy” and other ways of “commodifying women's labor” (Moody-Adams 1991, Anderson 1990; Radin 1996; Ber 2000). The concern here is that new reproductive technologies carry with them a dehumanizing or objectifying attitude toward women and women's bodies, most obviously in the language of “womb rental” (Shanley 1993). This approach may be connected to a larger critique of a “biomedical” model of personhood, according to which any feature or function of a human being can be given an economic value. In this event, the argument may not be for gestationalism as such, except insofar as that is supported by this larger critique; and hence the argument will stand or fall along with that larger critique, which goes beyond the scope of this article. (For some further discussion, see section 3 below.)

Objections to gestationalism may start from the problem of paternity: if gestation is necessary for parenthood, how can men become fathers (Bayne & Kolers 2003)? Some gestationalists bite the bullet, and hold that “if men want to have children, they will either have to develop the technology that enables them to become pregnant … or have children through their relationships with women” (Rothman 1989: 257). Arguably few theorists would find this consequence of gestationalism acceptable.

2.3 Intentional accounts

A third approach to parenthood, especially popular with legal theorists, appeals to intentions as the ground of parenthood (Hill 1991, Parker 1982, Shultz 1990, Stumpf 1986). Pluralistic versions of intentionalism regard successful orchestration of procreation with intent to rear as one basis of parenthood among others, while monistic versions of the view hold that being a parent involves nothing more (or less) than having (and successfully bringing to fruition) the right sort of intentions.

Intentionalists motivate their position by appeal to cases of the following kind. The Smiths wish to have a child “of their own.” They screen egg and sperm donors and find donors who satisfy their requirements. They then select a gestational mother, who carries the fetus to term and then hands the infant over to the Smiths. Intentionalists argue that because they “carefully and intentionally orchestrated the procreational act, bringing together all the necessary components with the intention of creating a unique individual whom they intend to raise as their own” (Hill 1991: 359), the Smiths should be regarded as the child's sole parents.

Another argument for intentionalism appeals to the “case of the misplaced sperm”:

Bruce is about to undergo some risky medical treatment, and has placed some of his sperm in a sperm-bank in case he needs it at a later date. Through a bureaucratic mishap, Bruce's sperm is swapped with that of a sperm-donor and is used by Bessie to produce a child. Does Bruce acquire parental rights and responsibilities over Bessie's child?

Intuitions vary here, but there is at least some pull towards denying that Bruce's genetic relation to Bessie's child gives him any parental claim over it. But the reason for this seems not to be that he failed to gestate the child or even that he failed to have the right sort of relationship with Bessie. Rather, the reason Bruce lacks a parental relation to Bessie's child is that he didn't intentionally bring the child into existence.

Intentionalism construes parenthood as relying on facts about agency rather than biology; for the intentionalist, parenthood is fundamentally a moral relationship rather than a biological one (see Fuscaldo 2006 for discussion). For this reason, intentionalism may stand or fall along with a voluntaristic account of responsibilities in general (Van Zyl 2002).

Whatever the prospects of an intentional account of parenthood, it is hard to see how an intentional account of familial relations in general could be correct. It is implausible to suppose that the duties that siblings have to each other, or that children have to their parents, can be accounted for in voluntaristic terms; to the contrary, intentionalists must explain the duties of offspring and siblings by appeal to the moral powers of the parents, which seems at odds with voluntarism. This is a problem for an intentionalist account of parenthood to the extent that duties between parents and children ought to take their place within a wider framework of duties towards family relations (Rachels 1989, Mills 2003).

A second objection to intentionalism concerns the exact content of the intentions that are supposed to ground parenthood. Consider a case in which a couple conceives by accident and then form intentions to give up the baby for adoption rather than rear it. This intention endures until 15 minutes after birth, at which point they change their minds and decide to rear the child after all. It is highly implausible that for the first 15 minutes of the child's life they are no more its parents than anyone else. Arguably cases like this undermine monistic versions of intentionalism according to which intentions to procreate or nurture are necessary for parenthood. However, they do not undermine pluralistic intentionalism, according to which intentions to bring a child into the world and rear it are sufficient, but not necessary, for parenthood (O'Neill 1979).

