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Plato's Myths

First published Thu Jul 23, 2009

What the ancient Greeks—at least in the archaic phase of their civilisation—called muthos was quite different from what we and the media nowadays call “myth”. For them a muthos was a true story, a story that unveils the true origin of the world and human beings. For us a myth is something to be “debunked”: a widespread, popular belief that is in fact false. In archaic Greece the memorable was transmitted orally through poetry, which often relied on myth. However, starting with the beginning of the seventh century BC two types of discourse emerged that were set in opposition to poetry: history (as shaped by, most notably, Thucydides) and philosophy (as shaped by the peri phuseōs tradition of the sixth and fifth centuries BC). These two types of discourse were naturalistic alternatives to the poetic accounts of things. Plato broke to some extent from the philosophical tradition of the sixth and fifth centuries in that he uses both traditional myths and myths he invents and gives them some role to play in his philosophical endeavor. He thus seems to attempt to overcome the traditional opposition between muthos and logos.

There are many myths in Plato's dialogues: traditional myths, which he sometimes modifies, as well as myths that he invents, although many of these contain mythical elements from various traditions. Plato is both a myth teller and a myth maker. In general, he uses myth to inculcate in his less philosophical readers noble beliefs and/or teach them various philosophical matters that may be too difficult for them to follow if expounded in a blunt, philosophical discourse. More and more scholars have argued in recent years that in Plato myth and philosophy are tightly bound together, in spite of his occasional claim that they are opposed modes of discourse.

1. Plato's reading audience

For whom did Plato write? Who was his readership? A very good survey of this topic is Yunis 2007 from which I would like to quote the following illuminating passage: “before Plato, philosophers treated arcane subjects in technical treatises that had no appeal outside small circles of experts. These writings, ‘on nature’, ‘on truth’, ‘on being’ and so on, mostly in prose, some in verse, were demonstrative, not protreptic. Plato, on the other hand, broke away from the experts and sought to treat ethical problems of universal relevance and to make philosophy accessible to the public” (13). Other scholars, such as Morgan (2003), have also argued that Plato addressed in his writings both philosophical and non-philosophical audiences.

It is true that in the Republic Plato has the following advice for philosophers: “like someone who takes refuge under a little wall from a storm of dust or hail driven by the wind, the philosopher—seeing others filled with lawlessness—is satisfied if he can somehow lead his present life free from injustice and impious acts and depart from it with good hope, blameless and content” (496d–e). He was certainly very bitter about Socrates' fate. In his controversial interpretation Strauss (1964) argues that in Plato's view the philosopher should stay disconnected from society. This interpretation is too extreme. Plato did not abandon Socrates' credo, that the philosopher has a duty towards his fellow-citizens who do not devote their lives to philosophy. For him philosophy has a civic dimension. The one who makes it outside the cave should not forget about those who are still down there and believe that the shadows they see there are real beings. The philosopher should try to transmit his knowledge and his wisdom to the others, and he knows that he has a difficult mission. But Plato was not willing to go as far as Socrates did. He preferred to address the public at large through his written dialogues rather than conducting dialogues in the agora. He did not write abstruse philosophical treatises but engaging philosophical dialogues meant to appeal to a less philosophically inclined audience. The dialogues are, most of the time, prefaced by a sort of mise en scène in which the reader learns who the participants to the dialogue are, when, where and how they presently met, and what made them start their dialogue. The participants are historical and fictional characters. Whether historical or fictional, they meet in historical or plausible settings, and the prefatory mises en scène contain only some incidental anachronisms. Plato wanted his dialogues to look like genuine, spontaneous dialogues accurately preserved. How much of these stories and dialogues is fictional? It is hard to tell, but he surely invented a great deal of them. References to traditional myths and mythical characters occur throughout the dialogues. However, starting with the Protagoras and Gorgias, which are usually regarded as the last of his early writings, Plato begins to season his dialogues with self-contained, fantastical narratives that we usually label his ‘myths’. His myths are meant, among other things, to make philosophy more accessible.

