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Plato on utopia

First published Thu Dec 5, 2002; substantive revision Tue Dec 19, 2006

The Laws is one of Plato's last dialogues. In it, he sketches the basic political structure and laws of an ideal city named Magnesia. Despite the fact that the Laws treats a number of basic issues in political and ethical philosophy as well as theology, it has suffered neglect compared with the Republic. In recent years, however, more scholarly attention has been paid to the Laws. This entry discusses some of the most important issues arising in recent scholarship and suggests avenues for future research.

1. Authenticity and Chronology

In the more exuberantly speculative days of the 19th century, the authenticity of the Laws was rejected by various figures: even the great Platonist, Ast, held that “One who knows the true Plato needs only to read a single page of the Laws in order to convince himself that it is a fraudulent Plato that he has before him.”[1] Such skepticism is hard to understand, especially since Aristotle refers to the Laws as a dialogue of Plato's in numerous passages and today no serious scholar doubts its authenticity.

On the question of chronology, two external references are helpful:

  1. Aristotle tells us that the Laws is later than the Republic, (Pol. 2.6) and
  2. Diogenes Laertius (3.37) reports that it was unfinished at Plato's death (and the text of the Laws itself shows some signs of incompleteness and lack of revision).[2]

Platonic scholars also frequently appeal to stylometry (that is, the quantitative study of the features of Plato's prose style) to help to date the dialogues. Although the usefulness of stylometry is sometimes questioned, it is widely accepted and the agreement of many such studies allows us to divide the dialogues, with some confidence, into three groups.[3]

Group 3: Critias, Laws, Philebus, Sophist, Statesman, and Timaeus

Group 2: Parmenides, Phaedrus, Republic, and Theaetetus

Group 1: the rest

Drawing upon other evidence, it is reasonable to see the dialogues in Group 3 as the latest. Given the length of the Laws (it is the longest of the dialogues and is, roughly 20% longer than the Republic), it seems likely that its composition overlapped with the composition of at least some of the other dialogues in Group 3.

2. The Laws’ Relation to the Republic

The Laws comprises a conversation in 12 books, set on Crete, among three interlocutors: an unnamed Athenian Visitor (Plato's spokesman in the Laws), Megillus, a Spartan, and, Kleinias, a Cretan. The first two books consider what the proper goal or end (telos) of legislation is. Plato claims that even the best of extant constitutions, such as those of Crete and Sparta, have gone wrong on this crucial point. In all his legislation, the lawgiver must aim at a single goal and that is virtue. In particular, the lawgiver must aim at fostering all the virtues -- courage, justice, moderation, and wisdom -- in the citizens as a whole (Laws 630C3-6, 705D3-706A4).[4] So if Plato is to meet his own criterion for a good city, the rest of the Laws should show how the constitution (politeia) of this city reliably produces citizens who genuinely possess all the virtues.

At the end of Book 3 (Laws 702BD), Kleinias announces that the cities of Crete have decided to found a new city, to be named Magnesia, in a long abandoned part of Crete and they have given the responsibility for doing so to his city, Knossos, and that Knossos has delegated this authority to himself and nine others. He asks the Athenian to help in the construction of the new city's constitution and laws. In Books 4-12, the Athenian sketches, often in considerable detail, the constitution, the political and social institutions, and the laws of this new city, along with the political and ethical principles that justify them.

Since both the Republic and the Laws involve the creation of a good city, discussion of topics in political theory as well as related ethical and psychological material, it is natural to ask what the relation between the two dialogues is. The predominant view, until fairly recently, holds that the Republic is Plato's statement of what the ideally best city is; the Laws, on the other hand, describes the city that would be best, given less optimistic assumptions about what human nature is capable of. This position has two variants, depending on one's view of whether Plato at the time of the Republic thought that its political program was compatible with human nature. If one thinks that even at the time of the Republic, Plato thought that its ideal city placed too great demands on its citizens to be psychologically realizable, then one can hold that the Laws is entirely consistent with the Republic: they could, at least as far as their philosophical positions are concerned, have been written at the same time.[5] If, on the other hand, one thinks that Plato held that the city of the Republic was psychologically possible, even if difficult to realize, it is natural to see the Laws as the outcome of a change in Plato's views about human nature.[6] The first view faces two challenges:

  1. providing evidence from the Republic that Plato did not think its ideal city was realizable, and
  2. either explaining why the Republic does not at least gesture in the direction of the arrangements of the Laws as the best humanly possible option or arguing that we can find such evidence.