2.4 Causal accounts

Finally, parenthood may be grounded in causation (Nelson 1991, Bigelow et al 1988, Blustein 1997). In its pluralistic form the causal approach holds that causing a child to exist is sufficient for generating parental rights and responsibilities over that child. The monistic version of this view holds that causation is both necessary and sufficient for parenthood.

The causal account differs from intentionalism in that one can cause something without intending to bring it about. Indeed, one can cause a certain state of affairs even when one is unaware that one's actions could bring it about. One needn't have grasped the connection between sexual intercourse and pregnancy in order to be the cause of a child's existence.

One of the attractions of causalism is its promise to account for the plausibility of genetic, gestational and intentional accounts of parenthood. Both genetic and gestational relationships obviously contribute to causing the child to exist, and arguably, this is what makes each kind of relationship crucial to ascriptions of parenthood. And, in the sort of case that intentionalists appeal to, the commissioning couple might be regarded as the (or at least a) cause of the child's existence. Looked at in this light, causalism offers to provide a limited validation of its competitors.

But causal accounts face two tricky questions: what exactly is meant by “causation” in this context, and what implications does the causal account have? 'But-for' causation is obviously too weak to ground parenthood, but it is unclear what notion of causation the causal theorist should adopt in its place (Blustein 1997). Even with a satisfactory account of causation in hand it may be unclear whom the account ascribes parenthood to in any particular case — or if it is clear enough, there will be a risk that “the tail is wagging the dog,” with the account of causation tailor-made for this purpose. Concern with the arbitrariness of the causal chain by means of which a child may be created leads writers such as Fuscaldo (2006) to emphasize that what is wanted is not a theory of causation but of agency (see also Austin 2004). This conclusion leads back in the direction of intentionalism.

Having outlined the main theories of the grounds of parenthood, we turn now to questions concerning the morality and politics of becoming, or not becoming, a parent.

3. Whether there is a Right to Procreative Autonomy

Unlike older liberal constitutions such as the US Constitution, international human rights documents from the 20th century explicitly codify the right “to marry and found a family” (United Nations 1948, Article 16), and thus some writers argue that liberal constitutions implicitly enshrine a right to procreate (Hill 1991). Any such right would, however, be extremely problematic, for it would be located in a context that is at once deeply personal and highly politicized. Rights to procreate, then, appear at the intersection of numerous abiding values that are not easily commensurable. It is against this backdrop that the following debates play out.

One prefatory remark. We leave aside here the contentious issue of abortion. While abortion is obviously related to reproductive autonomy, the philosophical and political debate about it has taken on a life of its own and must be dealt with independently. We focus here on other elements of reproductive autonomy, though we do not suppose that positions on these matters are wholly independent of positions on abortion.

At least four main schools have emerged on the issue of whether persons have a right to procreative autonomy.

3.1 Communitarian Conservatism

The first, communitarian or conservative school, tends to regard procreation as a natural part of a dense web of practices that all gain their meaning, and value, from being part of a comprehensive way of life. In general, efforts to increase procreative autonomy — particularly with the use of biotechnology — risk meddling with such ways of life. For this reason, conservatives regard biotechnological intervention in reproduction with a jaundiced eye. The 20th century track record of Nazi “eugenics” and “euthanasia” programs, forced abortion as a population-control mechanism, and widespread nonconsensual sterilization in many countries, including the United States, seems to support them in this (Meilaender 1987). Writers such as Wendell Berry decry the separation between sex and responsibility that is produced by the decline of community and an economy that “encourage[s] sexual self-indulgence as a way of selling merchandise” (Berry 1993: 123).

