Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Feb 23, 2005; substantive revision Fri Nov 13, 2009

Pythagoras, one of the most famous and controversial ancient Greek philosophers, lived from ca. 570 to ca. 490 BCE. He spent his early years on the island of Samos, off the coast of modern Turkey. At the age of forty, however, he emigrated to the city of Croton in southern Italy and most of his philosophical activity occurred there. Pythagoras wrote nothing, nor were there any detailed accounts of his thought written by contemporaries. By the first centuries BCE, moreover, it became fashionable to present Pythagoras in a largely unhistorical fashion as a semi-divine figure, who originated all that was true in the Greek philosophical tradition, including many of Plato's and Aristotle's mature ideas. A number of treatises were forged in the name of Pythagoras and other Pythagoreans in order to support this view.

The Pythagorean question, then, is how to get behind this false glorification of Pythagoras in order to determine what the historical Pythagoras actually thought and did. In order to obtain an accurate appreciation of Pythagoras' achievement, it is important to rely on the earliest evidence before the distortions of the later tradition arose. The popular modern image of Pythagoras is that of a master mathematician and scientist. The early evidence shows, however, that, while Pythagoras was famous in his own day and even 150 years later in the time of Plato and Aristotle, it was not mathematics or science upon which his fame rested. Pythagoras was famous (1) as an expert on the fate of the soul after death, who thought that the soul was immortal and went through a series of reincarnations; (2) as an expert on religious ritual; (3) as a wonder-worker who had a thigh of gold and who could be two places at the same time; (4) as the founder of a strict way of life that emphasized dietary restrictions, religious ritual and rigorous self discipline.

It remains controversial whether he also engaged in the rational cosmology that is typical of the Presocratic philosopher/scientists and whether he was in any sense a mathematician. The early evidence suggests, however, that Pythagoras presented a cosmos that was structured according to moral principles and significant numerical relationships and may have been akin to conceptions of the cosmos found in Platonic myths, such as those at the end of the Phaedo and Republic. In such a cosmos, the planets were seen as instruments of divine vengeance (“the hounds of Persephone”), the sun and moon are the isles of the blessed where we may go, if we live a good life, while thunder functioned to frighten the souls being punished in Tartarus. The heavenly bodies also appear to have moved in accordance with the mathematical ratios that govern the concordant musical intervals in order to produce a music of the heavens, which in the later tradition developed into “the harmony of the spheres.” It is doubtful that Pythagoras himself thought in terms of spheres, and the mathematics of the movements of the heavens was not worked out in detail. There is evidence that he valued relationships between numbers such as those embodied in the so-called Pythagorean theorem, though it is not likely that he proved the theorem.

Pythagoras' cosmos was developed in a more scientific and mathematical direction by his successors in the Pythagorean tradition, Philolaus and Archytas. Pythagoras succeeded in promulgating a new more optimistic view of the fate of the soul after death and in founding a way of life that was attractive for its rigor and discipline and that drew to him numerous devoted followers.

