Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Benjamin Peirce

First published Sat Feb 3, 2001; substantive revision Fri Aug 22, 2008

Benjamin Peirce (b. April 4, 1809, d. October 6, 1880) was a professor at Harvard with interests in celestial mechanics, applications of plane and spherical trigonometry to navigation, number theory and algebra. In mechanics, he helped to establish the (effects of the) orbit of Neptune (in relation to Uranus). In number theory, he proved that there is no odd perfect number with fewer than four distinct prime factors. In algebra, he published a comprehensive book on complex associative algebras. Peirce is also of interest to philosophers because of his remarks about the nature and necessity of mathematics.

1. Career

Born in 1809, Peirce became a major figure in mathematics and the physical sciences during a period when the U.S. was still a minor country in these areas (Hogan 1991). A student at Harvard College, he was appointed tutor there in 1829. Two years later he became Professor of Mathematics in the University, a post which was changed in 1842 to cover astronomy also; he held it until his death in 1880. He played a prominent role in the development of the science curriculum of the university, and also acted as College librarian for a time. However, he was not a successful teacher, being impatient with students lacking strong gifts; but he wrote some introductory textbooks in mathematics, and also a more advanced one in mechanics (Peirce 1855). Among his other appointments, the most important one was Director of the U.S. Coast Survey from 1867 to 1874. Peirce also exercised influence through his children. By far the most prominent was Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914), who became a remarkable though maverick polymath, as mathematician, chemist, logician, historian, and many other activities. In addition, James Mills (1834–1906) became in turn professor of mathematics at Harvard, Benjamin Mills (1844–1870) a mining engineer, and Herbert Henry Davis (1849–1916) a diplomat. However, Harvard professor Benjamin Osgood Peirce (1854–1914), mathematician and physicist, was not a relative. Benjamin Peirce did not think of himself as a philosopher in any academic sense, yet his work manifests interests of this kind, in two different ways. The first was related to his teaching.

2. Mathematics, mechanics and God

To a degree unusually explicit in a mathematician of that time Peirce affirmed his Christianity, seeing mathematics as study of God's work by God's creatures. He rarely committed such sentiments to print; but a short passage occurs in the textbook on mechanics previously mentioned, when considering the idea that the occurrence of perpetual motion in nature

would have proved destructive to human belief, in the spiritual origin of force and the necessity of a First Cause superior to matter, and would have subjected the grand plans of Divine benevolence to the will and caprice of man (Peirce 1855, 31).

Peirce was more direct in a course of Lowell Lectures on ‘Ideality in the physical sciences’ delivered at Harvard in 1879, which James Peirce edited for posthumous publication (Peirce 1881b). ‘Ideality’ connoted ‘ideal-ism’ as evident in certain knowledge, ‘pre-eminently the foundation of the mathematics’. His detailed account concentrated almost entirely upon cosmology and cosmogony with some geology (Petersen 1955). He did not argue for his stance beyond some claims for existence by design.

3. Algebras and their philosophy

Peirce was primarily an algebraist in his mathematical style; for example, he was enthusiastic for the cause of quaternions in mechanics after their introduction by W. R. Hamilton in the mid 1840s, and of the various traditions in mechanics he showed some favour for the ‘analytical’ approach, where this adjective refers to the links to algebra. His best remembered publication was a treatment of ‘linear associative algebras’, that is, all algebras in which the associative law x(yz)=(xy)z was upheld. ‘Linear’ did not carry the connotation of matrix theory, which was still being born in others' hands, but referred to the form of linear combination, such as:

