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Philip the Chancellor

First published Sat Mar 20, 1999; substantive revision Fri Jan 12, 2007

Philip the Chancellor was an influential figure in a number of different circles in the first half of the thirteenth century. He enjoyed a long though rather turbulent ecclesiastical career and was famous for his sermons and his lyric poetry, the latter of which has received attention by a number of musicologists in recent years. In the areas of philosophy and theology, his major work, Summa de bono, which was composed sometime in the 1220s-1230s, was a ground-breaking achievement in many ways. Philip was one of the first to organize a Summa around a central foundational principle, the notion of the good. Summa de bono also contains most likely the earliest treatment of a topic that rose to prominence in the later medieval period, the doctrine of the transcendentals. Elements of Philip's theory of action drew comments from such later notables as Albert the Great. Summa de bono was a well-respected and influential work in the thirteenth century.

1. Philip's Life

Philip was born in Paris probably in the 1160s, the exact date unknown. He was a member of a prominent Parisian family; many of his relatives held important positions, in service to the French kings or to the church. Several were bishops of prominent sees, in particular, his uncle, Peter of Nemours, who was bishop of Paris from 1208 to 1218 and who helped to foster Philip's career. Most likely, Philip received his education at the nascent University of Paris, where he also taught. Sometime in the early 1200s, he was appointed the archdeacon of Noyon, a position he held even after becoming chancellor of the Cathedral of Notre Dame in Paris in 1217. Philip died in 1236, most likely on December 26.

2. Philip's Career as Chancellor

The position of chancellor at the cathedral of Notre Dame in Paris was one of some importance, although it was the lowest ranking office in the administrative hierarchy of the chapter. Minor duties included keeping the official seal of the chapter, executing the official decrees of the administrative body, maintaining the non-musical books of the library, and serving in the liturgy of the daily office. His most significant responsibility was in the area of education. The chancellor was originally the head of the cathedral school. As masters began to flock to Paris in the late twelfth and early thirteenth centuries, especially to the Ile-de-la-Cite, where Notre Dame is located, the chancellor's supervision was extended to include these masters as well. His power lay in his authority to grant the teaching license, which was required in order to hold classes in one of the schools springing up on the Ile-de-la-Cite. It was the chancellor's duty to evaluate candidates applying for this license. Moreover, the chancellor had the right to revoke the license should a master prove unworthy or incompetent, as well as the responsibility for maintaining order and discipline among the scholars within his jurisdiction.

By the time Philip became chancellor in 1217, the masters of the various schools in Paris had begun to seek autonomy from the cathedral chapter and had won a number of important concessions by papal decree. In 1215, the papal legate, Robert of Courçon, drew up a number of formal statutes, codifying the de facto practices regarding matters such as the examinations for teaching licenses, accepted dress and behavior, curriculum, and discipline of students. As a result, by the time that Philip became chancellor, at least on paper, it appeared as if the power of his office had been greatly reduced, even with respect to granting the teaching license. For although the chancellor retained the power to grant these licenses, the statutes dictated that he could not turn down anyone the masters deemed fit to teach. But in reality, a long struggle ensued between the masters and the chancellor, who sought to retain his power, beginning with Philip's predecessor (Stephen of Reims) and continuing into much of Philip's own tenure. Finally, in the late 1220s and early 1230s, Philip made his peace with the masters, who had gone on strike and left Paris along with many of their students in response to a conflict with the secular authorities. No doubt recognizing that their departure imperiled the continuing prestige of Paris as a center of education, as well as his own position, Philip worked hard to convince the scholars to return to Paris and reconvene their classes. His efforts were successful, and the masters returned in 1231.