1. The Pythagorean Question

What were the beliefs and practices of the historical Pythagoras? This apparently simple question has become the daunting Pythagorean question for several reasons. First, Pythagoras himself wrote nothing, so our knowledge of Pythagoras' views is entirely derived from the reports of others. Second, there was no extensive or authoritative contemporary account of Pythagoras. No one did for Pythagoras what Plato and Xenophon did for Socrates. Third, only fragments of the first detailed accounts of Pythagoras, written about 150 years after his death, have survived. Fourth, it is clear that these accounts disagreed with one another on significant points. These four points would already make the problem of determining Pythagoras' philosophical beliefs more difficult than determining those of almost any other ancient philosopher, but a fifth factor complicates matters even more. By the third century CE, when the first detailed accounts of Pythagoras that survive intact were written, Pythagoras had come to be regarded, in some circles, as the master philosopher, from whom all that was true in the Greek philosophical tradition derived. By the end of the first century BCE, a large collection of books had been forged in the name of Pythagoras and other early Pythagoreans, which purported to be the original Pythagorean texts from which Plato and Aristotle derived their most important ideas. A treatise forged in the name of Timaeus of Locri was the supposed model for Plato's Timaeus, just as forged treatises assigned to Archytas were the supposed model for Aristotle's Categories. Pythagoras himself was widely presented as having anticipated Plato's later metaphysics, in which the one and the indefinite dyad are first principles. Thus, not only is the earliest evidence for Pythagoras' views meager and contradictory, it is overshadowed by the hagiographical presentation of Pythagoras, which became dominant in late antiquity. Given these circumstances, the only reliable approach to answering the Pythagorean question is to start with the earliest evidence, which is independent of the later attempts to glorify Pythagoras, and to use the picture of Pythagoras which emerges from this early evidence as the standard against which to evaluate what can be accepted and what must be rejected in the later tradition. Following such an approach, Walter Burkert, in his epoch-making book (1972a), revolutionized our understanding of the Pythagorean question, and all modern scholarship on Pythagoras, including this article, stands on his shoulders. For a detailed discussion of the source problems that generate the Pythagorean Question see 2. Sources, below.

2. Sources

2.1 Chronological Chart of Sources for Pythagoras

300 CE Iamblichus
(ca. 245–325 CE)
On the Pythagorean Life (extant)
(234–ca. 305 CE)
Life of Pythagoras (extant)
Diogenes Laertius
(ca. 200–250 CE)
Life of Pythagoras (extant)
200 CE Sextus Empiricus
(circa 200 CE)
(summaries of Pythagoras' philosophy in Adversus Mathematicos [Against the Theoreticians], cited below as M.)
100 CE Nicomachus
(ca. 50–150 CE)
Introduction to Arithmetic (extant), Life of Pythagoras (fragments quoted in Iamblichus etc.)
Apollonius of Tyana
(died ca. 97 CE)
Life of Pythagoras (fragments quoted in Iamblichus etc.)
Moderatus of Gades
Lectures on Pythagoreanism (fragments quoted in Porphyry)
(first century CE)
Opinions of the Philosophers (reconstructed by H. Diels from pseudo-Plutarch, Opinions of the Philosophers [2nd CE] and Stobaeus, Selections [5th CE])
Pseudo-Pythagorean texts
(starting as early as 300 BCE but most common in the first century BCE)
100 BCE Alexander Polyhistor
(b. 105 BCE)
his excerpts of the Pythagorean Memoirs are quoted by Diogenes Laertius
200 BCE Pythagorean Memoirs
(200 BCE)
(sections quoted in Diogenes Laertius)
300 BCE Timaeus of Tauromenium
350–260 BCE)
(historian of Sicily)
Academy Heraclides
(ca. 380–310)
(ca. 396–314)
(ca. 410–339)
(ca. 370–300)