This pessimism about technological, policy-driven, or putatively self-indulgent interventions in kinship practices is of the essence of communitarian conservatism. The problem with eugenics and forced sterilization, from this perspective, is not primarily the attendant violation of individual autonomy, but the intrusion of politics, economics, and individualism into the realm of families and communities. One particular touchstone is a critique of the language of rights in the discussion of procreation and parent-child relations. As one commentator writes, “Procreative liberty's problems began when it appropriated the abstract principle — the right to choose — and ripped it out of the rich context that provided its moral heft” (Murray 2002; see also Mitchell 2002). Communitarian conservatives thus are typically opposed to the use of assisted reproductive technologies.

It should be emphasized that communitarian conservatives need not deny that persons have a strong interest in autonomy regarding procreative decisions. The point is rather that this interest is both generated and delimited by a particular communal context. In sum, conservatives believe there is no right to reproductive autonomy, because reproductive choices gain their meaning and value from their communal context.

3.2 Two Kinds of Liberalism

A second approach to the question of procreative autonomy, the libertarian-liberal school, is diametrically opposed to the conservative school. The lodestars of the libertarian-liberal school are the twin values of equality and autonomy (or, put negatively, the “harm principle”) (Mill 1998, Feinberg 1986, Dworkin 1993). Authors such as John Harris hold that artificial means of reproduction ought to be universally available provided they do not harm others, because any restrictions would constitute unequal treatment of those who cannot conceive through sexual intercourse (whether due to infertility or because the person(s) in question don't form a “traditional” family) (Harris 1998a).

The particular concerns of the libertarian-liberal school have been to show that assumptions about the inherent wrongness of a number of innovative procedures are not borne out. In particular, libertarian-liberals have argued forcefully that conservative opposition to cloning, genetic selection, surrogacy, and the harvest of fetal ovarian tissue is based in undefended traditionalism (Harris 1998a; cf. Glover 1998, Buchanan et al. 2000, chap. 2). Libertarian-liberals hold that there is a right to reproductive autonomy, which right encompasses access to whatever means are required for procreation provided that all parties freely consent. Thus constraints on any behavior (or freely contracted service) are guilty until proven innocent.

Some critics of the libertarian-liberal school compose what might be called the policy-liberal school. Policy liberals share libertarian-liberal values of autonomy and equality, and as a result also treat market exchanges and consensual services as innocent until proven guilty. Nonetheless, policy liberals attend not only to the effects of particular choices, but to the impact of institutionalizing practices such as genetic selection, IVF, etc., and to the role of these practices within a broader society that aims to achieve and maintain broadly liberal background institutions (Rawls 1999, Glover et al. 1989, Buchanan et al. 2000, Brock 2005). Institutionalization brings to the fore concerns that libertarian-liberals play down, such as the effects of large numbers, the incentives that policies create, and opportunity costs. Thus for a policy liberal it will be impossible to determine the nature and scope of procreative rights without examining such rights against an institutional structure, given reasonable assumptions about human motivations.

Consider, for instance, what happens when a large number of people all make similar reproductive choices: the result may be a “baby boom” the effects of which reshape the social, economic, political, and environmental landscape. Similarly, fears that services for persons with Down's Syndrome will become unavailable due to a decline in their numbers, or that sex ratios will become grossly skewed in countries with a strong preference for male children, are examples of concerns about the effects of large numbers.

Policy-liberal accounts of reproductive autonomy may, then, face particular conundrums in a context of social inequality and population pressure. Some policy liberals affirm reproductive autonomy, but regard it as compatible with apparently coercive population policies such as limitations on the number of children particular persons may have. This may be because they regard procreative autonomy as a merely prima facie right, or because they regard the content of the right as determined by its interaction with other rights and duties. Taking the former line, Bayles (1979) holds that the right to procreate is less weighty than other rights, such as the right to a minimally decent quality of life, and in the name of these weightier rights, policy makers may coercively override the right to procreate. Taking the latter line, O'Neill is less comfortable with a conception of rights as defeasible by public aims, even admirable ones. O'Neill and others thus construe procreative rights more narrowly than is commonly done (O'Neill 1979, Hill 1991, Floyd & Pomerantz 1981). On O'Neill's view, the right to procreate is not a right to populate the world willy-nilly, but a right to beget, bear, and rear children. That is, no act of reproduction constitutes an exercise of a right to procreate unless it is performed with an intention to rear the resulting child so as to give it a life that is at least normal for its society. To be sure, many children are conceived “by accident”; O'Neill's approach would allow that the parents could develop the appropriate intentions after learning that their behavior has led to pregnancy. Once they have developed such intentions their behavior is covered by the right to procreate; but if they do not develop such intentions, or fail to act so as to rear the child into a normal life for their society, then they are not exercising any right to procreate, and thus policies to curtail their behavior in this respect do not constitute coercive infringements of the right to procreate.

