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First published Fri Feb 18, 2005

Porphyry (234?–305? C.E.) was a Neoplatonist philosopher born in Tyre in Phoenicia. He studied with Longinus in Athens and then with Plotinus in Rome from 263–269 C.E. and became a follower of the latter's version of Platonism. Porphyry wrote in just about every branch of learning practiced at the time but only a portion of his large output is extant. Porphyry was an influential thinker. He applied Neoplatonism to pagan religion and other spheres and is as such a key figure the promulgation of Neoplatonic thought. His writings on Aristotle's logical works, preserved in part and influential in the Latin West through Boethius' translations, contain attempts to harmonize Aristotle's logical writings with Platonism.

1. Life

Porphyry was born in Tyre in Phoenicia (now in Lebanon), probably in 234 C.E. His name was ‘Malcus’, ‘king’ in his native tongue, hence he became ‘Basileus’ (‘king’) in Greek. He, however, calls himself Porphyry, which supposedly was a common name in Tyre, the city of purple, and is in general known under that name. Little is known with certainty about his life, except what can be gleaned from his own account of Plotinus' life, The Life of Plotinus. Before he came to study with Plotinus in Rome in 263 C.E. he studied with the Middle Platonist Longinus in Athens. In Rome he stayed for some five years and converted to Plotinus' version of Platonism. On Plotinus' advice he left Rome for Sicily in order to recover from a bout of depression in 268 C.E. He must have stayed there for some time, even beyond Plotinus' death in 270 C.E. There are some untrustworthy reports about a school of Porphyry in Rome after Plotinus' death. In reality we do not know anything with certainty about where he lived in the latter half of his life. He may have been Iamblichus' teacher. The evidence for this, however, is not beyond dispute. It is clear, though, that Iamblichus was strongly influenced by Porphyry, even if he turned vehemently against him. Towards the end of his life (301 C.E.), Porphyry edited Plotinus' writings, the Enneads, dividing them into six books of nine treatises each, which he prefaced with his Life of Plotinus. The latter is the most reliable and the most informative source about his life and attitudes. He married fairly late an older wife, for whom one of his extant writings, the Letter to Marcella, is written.

2. Works and Profile

Porphyry was a prolific author who wrote about the whole range of topics. There are some sixty works attributed to him, but most of them are now lost or survive in mere fragments. Extant (though not all complete) are: Life of Plotinus, Life of Pythagoras, Letter to Marcella, On Abstinence from Eating Food from Animals, Starting-points leading to the intelligibles (usually called the Sententiae; in Latin the work is called Sententiae ad intelligibilia ducentes), the Isagoge (Introduction), On the cave of the Nymphs, and commentaries on Aristotle's Categories and Ptolemy's Harmonics. An extant work attributed to Galen, To Gaurus, is most probably by him. There are fragments of a history of philosophy and fragments of a number of works on psychology. It has been argued in Hadot 1968 that Porphyry is the author of the incomplete “Anonymous Commentary on Plato's Parmenides”. This attribution has been widely accepted but also forcefully challenged. In addition we know that Porphyry wrote on such diverse subjects as grammar, philology, rhetoric, and geometry. Against the Christians is perhaps Porphyry's best known title. Of this large work only some fragments have survived.

In his monumental study, La vie de Porphyre (1913), Bidez portrayed the young Porphyry as someone prone to religion and superstition. He was supposed to have become a more rational thinker during his sojourn with Plotinus, though later to have relapsed to some extent into his previous mode. Later research has found that there is no clear support for such a view of Porphyry's development. He may throughout his life have used different styles, perhaps aiming at different readerships, while maintaining somehow both his proneness for religion and superstition and his rational tendencies.