400 BCE Plato
500 BCE Pythagoras

2.2 Post-Aristotelian Sources for Pythagoras

The problems regarding the sources for the life and philosophy of Pythagoras are quite complicated, but it is impossible to understand the Pythagorean Question without an accurate appreciation of at least the general nature of these problems. It is best to start with the extensive but problematic later evidence and work back to the earlier reliable evidence. The most detailed, extended and hence most influential accounts of Pythagoras' life and thought date to the third century CE, some 800 years after he died. Diogenes Laertius (ca. 200–250 CE) and Porphyry (ca. 234–305 CE) each wrote a Life of Pythagoras, while Iamblichus (ca. 245–325 CE) wrote On the Pythagorean Life, which includes some biography but focuses more on the way of life established by Pythagoras for his followers. All of these works were written at a time when Pythagoras' achievements had become considerably exaggerated. Diogenes may have some claim to objectivity, but both Iamblichus and Porphyry have strong agendas that have little to do with historical accuracy. Iamblichus presents Pythagoras as a soul sent from the gods to enlighten mankind (O'Meara 1989, 35–40). Iamblichus' work was just the first in a ten volume work, which in effect Pythagoreanized Neoplatonism, but the Pythagoreanism involved was Iamblichus' own conception of Pythagoras as particularly concerned with mathematics rather than an account of Pythagoreanism based on the earliest evidence. Porphyry also emphasizes Pythagoras' divine aspects and may be setting him up as a rival to Jesus (Iamblichus 1991, 14). These three third-century accounts of Pythagoras were in turn based on earlier sources, which are now lost. Some of these earlier sources were heavily contaminated by the Neopythagorean view of Pythagoras as the source of all true philosophy, whose ideas Plato, Aristotle and all later Greek philosophers plagiarized. Iamblichus cites both Nicomachus of Gerasa's and Apollonius of Tyana's biographies of Pythagoras (VP 251 and 254) and appears to have used them extensively even where they are not cited (Burkert 1972a, 98 ff.). Nicomachus (ca. 50 – ca. 150 CE) assigns Pythagoras a metaphysics that is patently Platonic and Aristotelian and that employs distinctive Platonic and Aristotelian terminology (Introduction to Arithmetic I.1), while Apollonius (1st CE) venerated Pythagoras as the model for his ascetic life. Porphyry (VP 48–53) explicitly cites Moderatus of Gades as one of his sources. Moderatus was an “agressive” Neopythagorean of the first century CE, who reports that Plato, Aristotle, and their pupils Speusippus, Aristoxenus and Xenocrates took for their own everything that was fruitful in Pythagoreanism, leaving only what was superficial and trivial to be ascribed to the school (Dillon 1977, 346). Diogenes Laertius, who appears to have less personal allegiance to the Pythagorean legend, bases his primary account of Pythagoras' philosophy (VIII. 24–33) on the Pythagorean Memoirs excerpted by Alexander Polyhistor, which are a forgery dating sometime around 200 BCE and which assign not just Platonic but also Stoic ideas to Pythagoras (Burkert 1972a, 53; Kahn 2001, 79–83).

In the Pythagorean Memoirs, Pythagoras is said to have adopted the Monad and the Indefinite Dyad as incorporeal principles, from which arise first the numbers, then plane and solid figures and finally the bodies of the sensible world (Diogenes Laertius VIII. 25). This is the philosophical system that is most commonly ascribed to Pythagoras in the post-Aristotelian tradition, and it is found in Sextus Empiricus' (2nd century CE) detailed accounts of Pythagoreanism (e.g., M. X. 261) and most significantly in the influential handbook of the differing opinions of the Greek philosophers, which was compiled by Aetius in the first century CE and goes back to Aristotle's pupil Theophrastus (e.g., H. Diels, Doxographi Graeci I. 3.8). The testimony of Aristotle makes completely clear, however, that this was the philosophical system of Plato in his later years and not that of Pythagoras or even the later Pythagoreans. Aristotle is explicit that the indefinite dyad is unique to Plato (Metaphysics 987b26 ff.) and that the Pythagoreans recognized only the sensible world and hence did not derive it from immaterial principles. Although Theophrastus usually follows his teacher Aristotle quite closely in his reports of the views of the early Greek philosophers, in this case he appears to agree with the later tradition in ascribing late Platonic metaphysics to Pythagoras. How are we to explain this divergence from the Aristotelian view? It appears that, for reasons which are not entirely clear, Plato's successors in the Academy, Speusippus, Xenocrates and Heraclides, chose to present late Platonic metaphysics as a mere development of Pythagoreanism and that Theophrastus chose to follow this tradition. In the Philebus, Plato himself, while acknowledging a debt to the philosophy of limiters and unlimiteds, which is found in Aristotle's accounts of Pythagoreanism and in the fragments of the fifth-century Pythagorean Philolaus, makes clear that this is a considerably earlier philosophy, which he is completely reworking for his own purposes (16c ff.; see Huffman 1999a and 2001). The crucial and striking point is that the tradition which falsely ascribes Plato's late metaphysics to Pythagoras begins not with the Neopythagoreans in the first centuries BCE and CE but already in the fourth century BCE among Plato's own pupils (Burkert 1972a, 53–83; Dillon 2003, 61–62 and 153–154). Aristotle's careful distinctions between Plato and fifth-century Pythagoreanism, which make excellent sense in terms of the general development of Greek philosophy, are largely ignored in the later tradition in favor of the more sensational ascription of mature Platonism to Pythagoras.