2. Plato's myths

There are in Plato identifiable traditional myths, such as the story of Gyges (Republic 359d–360b), the myth of Phaethon (Timaeus 22c7) or that of the Amazons (Laws 804e4). Sometimes he modifies them, to a greater or lesser extent, while other times he combines them—this is the case, for instance, of the Noble Lie (Republic 414b–415d), which is a combination of the Cadmeian myth of autochtony and the Hesiodic myth of ages. There are also in Plato myths that are his own, such as the myth of Er (Republic 621b8) or the myth of Atlantis (Timaeus 26e4). Many of the myths Plato invented feature characters and motifs taken from traditional mythology (such as the Isles of the Blessed or the judgment after death), and sometimes it is difficult to distinguish his own mythological motifs from the traditional ones. The majority of the myths he invents preface or follow a philosophical argument: the Gorgias myth (523a–527a), the myth of the androgyne (Symposium 189d–193d), the Phaedo myth (107c–115a), the myth of Er (Republic 614a–621d), the myth of the winged soul (Phaedrus 246a–249d), the myth of Theuth (Phaedrus 274c–275e), the cosmological myth of the Statesman (268–274e), the Atlantis myth (Timaeus 21e–26d, Critias), the Laws myth (903b–905b).

Plato refers sometimes to the myths he uses, whether traditional or his own, as muthoi (for an overview of all the loci where the word muthos occurs in Plato see Brisson 1998 (141ff.)). However, muthos is not an exclusive label. For instance: the myth of Theuth in the Phaedrus (274c1) is called an akoē (a “thing heard”, “report”, “story”); the myth of Cronus is called a phēmē (“oracle”, “tradition”, “rumour”) in the Laws (713c2) and a muthos in the Statesman (272d5, 274e1, 275b1); and the myth of Boreas at the beginning of the Phaedrus is called both muthologēma (229c5) and logos (d2).

The myths Plato invents, as well as the traditional myths he uses, are narratives that are non-falsifiable, for they depict particular beings, deeds, places or events that are beyond our experience: the gods, the daemons, the heroes, the life of soul after death, the distant past, etc. Myths are also fantastical, but they are not inherently irrational and they are not targeted at the irrational parts of the soul.

The Cave, the narrative that occurs in the Republic (514a–517a), is a fantastical story, but it does not deal explicitly with the beyond (the distant past, life after death etc.), and is thus different from the traditional myths Plato uses and the myths he invents. Strictly speaking, the Cave is an analogy, not a myth. Also in the Republic, Socrates says that until philosophers take control of a city “the politeia whose story we are telling in words (muthologein) will not achieve its fulfillment in practice” (501e2–5; translated by Rowe (1999, 268)). The construction of the ideal city may be called a “myth” in the sense that it depicts an imaginary polis (cf. 420c2: “We imagine the happy state”). In the Phaedrus (237a9, 241e8) the word muthos is used to name “the rhetorical exercise which Socrates carries out” (Brisson 1998, 144), but this seems to be a loose usage of the word.

3. Myth as a means of persuasion

For Plato we should live according to what reason is able to deduce from what we regard as reliable evidence. This is what real philosophers, like Socrates, do. But the non-philosophers are reluctant to ground their lives on logic and arguments. They have to be persuaded. One means of persuasion is myth. Myth inculcates beliefs. It is efficient in making the less philosophically inclined, as well as children (cf. Republic 377a ff.), believe noble things.

In the Republic the Noble Lie is supposed to make the citizens of Callipolis care more for their city. Schofield (2009) argues that the guards, having to do philosophy from their youth, may eventually find philosophizing “more attractive than doing their patriotic duty” (115). Philosophy, claims Schofield, provides the guards with knowledge, not with love and devotion for their city. The Noble Lie is supposed to engender in them devotion for their city and instill in them the belief that they should “invest their best energies into promoting what they judge to be the city's best interests” (113). The preambles to a number of laws in the Laws that are meant to be taken as exhortations to the laws in question and that contain elements of traditional mythology (see 790c3, 812a2, 841c6) may also be taken as “noble lies”.