The second view should explain why Plato becomes more pessimistic about human nature. The need for such an explanation is especially pressing, since the most common attempt to do so by appealing to Plato's experiences in Sicily is philosophically quite unsatisfactory.[7]

In recent years, it has been argued that there are deep and pervasive differences between the Republic and the Laws (and more generally between the dialogues of Group 3 and those of Group 2) on ethical and political questions.[8] The debate over these claims is just in its initial stages and no scholarly consensus has yet emerged. Given this state of flux, the rest of this entry sketches a few important topics of contemporary controversy and then points to lines of future research. To see what future research is needed, we can begin by considering one of the most important drawbacks of traditional interpretations. In Book 5, in what is nowadays perhaps the most famous passage in the Laws, the Athenian announces that they are to engage in the construction of a “second-best” city.

Anyone who uses reason and experience will recognize that a second-best city [deuterôs … pros to beltiston] is to be constructed … That city and that constitution are first, and the laws are best, where the old proverb holds as much as possible throughout the whole city: it is said that the things of friends really are in common. (Laws 739A3-740C3)

The traditional assumption is that Plato here endorses the city sketched in the Republic as the best possible city, but now thinks that the demands it places on its inhabitants are too high: the city in the Laws is the second-best, but is the best that is likely to be compatible with human nature. It is also sometimes thought to follow from this that Plato still endorses the basic elements of the Republic's political and ethical theory.

But such an interpretation misreads the passage. Even if Plato were to endorse the political arrangements of the Republic as the best possible ones, it would not follow that he also endorses all the claims concerning political theory made in the Republic, much less that he endorses all of the Republic's claims in ethics, psychology and epistemology. The political arrangements of the Republic are entailed by, and are consistent with, many different sets of premises, some of which are mutually inconsistent. Nor does the present passage endorse all of the political structures of the Republic, rather it endorses the community of property, women and children and the goal of making the city as unified as possible. But what is most important is that this passage does not in fact endorse the Republic's method for making the city one by introducing a certain kind of community of property and families. In the Republic, these institutions are restricted to the first two classes, but are rejected for the third class, the producers. The Laws passage presents as the “first-best” city, not that of the Republic, but one in which there is, throughout the entire city, a community of property and of women and children. So the claim that the city sketched in the Laws is second-best does not suggest that the Republic still represents Plato's ideal political arrangement.[9] What the Laws represents as the ideal -- that is to be approximated as closely as possible -- is a city in which all citizens are subject to the same extremely high ethical demands.

3. The Social and Political Institutions of Magnesia

This section provides a brief overview of the basic social and political institutions of Magnesia. Magnesia will be located in a part of Crete that has been left empty by an ancient migration and is about ten miles from the sea. The site is basically self-sufficient in resources without having much excess to export. Plato sees this unsuitability for active commerce and distance from the sea as advantages: they discourage the maritime and commercial activities that corrupt cities by fostering a love of money-making in the citizens and by allowing close contact with foreigners who bring innovation and have not received the good ethical education afforded to Magnesians.