One concern with O'Neill's view is that the requirement of giving a child a normal life for the society at the time threatens to admit inequality through the back door. In a society where poor parents are unable to ensure their children access to adequate nutrition, education, or health care, O'Neill seems forced to deny these parents the right to procreate. O'Neill may then counter with a broader conception of social justice; but the question remains of what to do before such justice prevails. Alternatively, she may bite the bullet and join other policy liberals in endorsing significant restrictions on who may have children. Hugh LaFollette endorses a program for licensing all parents (LaFollette 1982; see also Scales 2002). On this view, however, procreative autonomy interests are given weight within a system that regards procreation as a privilege, not a right.

In conclusion, policy liberals hold that procreative autonomy is one among many important forms of autonomy that societies ought to promote and protect. These forms of autonomy may conflict among themselves, and may also conflict with the state's legitimate (or compulsory) ends such as public-goods provision and compliance with national constitutions and international law. Talk of rights, from a policy liberal standpoint, is appropriate only within a nexus of liberties, claims, powers, and ends. Thus while most policy liberals defend the concept of a right to procreative autonomy, they tend to be much cagier than their libertarian cousins about what such a right entails.

3.3 Feminism

The final major school on the right to procreative autonomy comprehends a variety of views that share a feminist commitment to opposing patriarchy and promoting persons' (and particularly women's) abilities to determine the shape of their own lives, where this includes sexual and reproductive autonomy. While self-described feminists can be found in each of the schools discussed above, many feminist writers criticize each of these schools while fashioning independent, anti-patriarchal positions.

The feminist concern to enable women to shape their own lives and control their bodies suggests an initial sympathy with the libertarian-liberals' focus on autonomy and equality. But unlike liberals, many feminists are skeptical of the reproductive biotechnology establishment, which remains preponderantly white, upper-middle class, male, and tied to large corporations. Hence feminists often charge that libertarian liberalism is not so much the antithesis of communitarian conservatism but a variant of it (Corea, 1985, 1988, Rothman 1989). When this establishment represents itself as empowering women, many feminists charge that it succeeds only in disempowering them: it conscripts poorer women into service for men and women who are usually wealthier; it creates new expectations that may subtly coerce women to pursue fertility treatments or other medical interventions; and it inevitably contains the cultural, economic, sexist, and racist biases of the society at large. Among many examples that support this judgment is the observation that many laws that purportedly embody a right to reproduce in fact give rights not to women (or men, for that matter), but to physicians (Brazier 1998).

Some feminist writers have also raised the concern that any putative “right to procreate” threatens to give men power over women. In addition to empowering the mostly male scientific establishment, a right to procreate could empower a man to prevent his erstwhile partner from aborting her pregnancy (Overall 1993, Corea 1995). Thus the importance of a right not to procreate has led many feminists to place the various strands of procreative autonomy within a nexus of interests.