It is clear that Porphyry was a very learned man. He is sometimes claimed as a highly important promulgator of the late ancient branch of Platonism (usually called ‘Neoplatonism’) rather than as an original philosopher. The former claim is certainly true: He applied Neoplatonic doctrines to traditional pagan religion and myths and was in many respects a more extrovert thinker interested in applying Platonic philosophy to various spheres than his master, Plotinus. The judgment that he was unoriginal may, however, be overhasty, since the sample of his writings we are left with is very small and among these his more theoretical works are clearly underrepresented. What we have and know to be his, however, does not indicate drastic theoretical innovations, except perhaps in the sphere of the philosophy of logic and language. To judge from the evidence of subsequent ancient Platonists, Porphyry was an independent philosopher whose views were taken very seriously indeed. Late ancient Platonists, however, often mention him in the pair “Plotinus and Porphyry”. So, as should be clear from what already has been said, Porphyrian scholarship, when soberly done, is filled with caveats: We rarely know when he wrote what, and we do not know for sure what his philosophical doctrines were. What is extant suggests a close doctrinal affinity with Plotinus, except for the fragment of the Parmenides commentary for which the authorship and relationship to Porphyry is disputed. Thus, we are faced with a figure whom we know to have been respected in late antiquity, who was influential long beyond then, but we do not know with any certainty what he stood for philosophically or what, if anything, was original with him, in the central areas of philosophy.

3. Philosophical Views

It seems safe to assume that before his encounter with Plotinus, Porphyry's philosophical views were shaped by Longinus, Numenius and other Middle Platonists, in addition to Plato, Aristotle and other classics of Greek philosophy. After meeting with him he turned into a follower of Plotinus, even if some of his Middle Platonist background shows through also in his post-Plotinian phase. This picture is strongly suggested both by his Life of Plotinus and the Sententiae, the only extant work in which he lays out his basic philosophical views that is with certainty attributable to him.

For Plotinus and Porphyry, there is a categorical gap between two realms, the sensible and the intelligible. The latter realm contains three “hypostases” (three different ontological levels), the One, Intellect and Soul. Of these, the One is the first cause of everything else; it is characterized by sheer unity which renders it beyond thought and beyond description in language. Intellect is the sphere of real being, identified with the Platonic Forms, which are the thoughts of a universal intellect. Soul, the lowest of the intelligible hypostases, is the intelligible item directly responsible for the sensible realm. The sensible realm, which is an imperfect image of the intelligible, also consists of levels: There are organisms, of which the sensible cosmos is one, comprising the other, lesser organisms. Organisms are ensouled beings and thus include an intelligible component. Below them on the scale are forms in matter, bodies, and matter itself. These too are results of Soul's creative activity but are not intelligible entities.

The relationship between these levels is in general described in terms of a doctrine of double activity: Each higher level has its characteristic internal activity which is accompanied by an external power or activity which constitutes the level below. This talk of internal and external activities (powers) is equivalent to what is known as the relationship between paradigms and imitations in traditional Platonism.

Human beings have, so to speak, one leg in each realm: Through the body and its non-rational soul (the seat of appetitive and spirited desires and sense-perception) they belong to the sensible realm, through their higher soul (intellect) to the intelligible. Actually, the true human being is to be identified with the intellect and the intelligible Man. It follows from this that the task set for human beings is to free themselves from the sensible and live by the intelligible, which after all is their true or real nature.

This is Plotinus' philosophy, which Porphyry shares, in broad outline. (see entry on Plotinus). In what follows, we focus on some points where Porphyry diverges from Plotinus or has been taken to diverge from him, or may seem to develop his thought.

3.1 Religion

In the Platonic tradition before Porphyry, Plutarch and Plotinus already interpreted classical Greek mythology as philosophical allegories (the Stoics were first to establish this practice). Porphyry, however, takes this much further than his Platonic predecessors and does it more systematically. This is revealed e.g., in his attitude towards Homer, whose texts he takes to have a hidden, philosophical meaning behind the literal one (see The Cave of the Nymphs). He also was the first Platonist to comment on the Chaldean Oracles, a pagan religious text in verse compiled in the 2nd century AD that the later Neoplatonists took for a divine revelation. It is a characteristic of post-Iamblichean Neoplatonism (330 AD onwards) that religion, religious rites and even magic (theurgy) were taken to be an alternative way to the soul's salvation, beside philosophy. Porphyry did not share this view. He did not reject magic outright, but he seems to have restricted its efficacy to the sphere of nature and not to have regarded it as a means to establish contact with the intelligible realm as philosophy could do. His interpretation and concerns with religious matters, however, opened for the developments undertaken by Iamblichus and the subsequent tradition of pagan Neoplatonism.