The city will be relatively populous: its number of households is to remain permanently at 5, 040.[10] Immigration and emigration policies are designed to avoid population excess and deficiency. Each household will have an allotment consisting of two plots of land: one nearer the city's center and one nearer its borders. Each household's allotment is intended to be equally productive (Laws 737CE, 745CD) and to support a comfortable, although not luxurious life for the household's members. The households and land are not owned or farmed in common, but each shareholder must consider his share to be at the same time the common property of the whole city (Laws 740A3-6). Part of the sense in which the lot is in common is that it is inalienable and cannot be divided or aggregated: the assignment of the lot to a household is intended to support the household throughout the generations. (There are also restrictions on the use of the land.[11] ) Further, each household will help, out of its own resources, to fund Magnesia's system of common meals.[12] Plato establishes four property classes: the members of the top or first class have assets worth between three and four times the value of the lot (and the tools and animals needed to farm it), the second class between two and three times this value and so on.[13] Anything accumulated over the highest amount will be confiscated by the city (Laws 744D-745A). Such assets do not include gold and silver, since these may be possessed only by the city; there will be only a token currency (Laws 742AB).

Many of Magnesia's inhabitants are not citizens. There is a considerable slave population (including both public and private slaves) and they, of course, are not citizens. Also found within the city are transient foreigners and resident foreigners (metics) who may stay for twenty years. Slaves and foreigners are an economic necessity for the city for they will carry on the trading, manufacturing and menial occupations that are barred to citizens. The lot holders or heads of households are citizens, but citizenship is not restricted to them and owning land is not a necessary condition of citizenship. The sons and heirs of lot holders are called “citizens” and are liable to military service at age 20, can participate in elections at that age and can serve in office at 30.[14] They will not inherit the household lot, however, until their father dies. What of women? In Magnesia, the private family is not abolished. Although women lack an independent right to own property, they are liable to military training and service and attend their own common meals (Laws 780D). The Athenian holds that they can attain the four cardinal virtues and for this reason requires that they be educated (Laws 804D-805A). For Aristotle, women are not citizens of the ideal city, since they are excluded from political office. But in Magnesia, women can participate in elections and hold political office and the Athenian explicitly counts them as citizens (Laws 814C2-4).[15]

Let us turn to the political system or constitution (politeia) of Magnesia. Magnesia has a rich variety of offices, but the main ones are: the Assembly (koinos sullogos, ekklêsia), the Council (boulê), the magistrates, especially the guardians of the laws (nomophulakes), the courts and the Nocturnal Council (nukterinos sullogos). The Nocturnal Council is discussed in more detail below in section 4.

The Assembly is the main electoral authority in the city; it is composed of all citizens, or more precisely, all those who have served or are serving in the military. The Assembly is responsible for the election of most of the city's officers and magistrates. The other functions explicitly given to it are

  1. a role in judging offenses against the public,
  2. making awards of merit,
  3. extending the term of residence for metics, and
  4. passing on proposed changes in the laws, at least those regarding dances and sacrifices.

It may also have other responsibilities in connection with foreign affairs.[16]

The Council is composed of 90 members chosen by election from each property class for a total of 360 members. Men are eligible for office at age 30, women at age 40. Members serve one-year terms. The Council exercises ordinary administrative powers, such as calling and dissolving the Assembly, receiving foreign ambassadors, supervising elections and so on.

The guardians of the laws (nomophulakes) are composed of 37 citizens, at least fifty years of age who serve from the time of their election until age 70 (Laws 755A). There are four ways in which the nomophulakes guard the laws:[17]

  1. Although they do not seem to have the authority to discipline other magistrates, they are assigned the general task of supervising them and are expected to bring appropriate cases to the attention of the proper officials.
  2. They exercise wide supervisory powers over citizens in general and, for example, are charged with fining those who spend excessively, granting permission to travel abroad and overseeing the care of orphans.
  3. They possess various judicial functions and are in charge of especially important or difficult cases involving the family, property and the abuse of laws.
  4. Perhaps their most important task is the revision and supplementation of the existing laws, although the extent of revision possible is controversial.[18]

Finally, there is an extensive system of courts in Magnesia, both public and private. One of Plato's major innovations, compared with Athenian law, is the elaborate structure of appeals in judicial cases. It is worth noting that Plato holds that citizens, in virtue of their standing in the political community, may legitimately expect to have a share in the administration of justice (Laws 767E9-768B3).