3. Philip's Philosophical Significance

In his major philosophical work, Summa de bono, Philip uses the notion of the good as an organizing principle for his study. He divides the text roughly into four sections. Philip discusses first the nature of good in general terms, and then the highest good and its relationship to created goods. After this rather short introduction to the notion of the good, Philip goes on to examine in some depth the various sorts of created goods. He divides his discussion of created goods into three parts. First, he looks at the good retained by creatures by virtue of their natures (bonum naturae). In turn, these goods fall into two categories: those goods that cannot be diminished by evil and those goods that can be lost through evil. In his discussion of the former, Philip focuses first on the angels and their properties, and then on human beings and their properties. Those goods that can be affected by evil are discussed in conjunction with Adam's fall from grace in the Garden and its consequences. Following the discussion of bonum naturae, Philip considers what he calls bonum in genere. Although this sort of good has a rather peculiar title, the bonum in genere represents goods that come about as a result of an agent's actions. These goods have this title because what determines whether a given act is good depends not only on the sort of act it is (its "form" so to speak) but also what the act has to do with (its "matter" so to speak), thus suggesting that these sorts of goods can be classified along the lines of genera and species. Moreover, these sorts of generic goods contrast with the meritorious goods brought about as the result of God's grace. After discussing the bonum in genere, Philip goes on to look at the good that is associated with grace. Here, he divides his treatment into the graces that pertain to angels (as well as their ministries) and the graces that pertain to human beings. Philip includes the virtues in his discussion of human graces. Although he denies that the virtues are a type of grace, he includes them in this section because virtues come about as a result of grace working within human beings. This idea is most naturally associated with the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity, and indeed, Philip discusses these virtues here at some length. But he also includes in this section a lengthy discussion of the cardinal virtues: prudence, fortitude, temperance (and the associated virtues of modesty, sobriety, continence, and virginity), and justice, virtues which one might argue have no direct connection with grace. Philip admits that strictly speaking cardinal virtues are not divine virtues since they have to do with what is for the sake of the end and not directly with the end itself (the end of course being God). But he argues that justice has to do both with God and with human governance; perhaps because of this connection, Philip felt justified in including them in a broader discussion of grace. Philip ends his work with another source of grace, the seven gifts of the Holy Spirit. Philip's discussion of the good of grace in human beings occupies over half of Summa de bono with his unit on the virtues accounting for a large portion of this section.

Philip's Summa de bono represents a significant innovation in medieval philosophical work. His use of the good as an organizing principle is a departure from the explicitly theological structure of other well-known texts of the time including Peter Lombard's Sentences and William of Auxerre's Summa aurea. Philip is certainly concerned with theological issues, but unlike the Sentences or the Summa aurea, Philip devotes no significant sections of his work to topics such as God's nature, the Incarnation, or the sacraments. Furthermore, whereas often William's or Lombard's examination of a philosophical issue arises in the context of a larger theological issue, this is not always the case for Philip. For example, in William's Summa aurea, the issues of human action and its freedom arise within a discussion of Adam's fall in the Garden. William raises these issues here because he recognizes that holding Adam responsible for his sin requires that Adam acted freely. Philip places his treatment of free action within an examination of human psychology. It is not until after Philip discusses the character and the powers of the human soul that he gets around to examining theological issues such as the origin and the immortality of the soul. Philip is one of the first major thinkers in the Latin West whose work reflects the influence of the recent influx of newly translated texts from Aristotle and his Arabic commentators, particularly in the area of metaphysics. This may help to explain the distinctive character of his work. Philip's use of Aristotelian metaphysics is especially interesting given that many of Aristotle's metaphysical treatises and work in natural philosophy were officially banned at Paris during the time that Philip was working on Summa de bono.