But feminism should not therefore be conflated with policy liberalism. Feminist work on procreative autonomy tends to emphasize at least two important issues that policy liberals ignore or play down. First, many feminists examine the rhetoric surrounding reproductive biotechnology and other services, concerned that this rhetoric tends to commodify women's bodies, devalue women's role in reproduction, and treat women as mere means rather than ends in themselves. For instance, some reproductive services entail so-called “womb rental,” “egg harvesting,” or “surrogate motherhood.” The terminology in each of these strikes many writers as objectifying or dehumanizing women (Rothman 1988, Ber 2000). Radical feminists such as Gena Corea draw a sharp distinction between what the “pharmacracy” sees and what women experience, arguing that the reproductive biotechnology establishment relies on a distorted and stereotyped picture of the nature, desires, and needs of women, as well as the success rate of the technologies it purveys (Corea 1985; Brazier 1998). Moreover, as we have seen, many feminists adopt a more complex and skeptical conception of autonomy than do liberals. Actions that liberals regard as consensual may actually involve subtle but powerful practices of coercion.

Thus many feminists share a commitment to the right to shape one's life and control one's body, a desire to balance procreative autonomy within a nexus of social practices that foster autonomy and equality, as well as the social supports necessary for the genuine exercise of that autonomy. But also common among feminists is a deep skepticism about reproductive biotechnology and the scientific/corporate establishment devoted to it. It seems fair to say that, at least among feminists who endorse talk of rights, feminists support a right to procreative autonomy; but this support is compatible with denying that there is a right to procreate or reproduce as such, and thus, that there are claim-rights to access fertility treatments or other reproductive aids that biotechnology might devise.

4. The Morality of Procreation

For the most part, secular debates about the morality of procreation have focused on the question of whether procreation might be impermissible, rather than the question of whether it might be obligatory (although see Smilansky 1995). The debates concerning the impermissibility of procreation raise deep issues in metaphysics and value theory, and have been particularly active in recent years (Belshaw 2003, Harman 2004, Holtug 2001, Kavka 1982, Rachels 1998, Roberts 1998). We restrict our discussion to moral issues rather than legal ones, and assume throughout that reproduction is fully voluntary and informed — that is, neither coerced nor accidental.

4.1 Direct and indirect personal interests

We can distinguish three kinds of considerations at stake in decisions about reproduction, two of which — direct and indirect personal interests — have to do with effects on particular people. Direct personal interests are the interests of the child that would be created by the reproductive decision in question. These come into play with particular urgency when the child would experience a life that was so miserable as to be not worth living. Whether or not there are such lives — and if so, which lives merit such a description — is controversial, but it is not unreasonable to suppose that a life can be so irremediably miserable that it is of no benefit to the individual who endures it. Arguably, the lives of those born with Tay-Sachs disease fit this description, and many would argue that it is immoral to knowingly bring such children into the world. However, some authors go much further than this, arguing that procreating is wrong unless the parent can be reasonably assured of being able to provide the child with a decent shot at a normal life. Reasons in support of such a claim must be at least primarily, if not wholly, based on direct personal interests. The general claim, at any rate, is that certain types of individuals have an interest in not being brought into existence on account of the quality of life they would have were they to be created (see McMahon 1998, Roberts 1998); the debate then focuses on which kinds of individuals have such an interest.

Indirect personal interests are the interests of those affected by the creation of the child, other than the child her- or himself. Such interests are widely held to have a bearing on the morality of reproduction, but a general account of their impact on reproductive deliberation would be complex and highly nuanced. Brock (2005) provides a valuable overview (albeit with a policy focus that is easily transferred to a purely ethical context) of limitations based on “the protection of others from harm,” “the protection of public goods,” and the “prevention of social harms.”

4.2 The Non-Identity Problem and Impersonal Considerations

It might be hoped that we could give a full account of permissible reproduction by appealing to only direct and indirect personal interests. Unfortunately, there is reason to think that this may not be possible. Consider the following sort of case, introduced into the literature by Parfit (1984), and known as the non-identity problem (Hanser 1990, Harman 2004, Woodward 1986):

Marie is taking a drug that she knows will cause a birth defect — say, a withered arm — in any child that she conceives (call this child “Amy”). In 3 months this drug will have passed from her body, and she will be able to conceive a child free from this defect (call this child “Sophie”). Intuitively, Marie does something wrong in deciding to have Amy rather than Sophie.