4. Preludes in the Laws

A significant part of the impetus for interpretations that see considerable differences between the Republic and the Laws comes from the presence in the latter of “preludes” to individual laws and to the lawcode as a whole that are available to all the citizens. In Plato's own view, one of the most important innovations in the political theory of the Laws is the requirement that good lawgivers try to persuade the citizens and not simply issue commands to them by means of laws (Laws 722B5-C2). Plato compares the lawgiver in Magnesia to a free doctor treating free people. Slave doctors who treat other slaves merely give them orders and then rush off to other patients. Free doctors treating free people must explain to their patients the condition they have and the rationale for treatment before prescribing (Laws 722B-723B). In doing so, they will “educate” the patients and use “arguments that come close to philosophizing” (Laws 857C2-E5). Similarly, Plato thinks that the lawgiver in Magnesia should not merely issue legal commands: law without persuasion is condemned as mere force (722B). Drawing on Plato's programmatic remarks in Books 4, 9, and 10 the preludes should have the following features.

  1. What the person who is to be persuaded is asking for is to be “educated” or “taught,” that is, to be given good epistemic reasons for thinking that the principles lying behind the legislation are true (Laws 885DE).
  2. What the lawgiver and the preludes actually do is characterized as “teaching,” that is, giving reasons to the citizens and bringing it about that they “learn” (Laws 718CD, 720D, 723A, 857DE and 888A).
  3. The preludes are thus designed to be instances of rational persuasion, that is, attempts to influence the citizens' beliefs by appealing to rational considerations. They are not intended to inculcate false, but useful beliefs, or to effect persuasion through non-rational means.
  4. The preludes are meant to provide quite general ethical instruction. The lawgiver is to be a primary source of instruction about what is fine, just and good. Thus the citizens will learn why the laws are fine and just and should also learn why following the laws and, more generally, acting virtuously is good for them. They are to receive a true and reasoned account of what is good for human beings.

The view that this use of preludes marks a significant difference from the Republic depends on two claims.

  1. The Laws advocates the use of preludes, along with other methods, to educate the citizens and give them some rational understanding of the laws and, more generally, an understanding of ethical truths.
  2. The Republic does not intend to provide, except to its highest class, the philosopher-rulers, an education that can result in such a rational appreciation of basic ethical truths.

With respect to (II), advocates of the change interpretation point to passages from the Republic such as the following.

Therefore, to insure that someone like that [one whose reason is not strong enough to rule himself] is ruled by something similar to what rules the best person, we say that he ought to be the slave [doulon] of that best person who has a divine ruler within himself. (Rep. 590C8-D1)

The education provided to the two lower classes, it is argued, thus does not succeed in enabling them to be ruled by their own reason and leaves them in the state of slaves. In Republic Book 7, Plato considers whether the musical education the auxiliaries receive (which is the most advanced education that they get) tends to the good of leading the soul out of the Cave and toward the “intelligible” or “knowable region.” The answer is that it does not, since musical education

educated the guardians through habits. Its harmonies gave them a certain harmoniousness, not knowledge; its rhythms gave them a certain rhythmical quality; and its stories whether fictional or nearer the truth, cultivated other habits akin to these. But there was nothing in it that aimed at any such subject as you are now seeking. (Rep. 522A4-B1, cf. 484C3-D10 and 516E8-517E2)

Thus all citizens, other than the philosopher-rulers, remain within the Cave.

Both (I) and (II) are, however, quite controversial. With respect to (I), some have argued that despite the fact that Plato's programmatic remarks about the preludes suggest that they are designed to further a rational appreciation of ethical truths, what is actually provided for the vast majority of the citizens is, primarily, rhetorical persuasion appealing to their sense of honor and shame. This gap is then explained either by the hypothesis (i) that Plato is being deceptive, or his mental capacities declined in old age; or (ii) that the programmatic remarks represent an ideal that Plato makes it clear cannot be realized in actual practice.[19] Evaluating the acceptability of (II) will require careful examination of the education provided to the Republic's auxiliary and money-making classes and, in particular, consideration of what the auxiliaries' “musical education” provides them with.[20]

Further progress in resolving these disputes might be made by continued research on three topics. First, we must consider the preludes in light of the broader context of the citizens' education in the Laws. What sort of education is provided for them and what cognitive and ethical abilities will such education foster? Second, we need to examine Plato's views about education in the other late dialogues, especially the Statesman.[21] Finally, the issues concerning citizens' education are intimately linked to deep questions in Plato's psychology and epistemology. In order to understand what kind of education is required in order to have a rational grasp of ethical principles we must consider the nature of ethical learning, given Plato's epistemology and psychology, in both the middle and late periods. This issue is discussed a bit further in section 6.