4. Philip's Innovative Theory of the Transcendentals

Philip's influence in the thirteenth century was especially felt in the area of the transcendentals and in action theory. In this section, I will consider his theory of the transcendentals. I will examine his theory of action in the following section. To some extent, the doctrine of the transcendentals has its roots in the Christian-Platonic discussions of the relationship between created and divine being and goodness, in particular, in William of Auxerre's treatment of goodness prefatory to his examination of the virtues in Summa aurea. However, its more immediate ancestor is Aristotle's doctrine of the categories. Certain properties fall into none of Aristotle's categories; rather they are properties of all of the things to which the categories are applicable. For this reason, these properties are said to "transcend" the categories. Although there is some variation in what is counted as a transcendental, the list generally included being, unity, truth, and goodness. Thus, everything that falls into any of Aristotle's categories is a being, has a certain sort of unity, and is true and good to a certain extent.

Not only do these properties transcend the categories and as a result, apply to everything classified by the categories, but they are held to be convertible with each other as well. This could mean one of two things. The transcendentals could be coextensional, so that whatever has being also has unity, truth, and goodness. This leaves open the possibility that the transcendentals are separate and distinct from one another. The second option of the convertibility thesis involves a stronger claim, namely, the idea that the transcendentals differ from one another only in concept, not in reality. Unity, truth, and goodness add nothing to a particular being over and above what is already there; everything that is a being is also one, true, and good in virtue of the very same characteristics. But to describe something as a being and to describe it as, say, good is to express two different things about it since the concept of a being and the concept of a good are two very different concepts. Thus, while being and goodness are extensionally equivalent, they are intensionally distinct.

Philip adopts the second notion of convertibility. The various transcendentals do not differ in reality, only in concept. The concept of being is fundamental in that the concepts of the other transcendentals presuppose it. However, the concepts of all of the other transcendentals add a certain basic notion to the notion of being in order to differentiate them from being. This basic notion is the notion of being that is undivided. Because this is a purely negative notion, it picks out no additional property in reality. The addition of indivision alone yields the concept of unity. To derive the concepts of the true and the good, one adds further the notion of the appropriate cause. The concept of truth involves the idea of the formal cause, that is, the cause in virtue of which matter is enformed, and a thing becomes what it is. Things are true, that is, genuine instances of the kind of thing they are to the extent that they instantiate the form of things of that kind. Thus, the concept of truth is the concept of being that is undivided from a formal cause. Goodness, on the other hand, has to do with being that is undivided from a final cause, that is, a cause that has to do with goals or ends, especially those goals that have been brought to fulfillment. Everything has a particular nature, that is, properties that make that thing a thing of that type. But things can exemplify those properties to a greater or lesser extent. Philip claims that everything has as its goal its own perfection, which means that things move toward exemplifying their specifying characteristics to the greatest extent possible. To the extent that a thing does so, that thing will be good. But that thing will also have being to the same extent. Thus, goodness and being in a given thing coincide in reality, and a thing's goodness adds nothing over and above the thing's being. But of course, goodness and being involve two different concepts. Thus, being and goodness have the same extension while differing intensionally.

It has been argued (by Pouillion and others) that Philip's discussion of the transcendentals in Summa de bono represents the earliest formal treatise on the transcendentals in the history of Western philosophy. About ten years earlier, William of Auxerre also discussed the relationship between being and goodness; he raises the issue of whether being and being good are the same. But in resolving this issue, William never considers the central issue of the transcendentals, the idea that they are extensionally equivalent while intensionally different. It appears that Philip is the first to do so. MacDonald argues that Philip's greater familiarity with the metaphysical works of Aristotle and the Arabic commentators accounts for the startling innovations of his work on the transcendentals. It is likely that Philip encountered the fundamental notion of extensional equivalence and intensional difference in the work of the Arabic commentators of Aristotle; both Avicenna and Averroes argue that unity and being have the same extension while differing conceptually. Philip extends this idea to include not only being and unity, but also the true and the good. Philip's work in turn sets the stage for the development of this topic throughout the thirteenth century, influencing the work of such notable thinkers as Alexander of Hales, Albert the Great, and Thomas Aquinas.