3.2 Psychology and Ethics

As regards his views on the soul, Porphyry seems in all essentials to follow Plotinus. In addition to the Sententiae, On Abstinence and To Gaurus, there are quite a few fragments of other works bearing on his psychological views, preserved especially in Stobaeus, Nemesius, and St. Augustine.

The soul is an intelligible entity but, as noted above, it is the intelligible entity that is directly engaged with the sensible realm. Intelligible entities are incorporeal and without extension. Certain problems arise in accounting for how something which in itself is incorporeal can be present in an extended body, as the soul must be. Porphyry resolves this by saying that the soul is not locally present in the body but is present to it by a certain disposition or inclination towards the body (Sent. 3; 4). In a passage preserved in Nemesius, he says that when something intelligible enters into a relation to some place or to a thing in a place, it is by a misuse of language that we say that it is there. Because its activity is there, we speak of the place when we should speak of the relation to it and the activity. When one should say “it acts there” we say “it is there” (Nem. 136, 11; p. 99 Dörrie).

The soul's inclination towards the body constitutes “a second power” that relates directly to the body. As noted above, Porphyry distinguishes between the rational (higher) soul and the non-rational (lower) soul. The lower soul is presumably identical with this second power that originates in the soul's inclination toward the body. The higher soul is the same as reason, whereas the lower is responsible for soul-functions that directly involve the body, such as perception and desire. In the tradition before him, this distinction sometimes became so sharp that it was supposed that each person has two distinct souls. Porphyry insists on the unity of the soul.

The distinction between the soul itself and its powers (the lower soul) is an instance of the distinction between internal and external acts, mentioned above. Thus, the soul itself has an intellectual activity that has the second powers or lower soul as its external act.

For Porphyry, as for Plotinus, what matters most in life is to free one's soul from the calamities of the body and the sensible world in general so that it may become purely what it originally and essentially is, viz., a part of the intelligible world. Thus, reason should endeavor to elevate itself to the level of the Intellect, which is distinguished by a much higher degree of unity than the mere ordinary use of reason is capable of. It may even be possible to rise above this to the level of the One itself. There seems to be a certain difference in Porphyry's and Plotinus' emphasis here, however. Whereas Plotinus stresses episodic escapes in this life by means of philosophy, Porphyry, while admitting this possibility, seems to suppose that the soul may, after successive reincarnations, free itself from the sensible for good. He, however, at least according to some of the evidence, rejects the incarnation of human souls into animal bodies and interprets Platonic passages suggesting this as not literally intended (see Smith 1974 and Deuse).

In Sententiae 32 Porphyry presents his views on the virtues, which, though a development of Plotinus' account in Ennead I. 2, are interesting in their own right. He distinguishes between four kinds of virtue: civic, purgative, contemplative and paradigmatic. The four kinds of virtue are hierarchically ordered so that paradigmatic virtue comprises in some way all the rest (paradigmatic virtues are the Platonic Forms, or paradigms, of the different virtues). On the other hand, even if e.g., civic virtue naturally leads to purgative virtue, a person may be virtuous at the civic level without possessing the higher forms. On all four levels Porphyry posits the four cardinal virtues of Plato's Republic (wisdom, temperance, justice and courage). The civic virtues are concerned with the virtuous actions of ordinary life—wise, temperate, just and courageous. These cardinal virtues are differently, albeit analogously, defined in the case of each level. Thus, e.g., wisdom as a purgative virtue is defined as the soul's “not forming opinions in accordance with the body, but acting on its own”, whereas wisdom as a contemplative virtue consists in the contemplation of the essences inherent in the Intellect. Thus, the virtues form a hierarchy where the inferior may be seen as a weaker manifestation of the superior. This theory of virtue is a clever attempt at reconciling the Republic, the Phaedo and the Theaetetus and fitting their teaching about virtue into a coherent Platonic metaphysics.