5. The Nocturnal Council and Political Participation

A second, more longstanding, controversy about the Laws concerns the role of the body known as the “Nocturnal Council” which is so-called because it meets daily from dawn until sunrise when everyone has the most leisure from public and private activities (Laws 961B6-8).[22] The Nocturnal Council is first explicitly mentioned in Book 10 (but is alluded to earlier at Laws 632C4-6 and 818A1-3) where it is assigned an educational function. Those who have violated Magnesia's impiety laws due to ignorance, rather than bad character, are to be imprisoned for five years. During their imprisonment, the members of the Nocturnal Council meet with them in order to reform their beliefs by teaching (Laws 909A). The Nocturnal Council's membership seems to include:

  1. the 10 oldest guardians of the laws,
  2. the current supervisor of education and his predecessors,
  3. examiners (officials who check the qualifications of those entering office and audit them when they leave office) and other citizens who have won awards of honor,
  4. certain citizens who have traveled abroad under official auspices to gather knowledge and have been invited to participate by the Nocturnal Council itself, and
  5. each of the above members is to nominate for membership (whose acceptance is subject to the approval of the other members) a younger associate between the ages of 30 and 40 (Laws 951D4-E5 and 961A1-B6).

In Book 12, the Athenian returns to the Nocturnal Council and emphasizes its great importance for the city. The following passage from Book 12 has encouraged some to think that Plato here grants the Nocturnal Council very great, or even unlimited, political power.

If this divine council should come into being for us, dear friends, the city ought to be handed over to it [paradoteon toutôi tên polin] (Laws 969B2-3, cf. 960B5-E11 and 961C3-6)

Some scholars have held, on the basis of these passages, that Plato intends the Nocturnal Council to be the main political authority in Magnesia. On this view, either it will have the same powers as did the philosopher kings in the Republic to change laws and institutions as it sees fit or the extent of its powers will simply be left to the Nocturnal Council itself to determine.[23] Such an interpretation has, however, quite high costs. As its main contemporary proponent concedes, it requires us to see the Laws as inconsistent: the earlier provisions of political authority to various offices are incompatible with assigning such unlimited powers to the Nocturnal Council.[24] Further, such a grant of power is at least in serious tension with one of the Laws’ basic political principles. Repeatedly in the Laws, Plato emphasizes that allowing any magistrate or political body unchecked authority runs too great a risk of the abuse of power. Such a risk is still too great even if the possessors of power have genuine knowledge: even those with full knowledge are subject to corruption in such circumstances.[25]

Other interpreters, such as Glenn Morrow, have suggested that the Nocturnal Council's role is primarily informal.[26] This Council is to possess various sorts of knowledge and it must also educate its own members. Even without possessing powers beyond those explicitly assigned to it, the Nocturnal Council should exercise a considerable influence on Magnesia's governance. Its members include some of the city's most important officials. Plato would certainly expect that these officials' administration of the laws and revision of them -- if this is permitted -- will be informed by their studies. Perhaps even more important, the younger associate members of the Nocturnal Council will come to fill many offices of the state and will exercise an informal, but still significant, influence on other citizens in the deliberations that play such an important role in Magnesia's system of government, as well as in their other contacts with their fellows.