Plato's eschatological myths are not complete lies. There is some truth in them. In the Phaedo the statement “The soul is immortal” is presented as following logically from various premises Socrates and his interlocutors consider acceptable (cf. 106b–107a). After the final argument for immortality (102a–107b), Cebes admits that he has no further objections to, nor doubts about, Socrates' arguments. But Simmias confesses that he still retains some doubt (107a–b), and then Socrates tells them an eschatological myth. The myth does not provide evidence that the soul is immortal. It assumes that the soul is immortal and so it may be said that it is not entirely false. The myth also claims that there is justice in the afterlife and Socrates hopes that the myth will convince one to believe that the soul is immortal and that there is justice in the afterlife. “I think”, says Socrates, that “it is fitting for a man to risk the belief—for the risk is a noble one—that this, or something like this, is true about our souls and their dwelling places” (114d–e). Socrates says the same thing at the end of the myth of Er, the eschatological myth that ends the Republic: the myth “would save us, if we were persuaded by it” (621b). Myth represents a sort of back-up: if one fails to be persuaded by arguments to change one's life, one may still be persuaded by a good myth. Myth, as it is claimed in the Laws, may be needed to “charm” one “into agreement” (903b) when philosophy fails to do so.

4. Myth as a teaching tool

The philosopher should share his philosophy with others. But since others may sometimes not follow his arguments, Plato is ready to provide whatever it takes—an image, a simile, or a myth—that will help them grasp what the argument failed to tell them. The myth—just like an image, or analogy—may be a good teaching tool. Myth can embody in its narrative an abstract philosophical doctrine. In the Phaedo, Plato develops the so-called theory of recollection (72e–78b). The theory is there expounded in rather abstract terms. The eschatological myth of the Phaedo depicts the fate of souls in the other world, but it does not “dramatize” the theory of recollection. The Phaedrus myth of the winged soul, however, does. In it we are told how the soul travels in the heavens before reincarnation, attempts to gaze on true reality, forgets what it saw in the heavens once reincarnated, and then recalls the eternal forms it saw in the heavens when looking at their perceptible embodiments. The Phaedrus myth does not provide any proofs or evidence to support the theory of recollection. It simply assumes this theory to be true and provides (among other things) an “adaptation” of it. Since this theory the myth embodies is, for Plato, true, the myth has (pace Plato) a measure of truth in it, although its many fantastical details may lead one astray if taken literally. Among other things, the fantastical narrative of the myth helps the less philosophically inclined grasp the main point of Plato's theory of recollection, namely that “knowledge is recollection”.

5. Myth in the Timaeus

The cosmology of the Timaeus is a complex and ample construction, involving a divine maker (assisted by a group of less powerful gods), who creates the cosmos out of a given material (dominated by an inner impulse towards disorder) and according to an intelligible model. The cosmology as a whole is called both an eikōs muthos (29d, 59c, 68d) and an eikōs logos (30b, 48d, 53d, 55d, 56a, 57d, 90e). The expression eikōs muthos has been translated as ‘probable tale’ (Jowett), ‘likely story’ (Cornford), ‘likely tale’ (Zeyl). The standard interpretation is promoted by, among others, Cornford (1937, 31ff.). The Timaeus cosmology, Cornford argues, is a muthos because it is cast in the form of a narration, not as a piece-by-piece analysis. But also, and mainly, because its object, namely the universe, is always in a process of becoming and cannot be really known. Brisson (1998, ch. 13) offers a different solution, but along the same lines. The cosmology, Brisson argues, is a non-verifiable discourse about the perceptible universe before and during its creation. In other words: the cosmology is an eikōs muthos because it is about what happens to an eikōn before, and during, its creation, when everything is so fluid that it cannot be really known. The standard alternative is to say that the problem lies in the cosmologist, not in the object of his cosmology. It is not that the universe is so unstable so that it cannot be really known. It is that we fail to provide an exact and consistent description of it. A proponent of this view is Taylor (1928, 59). Rowe (2003) has argued that the emphasis at 29d2 is on the word eikōs, not muthos, and that here muthos is used primarily as a substitute for logos without its typical opposition to that term (a view also held by Vlastos (1939, 380–3)). Burnyeat (2009) argues that this cosmology is an attempt to disclose the rationality of the cosmos, namely the Demiurge's reasons for making it thus and so. The word eikōs (a participial form of the verb eoika, “to be like”) is, argues Burnyeat, usually translated as “probable”; but—as textual evidence from Homer to Plato proves—it also means “appropriate”, “fitting”, “fair”, “natural”, “reasonable”. Since the cosmology reveals what is reasonable in the eikōn made by the Demiurge, it may rightly be called eikōs, “reasonable”. The Demiurge's reasoning, however, is practical, not theoretical. The Demiurge, Burnyeat claims, works with given materials, and when he creates the cosmos, he does not have a free choice, but has to adjust his plans to them. Although we know that the Demiurge is supremely benevolent towards his creation, none of us could be certain of his practical reasons for framing the cosmos the way he did. That is why anyone aiming at disclosing them cannot but come up with “probable” answers. Plato's cosmology is then eikōs in the two senses of the word, for it is both “reasonable” and “probable”. But why does Plato call it a muthos? Because, Burnyeat argues, the Timaeus cosmology is also a theogony (for the created cosmos is for Plato a god), and this shows Plato's intention to overcome the traditional opposition between muthos and logos.