If we step back for a minute and compare the sources for Pythagoras with those available for other early Greek philosophers, the extent of the difficulties inherent in the Pythagorean Question becomes clear. When trying to reconstruct the philosophy of Heraclitus, for example, modern scholars rely above all on the actual quotations from Heraclitus' book preserved in later authors. Since Pythagoras wrote no books, this most fundamental of all sources is denied us. In dealing with Heraclitus, the modern scholar turns with reluctance next to the doxographical tradition, the tradition represented by Aetius in the first century CE, which preserves in handbook form a systematic account of the beliefs of the Greek philosophers on a series of topics having to do with the physical world and its first principles. Aetius' work has been reconstructed by Hermann Diels on the basis of two later works, which were derived from it, the Selections of Stobaeus (5th century CE) and the Opinions of Philosophers by pseudo-Plutarch (2nd century CE). Scholars' faith in this evidence is largely based on the assumption that most of it goes back to Aristotle's school and in particular to Theophrastus' Tenets of the Natural Philosophers. Here again the case of Pythagoras is exceptional. Pythagoras is represented in this tradition but, as we have seen, Theophrastus in this case adopted the view of Pythagoras promulgated by Plato's successors in the early Academy, a view that, against all historical plausibility, assigns Plato's later metaphysics to Pythagoras. This is a view which is explicitly rejected by Theophrastus' teacher Aristotle. Thus, the second standard source for evidence for early Greek philosophy is, in the case of Pythagoras, tainted at the source. Whatever views Pythagoras might have had are replaced by late Platonic metaphysics in the doxographical tradition.

A third source of evidence for early Greek philosophy is regarded with great skepticism by most scholars and, in the case of most early Greek philosophers, used only with great caution. This is the biographical tradition represented by the Lives of the Philosophers written by Diogenes Laertius. In this case we at first sight appear to be in luck, at least with regard to the amount of evidence for Pythagoras, since, as we have seen, two major accounts of the life of Pythagoras and the Pythagorean way of life survive in addition to Diogenes' life. Unfortunately, these two additional lives are written by authors (Iamblichus and Porphyry) whose goal is explicitly non-historical, and all three of the lives rely heavily on authors in the Neopythagorean tradition, whose goal was to show that all later Greek philosophy, insofar as it was true, had been stolen from Pythagoras. There are, however, some sections in these three lives that derive from sources that go back beyond the distorting influence of Neopythagoreanism, to sources in the fourth-century BCE, sources which are also independent of the early Academy's attempt to assign Platonic metaphysics to the Pythagoreans. The most important of these sources are the fragments of Aristotle's lost treatises on the Pythagoreans and the fragments of works on Pythagoreanism or of works which dealt in passing with Pythagoreanism written by Aristotle's pupils Dicaearchus and Aristoxenus, in the second half of the fourth century BCE. The historian Timaeus of Tauromenium (ca. 350–260 BCE), who wrote a history of Sicily, which included material on southern Italy where Pythagoras was active, is also important. In some cases, the fragments of these early works are clearly identified in the later lives, but in other cases we may suspect that they are the source of a given passage without being able to be certain. Large problems remain even in the case of these sources. They were all written 150–250 years after the death of Pythagoras; given the lack of written evidence for Pythagoras, they are based largely on oral traditions. Aristoxenus, who grew up in the southern Italian town of Tarentum, where the Pythagorean Archytas was the dominant political figure, and who was himself a Pythagorean before joining Aristotle's school, undoubtedly had a rich set of oral traditions upon which to draw. It is clear, nonetheless, that 150 years after his death conflicting traditions regarding Pythagoras' beliefs had arisen on even the most central issues. Thus, Aristoxenus is emphatic that Pythagoras was not a strict vegetarian and ate a number of types of meat (Diogenes Laertius VIII. 20), whereas Aristoxenus' contemporary, the mathematician Eudoxus, portrays him not only as avoiding all meat but as even refusing to associate with butchers (Porphyry, VP 7). Even among fourth-century authors that had at least some pretensions to historical accuracy and who had access to the best information available, there are widely divergent presentations, simply because such contradictions were endemic to the evidence available in the fourth century. What we can hope to obtain from the evidence presented by Aristotle, Aristoxenus, Dicaearchus, and Timaeus is thus not a picture of Pythagoras that is consistent in all respects but rather a picture that at least defines the main areas of his achievement. This picture can then be tested by the most fundamental evidence of all, the testimony of authors that precede even Aristotle, testimony in some cases that derives from Pythagoras' own contemporaries. This testimony is extremely limited, about twenty brief references, but this dearth of evidence is not unique to Pythagoras. The pre-Aristotelian testimony for Pythagoras is more extensive than for most other early Greek philosophers and is thus testimony to his fame.