There is, however, a third option. Morrow adopts his “informal” interpretation in part because Plato does not explicitly assign to the Nocturnal Council any powers beyond those we have noted. But one could hold that the Laws is not intended to provide a fully determinate blueprint of the just city.[27] On this interpretation, there is an open texture to the political and social institutions that Plato sketches and we should allow for a range of ways of implementing the basic structure. For example, Plato appears to assign to the “guardians of the laws” (the nomophulakes) some important role in revising Magnesia's laws. In his Book 12 discussion, Plato describes the members of the Nocturnal Council as “those who will really be guardians of the laws” (Laws 966B5). The members of the Nocturnal Council will, if properly educated, be “made into guardians whose like, with respect to the virtue of safekeeping, we have not seen come into being in our lives previously” (Laws 969C2-3). We need not see these claims as a volte-face on Plato's part, if we allow for a range of ways in which the outline of Magnesia sketched can be realized that fall between excluding the Nocturnal Council from any political role at all and seeing them as philosopher kings in disguise. We can thus allow that the Nocturnal Council is intended to have genuine political authority going beyond its explicitly stated responsibilities that still falls well short of autocratic power, without expecting the Laws’ text to make this authority fully determinate.

But in addition to the specific issue of the extent of the Nocturnal Council's powers, there is a deeper question. The more political authority that is assigned to the Nocturnal Council, the more politically passive most citizens of Magnesia will be. Thus the question about the power of the Nocturnal Council has significant implications for our evaluation of the ethical capacities of non-philosophical citizens. If their education really does give them some rational appreciation of the principles underlying the laws of Magnesia, we should expect that they can, to a significant degree, be free from detailed regulation and supervision by others. Further, not only is it the case that they will be capable of being free from such regulation, but we should expect that deliberating and acting upon their grasp of ethical principles forms an important part of their own good.[28] If, however, their political activity is reduced to the level of the two lower classes in the Republic, who have little or no part in political deliberation or judicial administration, we might think that Plato has the same fairly low estimate of the ethical capacities of ordinary citizens in both works. Resolving the issue of the Nocturnal Council's powers thus has broad implications for our understanding of Plato's later ethics.

6. Plato's Later Epistemology, Metaphysics, and Psychology

With respect to the specific controversies we have examined, that over the role of the preludes and that concerning the powers of the Nocturnal Council, we have found that the issues under dispute have important connections to Plato's epistemology and psychology. This should not, however, be surprising. To understand the nature of ethical learning and what ethical cognitive states can be produced by different kinds of education, we must ultimately turn to Plato's epistemology, metaphysics, and psychology. Further, since the appropriate political role for citizens depends in large part on the kinds of ethical character and knowledge (or true belief) they can acquire, we can only understand Plato's later political philosophy by understanding its connections with his later epistemology, metaphysics, and psychology.

The idea that Plato's ethics and politics rest, at least in large part, on his views in these other areas of philosophy is not novel. Much of the best work on the ethical and political theory of the Republic tries to draw such connections.[29] But this has not yet happened to anything approaching the same degree with respect to his later ethics and politics.[30] This is due perhaps primarily to the fact that while the Republic provides within itself an account articulated in some detail not only of Plato's ethics and politics, but also of the psychology, epistemology and metaphysics on which they rest, the Laws is comparatively lacking in extended argumentation on these basic philosophical issues. But Plato is not trying in the Laws to provide a comprehensive philosophical statement of the sort found in the Republic. Questions of psychology, epistemology, ethics and metaphysics (including the metaphysics of value) are explored in great detail and with extraordinary sophistication in the other later dialogues. Indeed, they are treated in much more detail and with greater philosophical power than in the middle period. And it is these later dialogues that provide the indispensable background for understanding the Laws. Thus we should read it together with, for example, the Philebus’ metaphysics of value and account of pleasure and with the epistemology and psychology of the Timaeus. More cautiously, we should look for connections with the epistemology, metaphysics and psychology of other dialogues which are plausibly thought to be post-Republic, but do not fall into the final group of six, such as the Phaedrus and the Theaetetus.[31] By examining Plato's philosophical positions in these later dialogues, we can work out the deeper justification for Plato's vision of political and ethical community in the Laws. And by articulating this vision, we gain greater understanding of the other later dialogues on which it rests.


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Aristotle, General Topics: political theory | Plato