5. Philip's Psychology

Although not as well known, Philip's psychology also exhibits some innovative features and influenced later thinkers, in particular, Albert the Great. In the early thirteenth century, theorists accounted for human abilities by arguing that in order to do what they do, agents must possess certain capacities or powers. Thus for every ability, there must be a corresponding and separate power. Human beings have the ability to think; therefore, they must have a cognitive power, often called intellect or reason. Medieval philosophers also adopted Aristotle's distinction between practical intellect, which discerns what to do, and speculative intellect, which discerns the truth about the way things are. Human beings have the capacity for desire; therefore, they must have appetitive powers. Medieval philosophers distinguish between two kinds of appetite; a rational appetite, called the will, that is responsive to the dictates of the intellect, and an appetite that is responsive to sensory apprehension, called the sensory appetite. Since activities such as thinking and desiring are different sorts of activities, most theorists thought of their corresponding powers, the (practical) intellect and the will, as separate. However, on Philip's account, the practical intellect and the will are not separate powers. He argues that with respect to the capacity for performing actions, there is only one power with two separate acts. Philip gives a number of arguments for this position. One of them is particularly interesting because Philip uses the doctrine of the transcendentals to establish his conclusion that the practical intellect and will are one and the same power. Philip first notes that the intellect and the will have different ends. The intellect, even as practical intellect, has truth as its goal or end since its job, so to speak, is to ascertain the way things are, to make judgments about the state of reality, including what alternatives for action are available for the agent. The will, on the other hand, is an appetite for the good; it inclines the agent toward what she judges to be good. Thus, its end is the good. But according to the doctrine of the transcendentals, the true and the good differ only intensionally, not extensionally. Philip thinks that if the ends of the powers do not differ extensionally, then the powers themselves do not differ extensionally as well. Thus, with respect to action, there is only one power with two different acts, acts of conceiving and judging on the one hand, and acts of desiring (the good) and willing on the other. Talking about the will is merely shorthand for referring to acts of willing or desiring. Talking about the intellect is merely shorthand for referring to certain cognitive judgments about what to do or how to act.

Although Philip denies that the practical intellect and the will are separate powers, he argues for a distinction among the various apprehensive powers. Thus, he sees a genuine distinction between the speculative intellect, the practical intellect, imagination, and the sensory apprehensive powers. This is because what is apprehended by each of these powers is different in nature. Philip denies that any such distinction is present among motive powers. Insofar as the appetite is moved by a sensory apprehension, we call it the sensory appetite. Insofar as the appetite is moved by the judgment of intellect, we call it the will. However, in reality, there is only one motive power to account for both of these sorts of desires, according to Philip. Philip's position on the inseparability of practical intellect and will does not appear to have convinced his thirteenth-century contemporaries or near-contemporaries. Albert the Great in Summa de homine (circa 1245) addresses the arguments given by Philip for his position although as was the custom of the time with respect to one's contemporaries or near-contemporaries, he does not refer to Philip by name. Albert rejects Philip's position, but the fact that Albert examines the issue at all indicates something about the esteem given to Philip's work.

An important part of thirteenth-century psychology was the development of a theory of free action. This was especially important both for theology and for ethics. Medieval thinkers, beginning with Augustine, recognized that moral responsibility requires freedom and so the possibility of that freedom needed to be explained. Along those same lines, they argued that unless human beings are able to act freely, God is not justified in punishing sins. Furthermore, human freedom plays a major role in theodicy; for example, Augustine argues that God is not responsible for the evil found in the world because that evil is perpetrated by the free choices of human beings. Thus, given this background and these commitments, it was common for medieval philosophers to examine the topic of freedom somewhere in their writings. In the first half of the thirteenth century, it was customary to examine these issues in the context of a treatise on what became known as liberum arbitrium. In medieval theories of action in the early part of the thirteenth century, "liberum arbitrium" is a technical term. It is a placeholder for whatever it is that enables human beings to act freely. The term originates in the work of Augustine who wrote a treatise entitled De libero arbitrio. The starting point for thirteenth-century treatises on liberum arbitrium was a definition taken from Peter Lombard's Sentences: "liberum arbitrium is a faculty of reason and will, by which good is chosen with the assistance of grace, or evil, when grace is not there to assist. And it is called "liberum" with respect to the will, which can be turned toward either [good or bad], while [it is called] "arbitrium" with respect to reason, as it has to do with that power or faculty to which the discerning between good and evil belongs." Although Lombard's main discussion of liberum arbitrium is found in book two, distinction twenty-five of his Sententiae in IV libris distinctae, this definition is found in the twenty-fourth distinction of book two, chapter three. This definition was commonly but mistakenly attributed to Augustine by commentators in the thirteenth century. Lombard himself does not reveal his source. References to Augustine dominate his discussion of liberum arbitrium, which might account for the association of the definition with Augustine.