2.3 Plato and Aristotle as Sources for Pythagoras

In reconstructing the thought of early Greek philosophers, scholars often turn to Aristotle's and Plato's accounts of their predecessors, although Plato's accounts are embedded in the literary structure of his dialogues and thus do not pretend to historical accuracy, while Aristotle's apparently more historical presentation masks a considerable amount of reinterpretation of his predecessors' views in terms of his own thought. In the case of Pythagoras, what is striking is the essential agreement of Plato and Aristotle in their presentation of his significance. Aristotle frequently discusses the philosophy of Pythagoreans, whom he dates to the middle and second half of the fifth century and who posited limiters and unlimiteds as first principles. He refers to these Pythagoreans as the “so-called Pythagoreans,” suggesting that he had some reservations about the application of the label “Pythagorean” to them. Aristotle strikingly never refers to Pythagoras himself in his extant writings (Metaph. 986a29 is an interpolation; Rh. 1398b14 is a quotation from Alcidamas; MM 1182a11 may not be by Aristotle and, if it is, may well be a case where “Pythagoreans” have been turned into “Pythagoras” in the transmission). In the fragments of his now lost two-book treatise on the Pythagoreans, Aristotle does discuss Pythagoras himself, but the references are all to Pythagoras as a founder of a way of life, who forbade the eating of beans (Fr. 195), and to Pythagoras as a wonder-worker, who had a golden thigh and bit a snake to death (Fr. 191). If this is the only type of material that Aristotle is willing to ascribe to Pythagoras himself, it becomes clear why he never mentions Pythagoras in his account of his philosophical predecessors and why he uses the expression “so-called Pythagoreans” to refer to the Pythagoreanism of the fifth-century. For Aristotle Pythagoras did not belong to the succession of thinkers starting with Thales, who were attempting to explain the basic principles of the natural world, and hence he could not see what sense it made to call a fifth-century thinker like Philolaus, who joined that succession by positing limiters and unlimiteds as first principles, a Pythagorean. Plato is often thought to be heavily indebted to the Pythagoreans, but he is almost as parsimonious in his references to Pythagoras as Aristotle and mentions him only once in his writings. Plato's one reference to Pythagoras (R. 600a) treats him as the founder of a way of life, just as Aristotle does, and, when Plato traces the history of philosophy prior to his time in the Sophist, (242c-e), there is no allusion to Pythagoras. In the Philebus, Plato does describe the philosophy of limiters and unlimiteds, which Aristotle assigns to the so-called Pythagoreans of the fifth century and which is found in the fragments of Philolaus, but like Aristotle he does not ascribe this philosophy to Pythagoras himself. Scholars, both ancient and modern, under the influence of the later glorification of Pythagoras, have supposed that the Prometheus, whom Plato describes as hurling the system down to men, was Pythagoras (e.g., Kahn 2002: 13–14), but careful reading of the passage shows that Prometheus is just Prometheus and that Plato, like Aristotle, assigns the philosophical system to a group of men (Huffman 1999a, 2001). The fragments of Philolaus show that he was the primary figure of this group. When Plato refers to Philolaus in the Phaedo (61d-e), he does not identify him as a Pythagorean, so that once again Plato agrees with Aristotle in distancing the “so-called Pythagoreans” of the fifth century from Pythagoras himself. For both Plato and Aristotle, then, Pythagoras is not a part of the cosmological and metaphysical tradition of Presocratic philosophy nor is he closely connected to the metaphysical system presented by fifth-century Pythagoreans like Philolaus; he is instead the founder of a way of life.