q = a + bi + cj + dk

in the case of a quaternion q. Peirce wrote an extensive survey (Peirce 1870), determining the numbers of all algebras with from two to six elements obeying also various other laws (Walsh 2000, ch. 2). To two of those he gave names which have become durable: ‘idempotent’, the law xm = x (for m≥2) which George Boole had introduced in this form in his algebra of logic in 1847; and ‘nilpotent’, when xm = 0, for some m. The history of the publication of this work is very unusual (Grattan-Guinness 1997). Peirce had presented some of his results from 1867 onwards to the National Academy of Sciences, of which he had been appointed a founder member four years earlier; but they could not afford to print it. Thus, in an initiative taken by Coast Survey staff, a lady without mathematical training but possessing a fine hand was found who could both read his ghastly script and write out the entire text 12 pages at a time on lithograph stones. 100 copies were printed (Peirce 1870), and distributed world-wide to major mathematicians and professional colleagues. Eleven years later Charles, then at Johns Hopkins University, had the lithograph reprinted posthumously, with some additional notes of his own, as a long paper in American journal of mathematics, which J.J. Sylvester had recently launched (Peirce 1881a); it also came out in book form in the next year. This study helped mathematicians to recognise an aspect of the wide variety of algebras which could be examined; it also played a role in the development of model theory in the U.S. in the early 1900s. Enough work on it had been done by then for a book-length study to be written (Shaw 1907).

4. The philosophy of necessity

Peirce seems to have upheld his theological stance for all mathematics, and a little sign is evident in the dedication at its head:

To my friends This work has been the pleasantest mathematical effort of my life. In no other have I seemed to myself to have received so full a reward for my mental labor in the novelty and breadth of the results. I presume that to the uninitiated the formulae will appear cold and cheerless. But let it be remembered that, like other mathematical formulae, they find their origin in the divine source of all geometry. Whether I shall have the satisfaction of taking part in their exposition, or whether that will remain for some more profound expositer, will be seen in the future (Peirce 1870, 1).

Peirce began with a philosophical statement of a different kind about mathematics which has become his best remembered single statement “Mathematics is the science that draws necessary conclusions” (Peirce 1870, p. 1). What does ‘necessary’ denote? Perhaps he was following a tradition in algebra, upheld especially by Britons such as George Peacock and Augustus De Morgan (a recipient of the lithograph), of distinguishing the ‘form’ of an algebra from its ‘matter’ (that is, an interpretation or application to a given mathematical and/or physical situation) and claiming that its form alone would deliver the consequences from the premises. In his first draft of his text he wrote the rather more comprehensible “Mathematics is the science that draws inferences”, and in the second draft “Mathematics is the science that draws consequences”, though the last word was altered to yield the enigmatic form involving ‘necessary’ used in the book. The change is not just verbal; he must have realised that the earlier forms were not sufficient (they are satisfied by other sciences, for example), and so added the crucial adjective. Certainly no whiff of modal logic was in his air. His statement appears in the mathematical literature fairly often, but usually without explanation. One feature is clear, but often is not stressed. In all versions Peirce always used the active verb ‘draws’: mathematics was concerned with the act of drawing conclusions, not with the theory of so acting, which belonged in disciplines such as logic. He continued:

Mathematics, as here defined, belongs to every enquiry; moral as well as physical. Even the rules of logic, by which it is rigidly bound could not be deduced without its aid (Peirce 1870, 3).

In a lecture of the late 1870s he described his definition as

wider than the ordinary definitions. It is subjective; they are objective. This will include knowledge in all lines of research. Under this definition mathematics applies to every mode of enquiry (Peirce 1880, 377).

Thus Peirce maintained the position asserted by Boole that mathematics could be used to analyse logic, not the vice versa relationship between the two disciplines that Gottlob Frege was about to put forward for arithmetic, and which Bertrand Russell was optimistically to claim for all mathematics during the 1900s. Curiously, the third draft of the lithograph contains this contrary stance in “Mathematics, as here defined, belongs to every enquiry; it is even a portion of deductive logic, to the laws of which it is rigidly subject”; but by completion he had changed his mind. Peirce's son Charles claimed to have influenced his father in forming his definitive position, and fiercely upheld it himself; thereby he helped to forge a wide division between the algebraic logic which he was developing from the early 1870s with his father, Boole and de Morgan as chief formative influences, and the logicism (as it became called later) of Frege and Russell and also the ‘mathematical logic’ of Giuseppe Peano and his school in Turin (Grattan-Guinness 1988).


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Peirce, Charles Sanders