Non-identity cases of this kind are called “same-number” cases because they involve comparing situations that contain the same number of individuals. Other versions of the non-identity problem involve different-number (or non-comparative) choices:

Sally has a genetic condition that she knows will cause any child she conceives to be born with moderate retardation. Despite knowing this fact, Sally deliberately conceives and gives birth to a moderately retarded child, George.

Does Marie do something wrong in conceiving and giving birth to Amy? Does Sally do something wrong conceiving and giving birth to George? Many are inclined to think that they do, but it is unclear how we can capture this wrongness by appeal only to personal interests. This is because wronging someone seems to presuppose that things could have gone otherwise for that individual — seems to require talk of direct personal interests — but things could not have gone otherwise for either Amy or George. Sally's putative wrong consists in creating George, and doing otherwise would have entailed creating no one at all. Sally's action has no victim — it sets back no one's interests. Like George, Amy isn't wronged by being created, for she has a life worth living. Amy isn't made worse off by Marie's actions, for had Marie waited another three months before conceiving she would have given birth to a different child (Sophie) instead of Amy. At first sight, then, it is difficult to see how Marie might have harmed or wronged Amy.

It is also prima facie implausible to suppose that indirect personal interests explain why it would be wrong to bring Amy or George into the world: they are wanted and their births don't expose their community to an unacceptable threat.

Feinberg (1992) compares such situations with cases in which someone is harmed in the course of being saved from an even greater harm (e.g. his leg is broken while his life is being saved). In both cases an evil or harm is justified in virtue of the fact that it is a necessary condition of a greater good — in the one case saving a person's life, in the other case bringing a life into existence. Shiffrin (1999), however, holds that harming someone to save them from a greater harm is morally distinct from harming them to impose a “pure benefit” on them. A pure benefit is a benefit that is just a good and is not also a removal from or prevention of harm. Shiffrin claims, not implausibly, that we have serious qualms about harming someone without their consent in order to secure a pure benefit for them, even when we can be sure that they would regard the pure benefit as far outweighing the harm in question (see also Steinbock and McClamrock 1994). Shiffrin concludes that procreation, even in routine cases, is more morally problematic than is generally recognized.

Shiffrin's attempt to drive a wedge into Feinberg's analogy raises questions of its own. First, one might challenge the assumption that life is a pure benefit. Even if we assume that Amy's life would be worth living, creating her would be a benefit only on a rather peculiar conception of what a “benefit”entails. Amy is not better off than she otherwise would have been, for there is no way that she otherwise would have been. Furthermore, the argument may prove too much. If one is never justified in harming someone (without their consent) in order to impose a pure benefit on them, and if existence always involves some form of harm, then it must always be wrong to bring someone into existence. Although this view has been ably defended (see Benatar 1997), it is deeply counter-intuitive and few would find it an acceptable price to pay for a solution to the non-identity problem.

A number of authors, including Parfit himself, argue that we need to appeal to impersonal considerations of some kind in order to solve the non-identity problem (see also Bayles 1976 and Heyd 1992). What might such impersonal considerations look like, and how might they solve the non-identity problem?

One option involves adopting an optimizing approaching to reproductive ethics: when faced with the choice of creating one of two possible individuals, one should create the individual that has the best chance to live the best life. After all, if we should want what's best for our children, shouldn't we want the best children (Savulescu 2001)? With respect to the cases at hand, this idea seems plausible enough, but such an “optimizing” principle risks having severe unintended consequences when applied more generally. Suppose that Marie would have a normal child right now, but if she waits three months she'll be able to purchase a course of “gene therapy” that will ensure her child perfect pitch and 20-20 vision. Few think that Marie does something wrong in not waiting. Arguably, the moral pressure to optimize in the sense demanded by the optimizing principle is weak to non-existent. Indeed, the debate over genetic manipulation or “designer babies” shows that there is no consensus that it is even permissible, let alone obligatory, to optimize.