Timaeus speaks about the Demiurge's practical reasoning for creating the cosmos as he did. No cosmologist can deduce these reasons from various premises commonly accepted. He has to imagine them, but they are neither fantastical, nor sophistic. The cosmologist exercises his imagination under some constraints. He has to come up with reasonable and coherent conjectures. And in good Socratic and Platonic tradition, he has to test them with others. This is what Timaeus does. He expounds his cosmology in front of other philosophers, whom he calls kritai, “judges” (29d1). They are highly skilled and experienced philosophers: Socrates, Critias and Hermocrates and at the beginning of the Critias, the sequel to the Timaeus, they express their admiration for Timaeus' cosmological account (107a). One may say that Timaeus' account has been peer-reviewed. The judges, however, says Plato, have to be tolerant, for in this field one cannot provide more than conjectures. Timaeus' cosmological discourse is not aimed at persuading a less philosophically inclined audience to change their lives. It may be argued that its creationist scenario was meant to make the difficult topic of the genesis of the realm of becoming more accessible. In the Philebus, in a tight dialectical conversation, the genesis of the realm of becoming is explained in abstract terms (the unlimited, limit, being that is mixed and generated out of those two; and the cause of this mixture and generation, 27b–c). But the Timaeus aims at encompassing more than the Philebus. It aims not only at revealing the ultimate ontological principles (accessible to human reason, cf. 53d), and at explaining how their interaction brings forth the world of becoming, but also at disclosing, within a teleological framework, the reasons for which the cosmos was created the way it is. These reasons are to be imagined because imagination has to fill in the gaps that reason leaves in this attempt to disclose the reasons for which the cosmos was created the way it is.

6. Myth and philosophy

In the Protagoras (324d) a distinction is made between muthos and logos, where muthos appears to refer to a story and logos to an argument. This distinction seems to be echoed in the Theaetetus and the Sophist. In the Theaetetus Socrates discusses Protagoras' main doctrine and refers to it as “the muthos of Protagoras” (164d9) (in the same line Socrates also calls Theaetetus' defence of the identity of knowledge and perception a muthos). And later on, at 156c4, Socrates calls a muthos the teaching according to which active and passive motions generate perception and perceived objects. In the Sophist, the Visitor from Elea tells his interlocutors that Xenophanes, Parmenides and other Eleatic, Ionian (Heraclitus included) and Sicilian philosophers “appear to me to tell us a myth, as if we were children” (242c8; see also c–e). By calling all those philosophical doctrines muthoi Plato does not claim that they are myths proper, but that they are, or appear to be, non-argumentative. In the Republic Plato is fairly hostile to particular traditional myths. And in many dialogues he condemns the use of images in knowing things and claims that true philosophical knowledge should avoid images. He would have had strong reasons for avoiding the use of myths: they are not argumentative and they are extremely visual (especially those he invented, which contain so many visual details as if he would have given instructions to an illustrator). But he didn't.

He wanted to persuade and/or teach a wider audience, so he had to make a compromise. Sometimes, however, he seems to interweave philosophy with myth to a degree that was not required by persuading and/or teaching a non-philosophical audience. The eschatological myths of the Gorgias, Phaedo and Republic, for instance, are tightly bound with the philosophical arguments of those dialogues (cf. Annas 1982); and the eschatological myth of the Phaedo “picks one by one the programmatic remarks about teleological science from earlier on in the dialogue, and sketches ways in which their proposals can be fulfilled” (Sedley 1990, 381). Some other times he uses myth as a supplement to philosophical discourse (cf. Kahn (2009) who argues that in the myth of the Statesman Plato makes a doctrinal contribution to his political philosophy). And one time, in the Timaeus, he appears to overcome the opposition between muthos and logos: human reason has limits, and when it reaches them it has to rely on myth.

