Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Prisoner's Dilemma

Haystack PDs Become Stag Hunts

Claim: For any PD game g, there is some natural number n such, that for all m>n, the m-generation haystack version of g is a stag hunt.

Proof sketch: Let the temptation, reward, punishment and sucker payoffs of the underlying PD be T, R, P and S and let Vn be the payoff function of its n-generation haystack version. It is sufficient to show that there is some n, such that for all m>n,

  1. Vm(C,C) > Vm(D,D)
  2. Vm(C,C) > Vm(D,C)
  3. Vm (D,D) > Vm(C,D)

First, observe that in any “mixed” population, i.e, any population containing at least one defector and at least one cooperator, the ratio of defectors to cooperators increases exponentially. (In particular if the ratio in one generation is r, the ratio in the next generation will be at least kr, where k is the minimum of T/R (which it would be if, in the earlier generation, there was one defector and many cooperators) and P/S (which it would be if there was one cooperator and many defectors).

A haystack founded by two cooperators will have 2R cooperators in the second generation, 2R2 in the third, 2R3 in the 4th and so on. Similarly, haystack founded by two defectors will have 2P defectors in the second generation 2P2 in the third, 2P3 in the fourth, and so on. Since R > P, 1 holds for every value of m. To establish 2, note that (after the second generation) the haystack founded by a pair of cooperators increases in population by a factor of R in every generation (and every member remains a cooperator). By our initial observation, the haystack founded by a mixed pair approaches a homogeneous population of defectors, and so the factor by which its population increases approaches P. Eventually, then, Vm(C,C) will exceed Vm(D,C). On the other hand, since the ratio of cooperators in mixed populations goes to zero in the limit, Vm(C,D) approaches zero, and so 3 is also true.