3.3 Metaphysics

The hierarchy of hypostases starting from the One has already been sketched. Given the available other texts, there would be no strong reason for supposing Porphyry's metaphysics to differ significantly from that of Plotinus. However, as mentioned above, Hadot 1968 made a case for identifying Porphyry as the author of the so-called Anonymous commentary on Plato's Parmenides. This Parmenides commentary seems to employ a notion of the One as an ineffable first principle that according to Hadot makes it post-Plotinian. In addition, the commentary includes the first principle, existence (hyparxis = the One), in a triad of existence, life and intelligence. Positing a first principle that is a part of such a composite is surely un-Plotinian. If we follow Hadot's exposition of this metaphysics, based primarily on the Parmenides commentary, we get a picture of the top of the ontological or “theological” hierarchy that is rather different from anything we find in Plotinus. Although Hadot's hypothesis about Porphyry as the author of the commentary has had wide acceptance, it is however by no means universally accepted, and there are reasons to consider the commentary as pre-Plotinian, i.e., Middle-Platonist. Porphyrian or not, the Anonymous commentary on Plato's Parmenides exerted considerable influence on the Christian theology of Marius Victorinus, who employed it in his doctrine of the Trinity.

3.4 Aristotle and the Philosophy of Language

Porphyry wrote a commentary on Aristotle's Categories that is extant and another longer one that is lost except for some fragments. And he wrote the Isagoge, which is an introduction to Aristotle's logical works in general. Through these logical writings Porphyry established himself as an important figure in the history of logic. The Isagoge in particular served as a standard introductory text in Byzantium, the Arabic world and in the Latin West through Boethius' translation and commentary. These texts served as a basic introductory texts in philosophy for at least 1000 years.

Platonists before Plotinus differed in their attitude towards Aristotle. Porphyry belongs to those who believed that Plato and Aristotle were essentially in agreement, and he refers to Aristotle for support throughout his writings. Plotinus too showed such reconciliatory attitudes but Porphyry takes this trend even further. The question arises how such an attitude can be reconciled with those passages in Aristotle that seem to disagree with Plato, sometimes expressly. We do not know how Porphyry dealt with others of these, besides Aristotle's Categories, which appears to modern readers in many respects to be an anti-Platonic work. This is especially notable in its claim that particulars are prior to universals. Porphyry solves this dilemma by insisting that the so-called Aristotelian categories—substance, quality, quantity etc., dealt with in the Categories—are “significant expressions”. That is to say, the Categories is not a work in primary ontology but rather a work about the expressions used to signify the sensible things around us. The class of beings signified by a universal term of this sort is indeed prior to the universal term, e.g., the class of pale things to the universal term ‘pale’. As Strange 1987, 1992 notes, this, however, does not affect the basic ontology. So interpreted the Categories is innocuous from a Platonic point of view: The realm of Platonic intelligible Forms, which are universals of a different kind than the expressions involved in the Categories, can be kept intact.

The Isagoge does not claim originality but on the contrary Porphyry says in his introductory note that in it he will rehearse “what the ancient masters say” and avoid the deep questions. As an example of the latter, he mentions questions about the ontological status of genera and species—whether they exist or depend on thought; and if they exist, whether they are bodies or incorporeal; and if the latter, whether they are sensible items or exist separately from such. These questions Porphyry wishes to shun. Nevertheless, his formulations of them constitute the most influential part of his work, since it was these questions that formed the basis of medieval debates about the status of universals.


Porphyry's works and fragments can now be found in an electronic version in the original Greek in the Thesaurus Linguae Graecae collection These are based on the best available editions. Below is a list of some translations of Porphyry's works into English followed by a list of some secondary literature, mostly in English. There is considerable recent literature on Porphyry in other languages, especially Italian and French.


Secondary literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aristotle | Iamblichus | Neoplatonism | Plato | Plotinus