“On the less radical version, the idea will be that the telling of stories is a necessary adjunct to, or extension of, philosophical argument, one which recognizes our human limitations, and—perhaps—the fact that our natures combine irrational elements with the rational” (Rowe 1999, 265). On a more radical interpretation, “the distinction between ‘the philosophical’ and ‘the mythical’ will—at one level—virtually disappear” (265). If we take into account that Plato chose to express his thoughts through a narrative form, namely that of the dialogue (further enveloped in fictional mises en scène), we may say that the “use of a fictional narrative form (the dialogue) will mean that any conclusions reached, by whatever method (including ‘rational argument’), may themselves be treated as having the status of a kind of ‘myth’” (265). If so, “a sense of the ‘fictionality’ of human utterance, as provisional, inadequate, and at best approximating to the truth, will infect Platonic writing at its deepest level, below other and more ordinary applications of the distinction between mythical and nonmythical forms of discourse” (265); if so, it is not only “that ‘myth’ will fill in the gaps that reason leaves (though it might do that too, as well as serving special purposes for particular audiences), but that human reason itself ineradicably displays some of the features we characteristically associate with story-telling” (265–6). It is difficult to say which one of these two readings is a better approximation of what Plato thought about the interplay between myth and philosophy. The interpreter seems bound to furnish only probable accounts about this matter.

7. Plato's myths in the Platonist tradition

Aristotle admits that the lover of myths is in a sense a lover of wisdom (Metaphysics 982b18; cf. also 995a4 and 1074b1–10). He might have used a myth or two in his early dialogues, now lost. But in general he seems to have distanced himself from myth (cf. Metaphysics 1000a18–9).

On the philosophical use of myth before Plato there are a number of good studies, notably Morgan 2000. There is, however, little on the philosophical use of myth in the Platonist tradition. Of Plato's immediate successors in the Academy, Speusippus, Xenocrates and Heraclides of Pontus composed both dialogues and philosophical treatises. But, with one exception, none of these seems to have used myths as Plato did. The exception is Heraclides, who wrote various dialogues—such as On the Things in Hades, Zoroastres and Abaris—involving mythical stories and mythical, or semi-mythical, figures. In the later Platonist tradition—with the exception of Cicero and Plutarch—there is not much evidence that Plato's philosophical use of myths was an accepted practice. In the Neoplatonic tradition various Platonic myths became the subject of elaborate allegorization. Porphyry, Proclus, Damascius and Olympiodorus gave allegorical interpretations of a number of Platonic myths, such as the Phaedo and Gorgias eschatological myths, or the myth of Atlantis.

8. Renaissance illustrations of Plato's myths

Plato was a celebrated figure in the Renaissance but only a few illustrations of Platonic mythical motifs can be found. Perhaps Plato's attitude to visual representation—claiming so often that the highest philosophical knowledge is devoid of it, and attacking poets and artists in general more than once—inhibited and discouraged attempts to capture in painting, sculpture or prints, the mythical scenes Plato himself depicted so vividly in words. Perhaps artists simply felt themselves unequal to the task. McGrath (2009) reviews and analyzes the rare illustrations of Platonic mythical figures and landscapes in Renaissance iconography: the androgyne of the Symposium, the charioteer of the Phaedrus, the Cave, and the spindle of the universe handled by Necessity and the Fates of the Republic.


Anthologies of Plato's Myths

Short introductions to Plato's myths

Articles and books on Plato's myths

Plato's myths in the Platonist tradition

Renaissance illustrations of Plato's myths

References Cited

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Plato | Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology | Plato: rhetoric and poetry | Plato: Timaeus


This entry is loosely based on my introduction to a volume I edited, Plato's Myths, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009. There is some inevitable overlap, but this entry is sufficiently different from the above-mentioned introduction to be considered a new text. A version of this introduction was presented at the University of Neuchâtel. I am grateful to my audience for their critical remarks. Feedback on a first draft has come from Richard Kraut.