More plausible may be a negative version of the impersonal approach, defended by John Harris (1998a) and Dan Brock (1995). Harris asserts “a strong moral obligation to prevent preventable harm and suffering and that this obligation applies equally to curing disease and injury and to preventing the avoidable creation of people who will have disease or injury” (Harris 1998a). Harris's principle seems to prove that reproduction is always immoral, for we are all subject to disease, injury, and limited opportunity. We suspect that Harris would want to reject this conclusion, but it is unclear how he can avoid it.

A closely related approach to the non-identity problem appeals to a principle of good (or responsible or loving) parenting. According to Michael Freeman, “The principle of parental responsibility requires that individuals should desist from having children unless certain minimum conditions can be satisfied. Responsible parents want their children to have good and fulfilling lives” (1997: 180). Freeman goes on to claim that the principle of parental responsibility entails that the very young and very old should not become parents (although he leaves the age cutoffs unspecified). Similarly, Laura Purdy claims that one shouldn't reproduce unless one can ensure that one's children will have a decent life, with clean water, nutritious food, safe shelter, education, and medical care counting as basic prerequisites for such a life (Purdy 1995). Purdy's position seems to imply that many — perhaps even most — of the world's children have been wrongly brought into existence. This may in fact be true, but it would be a surprising result.

Not all of those who have written on the non-identity problem accept that Marie does something wrong in deciding to have Amy rather than Sophie, or that Sally does something wrong in reproducing at all. Indeed, some find the suggestion that it is wrong to (knowingly) bring disabled children into the world abhorrent on account of the effects that such views have on individuals with disabilities. Adrienne Asch (1989) holds that a woman has a right to an abortion, but also thinks that it would be wrong to have an abortion in order to prevent the birth of a disabled child. Abortion on such grounds is immoral, she argues, because it communicates that “disability is so terrible it warrants not being alive.” Although Asch doesn't extend the argument to decisions about whether or not to conceive a certain type of child, the argument can easily be so extended. Does prenatal diagnosis and selective abortion, or for that matter, preimplantation genetic diagnosis, communicate that disability is so terrible it warrants not being alive? On its face this claim is contestable; the associated acts are complex and highly specific to each case — not to mention private — and so they may communicate nothing at all. And even if such acts did communicate something, it is unclear that it would be a thesis about relative qualities of life. Nonetheless, Asch's point may gain plausibility as numbers rise; a eugenics “program” might emerge, as it were by accident, upon a large number of individual choices.

5. Current Controversies

One way to bring rival accounts of parenthood into focus is to examine current controversies in Assisted Reproductive Technologies (ARTs). In this concluding section we briefly examine three such controversies: gamete donation, surrogacy, and cloning.

5.1 Gamete Donation

Reproduction via gamete donation is widely assumed to be unproblematic. This assumption may ground a critique of the geneticist account of parenthood, for a gamete donor can stand in a relation of direct genetic derivation to numerous children without being those children's parent (Macklin 1996). This criticism can be countered by pointing out that in most jurisdictions gamete donors must waive any parental claim they might have over their genetic offspring, a practice that recognizes at least the potential grounding of parenthood in gamete donation. A number of philosophers have, however, argued that gamete donation is in fact morally dubious, precisely because donors take their parental responsibilities too lightly (Nelson 1991, Benatar 1999). If this argument succeeds, it may salvage geneticism, albeit by rejecting widely held intuitions as well as a practice that defenders of geneticism typically endorse (e.g. Harris 1998a). The argument can be challenged in at least two ways that are consistent with (though need not entail) geneticism. First of all, we might challenge the claim that gamete donors typically treat their parental responsibilities too lightly by transferring or alienating them (Bayne 2003, Page 1985). This might be the case if, for instance, gamete donation occurs in a context in which assisted reproduction is regulated and would-be gamete recipients are screened or even licensed. (While such practices may raise further concerns about discrimination against, for instance, nontraditional families, such practices would not constitute treating responsibilities too lightly.) Secondly, one could argue that in the broad nexus of persons who are responsible for the creation of a child through assisted reproduction, the contribution of gamete donors is not especially significant from a moral perspective (Fuscaldo 2006). This reply does not deny that there is normally a link between direct genetic derivation and parenthood, but insists that cases be assessed from a normative or intentional rather than a biological perspective.

