Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Divine Providence

1. Alvin C. Plantinga, God, Freedom, and Evil (New York: Harper & Row, 1974), p. 26. Essentially the same argument has been endorsed by many other writers.

2. William L. Rowe, "The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism," American Philosophical Quarterly 16 (1979), 335-41.

3. Ibid. p. 337.

4. Daniel Howard-Snyder, "The Argument From Inscrutable Evil," in The Evidential Argument From Evil, ed. D. Howard-Snyder (Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press, 1996, pp. 286-310.

5. David Hume, Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, ed. M. Bell. (New York: Penguin Books, 1990, p. 111.

6. Plantinga, God, Freedom, and Evil, p. 30.

7. J. L. Mackie, "Evil and Omnipotence," Mind 64 (1955), 200-12, p. 209.

8. Plantinga, God, Freedom, and Evil, pp. 41-42; Thomas P. Flint, Divine Providence: The Molinist Account (Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press, 1998), pp. 84-90.

9. Mackie, "Evil and Omnipotence," pp. 209-10; Flint, Divine Providence, pp. 84-85.

10. Boethius, The Consolation of Philosophy, Bk. V, pr. 6.

11. Contemporary defenders of the view that God is timelessly eternal include Paul Helm, Eternal God (New York: Oxford University Press, 1988); and Brian Leftow, Time and Eternity (Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press, 1991).

12. See especially Nicholas Wolterstorff, "God Everlasting," in Contemporary Philosophy of Religion, ed. S. M. Cahn and D. Shatz (New York: Oxford University Press, 1982), pp. 77-98.

13. Luis de Molina, On Divine Foreknowledge: Part IV of the Concordia, tr. Alfred J. Freddoso (Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press, 1988). The Molinist view receives a thorough and careful defense from Thomas Flint in his Divine Providence (op. cit.), on which the present discussion is based.

14. Molina attributes three kinds of knowledge to God. Natural knowledge consists of logical and conceptual truths — e.g., that no bachelor is married — which are recognized by God as a matter of his essential nature. Free knowledge consists of contingent truths that are settled by God's will as creator — e.g., that there are tigers. Middle knowledge is so named because it falls between these two. The truths of which it is composed are, like those of free knowledge, contingent; but like natural knowledge they are held to be settled independently of God's will.

15. Flint, Divine Providence, pp. 37-41.

16. Ibid., p. 71.

17. That God could not know counterfactuals of freedom independently of his creative decisions is argued by Timothy O'Connor in "The Impossibility of Middle Knowledge," Philosophical Studies 66 (1992), 139-66.

18. For this objection see Robert M. Adams, "Middle Knowledge and the Problem of Evil," American Philosophical Quarterly 14 (1877), 109-14; and William Hasker, God, Time, and Knowledge (Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press, 1989), pp. 29-52.

19. For a defense of this view of providence, see Clark Pinnock, Richard Rice, John Sanders. William Hasker, and David Bassinger, eds., The Openness of God (Downers Grove, Illinois: InterVarsity Press, 1994).

20. Flint, Divine Providence, pp. 100-02.

21. Ibid., p. 104.

22. On Grace and Free Will. Basic Writings of Saint Augustine, vol. I, ed. W. J. Oates (Grand Rapids, Michigan: Baker Book House, 1976), p. 750.

23. Summa Theologica I-II, Q. 79, Art. 2.

24. Ibid., I, Q. 83, Art. 1, ad 3.

25. Aquinas, Summa Contra Gentiles, Book III, Ch. 88.

26. For a defense see my "Divine Sovereignty and the Freedom of the Will," Faith and Philosophy 12 (1995), 582-98; also "The Author of Sin?" Faith and Philosophy 22 (2005), 144-59.

27. This is a form of the classic objection to libertarian freedom, articulated by David Hume in A Treatise of Human Nature, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1888), Bk. II, Pt. III, Sec. II.

28. For a critical look at the idea of causal connection, see Jonathan Kvanvig's and my, "The Occasionalist Proselytizer: A Modified Catechism," in Philosophical Perspectives 5, ed. J. E. Tomberlin (Atascadero, California: Ridgeview Publishing, 1991), pp. 587-615.

29. The idea that in the first instance, damnation is not a matter of punishment but of God honoring the individual's right to self-determination is developed in Jonathan Kvanvig, The Problem of Hell(New York: Oxford University Press, 1993), Ch. 4.

30. It might be thought that Jesus' remark (Matt. 26:24) that it would have been better for his betrayer that he not have been born contradicts this. But that cannot be right, for if Judas had not existed, there would have been no "him" to refer to. It is far more plausible to take the remark as saying it would have been better for Judas had he died in his mother's womb.

31. Roderick M. Chisholm, "The Defeat of Good and Evil," Proceedings of the American Philosophical Association 42 (1968-69), pp. 21-38.

32. John Hick, Evil and the God of Love (New York: Harper & Row, 1966), pp. 292-93.

33. Ibid., pp. 359-61.

34. Ibid., pp. 289-97.

35. Cf. Mackie, "Evil and Omnipotence," pp. 205-06.

36. For contrasting views on this issue see Peter van Inwagen, “The Magnitude, Duration and Distribution of Evil: A Theodicy,” Philosophical Topics 16 (1988), 161-87; and Eleonore Stump, “Aquinas on the Sufferings of Job,” in Reasoned Faith (Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press,1993), 328-57.

37. Cf. For more on this subject see my "Pointless Suffering? How to Make the Problem of Evil Sufficiently Serious," Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, forthcoming.