Philosophers in the early thirteenth century faced the task of how to understand this definition. Although it is obvious from Lombard's formulation that both intellect and will have something to do with liberum arbitrium, their exact relationship is unclear. The phrase "liberum arbitrium" itself contributes to the uncertainty. The first part of the phrase, "liberum," is uncontroversial; it simply means "free." Difficulties arise with respect to the notion of "arbitrium." This notion has both cognitive and appetitive connotations, for it can have meanings as diverse as "judgment," "decision," "wish," or "inclination." It can also refer to a power or ability to make judgments or decisions or to the very agent who makes these judgments or decisions. Thus, the term covers a lot of territory, territory that has to do with both cognitive and appetitive capabilities. Accordingly, it is natural to connect liberum arbitrium with both intellect and will. In writing treatises on liberum arbitrium, thirteenth-century philosophers sought to sort out the connections between intellect and will on the one hand and the production and freedom of human action on the other. Some of these philosophers argued that free action results from the interaction of intellect and will, while others argued that although the intellect is an important precondition for an action's being free, the will is the true instrument that brings about a free action. Still others argued that liberum arbitrium is a separate faculty altogether although it is closely linked with and interacts with the intellect and will in the production of a free action. The practice of writing treatises on liberum arbitrium began to die off toward the later decades of the thirteenth century when philosophers started examining the topic of voluntas libera (free will) instead.

In his treatise on liberum arbitrium in Summa de bono, Philip adopts John Damascene's basic description of action. According to Damascene, an eighth-century patristic, a number of different stages come together in the production of an action. These stages include desiring, considering the various courses of action that will satisfy one's desires, deliberating over those courses of action, judging which one is to be performed, willing and choosing a particular alternative, and initiating the action. Since each of these activities are activities of the will or of the intellect, it follows that actions result from the activities of the will and the intellect. Damascene also claims that each of these stages are performed freely. Because each stage is performed freely, the resulting action is also free.

Philip modifies this position. He thinks that only the final activity of the intellect is performed freely, that is, the final judgment about what course of action to take. This is because Philip thinks that with respect to the previous activities of the intellect, activities such as identifying possible courses of action and deliberating over them, the intellect suffers from certain constraints. These constraints have to do with the structure of the world around us which in turn structures our beliefs. Beliefs play a role in our deliberations over what to do; thus the constraints placed upon beliefs in turn constrain the intellect in its activities. But according to Philip, the intellect retains some freedom for the final judgment about what to do is made freely. Thus, the intellect need not judge that a particular course of action be performed; it could have judged differently. In Philip's view, the will does not suffer from such constraints. The will is an appetite for the good so that whatever it wills, it wills a good. But a thing's being a good is merely a necessary condition, not a sufficient one. A thing's being good does not compel the will's act. Moreover, no judgment of the intellect constrains the will's choice; the will is free either to will the alternative put forth by the intellect or to reject it and will something else. It is because of this capacity of the will that Philip sees the will as the primary source of freedom in a human being. For in the final analysis, it is the will rather than the judgment of the intellect that determines the action the agent performs. Because the will wills freely, the agent performs the action freely. Thus, while both intellect and will have important roles to play in the production of a free action, freedom is primarily a function of the will. Philip's theory of action helps to set the stage for the prominent voluntarist movement that rose later in the thirteenth century with thinkers such as Peter John Olivi and John Duns Scotus.