5.2 Surrogacy and Contractually Assisted Reproduction

Perhaps the most controversial form of assisted reproduction is so-called “surrogate” motherhood. Surrogacy arrangements can take a number of forms, but the most widely discussed involves two parties, the contracting couple and the “surrogate” or gestational mother. Typically in return for payment, the gestational mother carries a child that is derived from the gametes of one or both members of the contracting couple, and agrees to give the child over to the couple after it is born.

Many of the disputes surrounding surrogacy focus on the question of who should be given parental rights and responsibilities in the event that the arrangement breaks down. (In some cases, neither party to the arrangement wants to keep the baby; in other cases both parties want to keep the baby.) Indeed, much of the impetus for recent accounts of the grounds of parenthood has derived from the attempt to adjudicate such disputes (see section 2).

Discussion of surrogacy has also focused on whether surrogacy contracts should be enforceable. Libertarian liberals insist that a right to procreative autonomy entails a right to pursue parenthood with any and all consenting participants, irrespective of the means by which procreation is pursued. For libertarian liberals, the right to procreate is a special case of the right to make binding contracts. But it is not at all settled whether such contracts ought to be legal and, if so, enforceable. Apart from concerns about commodification (Anderson 1990, Radin 1996, Glover et al. 1989; but see also Arneson 1992), a central point of contention surrounding surrogacy is whether gestational surrogacy is tantamount to merely “early babysitting” — the geneticists' view — or whether, as gestationalists would have it, surrogacy involves selling one's baby. A further concern has to do with whether anyone who undertakes a contractual obligation to surrender custody of one or more future children can do so autonomously. Some writers argue that such decisions cannot be autonomous, and hence that surrogacy contracts should not only be unenforceable but also illegal (Dodds and Jones 1989; see Purdy 1989 and Oakley 1992 for a response).

5.3 Reproductive Cloning

Much of the heat surrounding cloning has to do with highly symbolic and fraught issues such as “playing God,” the “redundancy of men,” and the “commodification of humans”. For our purposes, however, the distinctive implications of cloning involve competing conceptions of parenthood. Different accounts of parenthood yield strikingly different interpretations of the relationship between a person and her clone. Intuitively, one might suppose that a person who clones herself, “Source,” has found an alternative means of reproduction (Robertson 1999). But although it is prima facie plausible, this view does not straightforwardly follow from any account of parenthood.

On a genetic view of parenthood, Source's clone would seem to be not her daughter but her sister—for the clone, like Source, is directly genetically derived from Source's parents (Lewontin 1998; but see Kolers 2003 for discussion). On the other hand, a gestational account of parenthood would say that the clone is the child of whoever gestated it. If Source gestates her own clone, then she would be its mother, even though genetically she is its sister. If someone else gestates the clone, then that person is its mother, and the clone is not the child of either Source or her parents. Thus for the gestationalist, whatever else cloning involves, it is not a new way to become a parent; a woman carries a child and bears it, and through these acts becomes its mother.

On intentionalism and causalism, much depends on the account of intentions or causation that is asserted. If Source agrees to be cloned (or donates her cells for experimentation) but is uninterested in the outcome, then intentionalism would regard neither Source nor her parents as parents of the clone; only the lab where the child was created would be its “parent.” Similarly, depending on the form of causalism, Source may or may not be causally implicated in the right sort of way with the creation of a new generation.

Given the accounts of parenthood on offer, then, it is not at all clear that cloning constitutes a new form of reproduction at all; only geneticists must regard it as such (albeit not for the person who is cloned). Gestationalists, intentionalists, and causalists, on the other hand, may regard cloning as uninteresting from the standpoint of parenthood as such.


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autonomy: personal | feminist (topics): perspectives on reproduction and the family | feminist (topics): perspectives on sexuality | justice: intergenerational | rights: of children