6. Philip's Discussion of Time and Eternity

Philip does not interpret his organizing principle of the good in an unduly narrow or restrictive manner. Among the goods of nature he considers not to be diminishable by evil are time and eternity. After a discussion of whether good and evil are contraries and whether evil can be a principle or a genus, Philip launches into a discussion of whether the world is eternal and follows that by a comparison of time and eternity. The topic of eternity is one of some importance and was much discussed in the Middle Ages. Medieval philosophers in the Christian tradition to which Philip belonged believed that the world was created ex nihilo by God with a beginning and at some point in time will end. It soon became apparent that the newly rediscovered Aristotle did not share this commitment as he famously argues that the world is eternal. Thus, this was an issue that medieval philosophers needed to address.

Philip attempts to reconcile Aristotle's position with his own commitments first by distinguishing the domain of philosophy from the domain of theology, an approach that will appeal to later thinkers as well. Not surprisingly, Philip argues that Aristotle should be taken as a philosopher and not as a theologian. But Philip also tries to reinterpret Aristotle's position so that it will be compatible with his Christian commitments. He argues that strictly speaking, Aristotle's argument establishes only that the world is perpetual, not that it is eternal. Philip defines the perpetual as that which is measured in the whole of time and mobility. Eternity, on the other hand, is such that it has no beginning and will have no end. Thus, Philip's concept of the perpetual is compatible with the view that what is perpetual has a beginning and an end. The world could have existed for all of time, but since Philip thinks that time has a beginning and will at some point have an end, such an understanding of the world is compatible with the Christian doctrine of creation. Philip also defends his position by arguing that Aristotle's task is to show that time, motion, and what is movable are all co-equal and that it is not appropriate to the discipline of philosophy to demonstrate anything beyond this claim. Finally, Philip draws upon Averroes (referring to him as the Commentator) to support his claim. He argues that according to Averroes' commentary on the eleventh book of Aristotle's Metaphysics, Aristotle is describing the origin of motion from the first mover. Thus, Aristotle is not discussing the origin of the world as such, but rather what takes place once the world exists.

In his comparison between time and eternity, Philip argues that both have duration and as a result are contained in the same genus. But time differs significantly from eternity in a number of important respects. First, time has a beginning and an end while eternity does not. Secondly, time by nature has succession and thus, motion, while eternity does not; it is entirely immobile and immutable. In fact, Philip argues that eternity and the divine essence are the same in reality although conceptually distinct. Time of course for Philip is something created and so cannot be identified with God's essence, which is wholly uncreated. Finally although both time and eternity involve the idea of "now," they do so in different respects. The "now" involves the past and the future, while the "now" of time is defined by or comes about in virtue of the past and the future.

Philip also considers the relationship between time and eternity. He is concerned with Plato's position, which he quotes, that "time is a part of eternity." This is a claim that Philip wishes to deny. Although time and eternity are found in the same genus, they differ in character, as I noted above. Philip appeals to Boethius's definition of eternity from The Consolation of Philosophy: "Eternity is the possession of unending life, wholly present and perfected." Philip argues that the notion of "wholly present" removes the idea of succession from the concept of eternity while the notion of "wholly perfected" removes the idea of division into parts from the concept of eternity. Succession and division into parts are of course part of the notion of time. Thus, it is incompatible with the nature of eternity that time be a part of it. Rather, Philip views them as two separate durations, each differing in character. No doubt Philip's positions on time and eternity and his interpretation of Aristotle raise a number of pressing questions and objections, but as Dales notes, his distinctions greatly influenced thinkers later in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries.


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free choice: medieval theories of[= liberum arbitrium] | free will | transcendentals