3. Life and Works

References to Pythagoras by Xenophanes (ca. 570–475 BCE) and Heraclitus (fl. ca. 500 BCE) show that he was a famous figure in the late sixth and early fifth centuries. For the details of his life we have to rely on fourth-century sources such as Aristoxenus, Dicaearchus and Timaeus of Tauromenium. There is a great deal of controversy about his origin and early life, but there is agreement that he grew up on the island of Samos, near the birthplace of Greek philosophy, Miletus, on the coast of Asia Minor. There are a number of reports that he traveled widely in the Near East while living on Samos, e.g., to Babylonia, Phoenicia and Egypt. To some extent reports of these trips are an attempt to claim the ancient wisdom of the east for Pythagoras, but relatively early sources such as Herodotus (II. 81) and Isocrates (Busiris 28) associate Pythagoras with Egypt, so that a trip there seems quite plausible. Aristoxenus says that he left Samos at the age of forty, when the tyranny of Polycrates, who came to power ca. 535 BCE, became unbearable (Porphyry, VP 9). This chronology would suggest that he was born ca. 570 BCE. He then emigrated to the Greek city of Croton in southern Italy ca. 530 BCE; it is in Croton that he first seems to have attracted a large number of followers to his way of life. There are a variety of stories about his death, but the most reliable evidence (Aristoxenus and Dicaearchus) suggests that violence directed against Pythagoras and his followers in Croton ca. 510 BCE, perhaps because of the exclusive nature of the Pythagorean way of life, led him to flee to another Greek city in southern Italy, Metapontum, where he died around 490 BCE (Porphyry, VP 54–7; Iamblichus, VP 248 ff.; On the chronology, see Minar 1942, 133–5). There is little else about his life of which we can be confident.

The evidence suggests that Pythagoras did not write any books. No source contemporaneous with Pythagoras or in the first two hundred years after his death, including Plato, Aristotle and their immediate successors in the Academy and Lyceum, quotes from a work by Pythagoras or gives any indication that any works written by him were in existence. Several later sources explicitly assert that Pythagoras wrote nothing (e.g., Lucian [Slip of the Tongue, 5], Josephus, Plutarch and Posidonius in DK 14A18; see Burkert 1972, 218–9). Diogenes Laertius tried to dispute this tradition by quoting Heraclitus' assertion that “Pythagoras, the son of Mnesarchus, practiced inquiry most of all men and, by selecting these things which have been written up, made for himself a wisdom, a polymathy, an evil conspiracy” (Fr. 129). This fragment shows only that Pythagoras read the writings of others, however, and says nothing about him writing something of his own. The wisdom and evil conspiracy that Pythagoras constructs from these writings need not have been in writing, and Heraclitus' description of it as an “evil conspiracy” rather suggests that it was not (For the translation and interpretation of Fr. 129, see Huffman 2008b). In the later tradition several books came to be ascribed to Pythagoras, but such evidence as exists for these books indicates that they were forged in Pythagoras' name and belong with the large number of pseudo-Pythagorean treatises forged in the name of early Pythagoreans such as Philolaus and Archytas. In the third century BCE a group of three books were circulating in Pythagoras' name, On Education, On Statesmanship, and On Nature (Diogenes Laertius, VIII. 6). A letter from Plato to Dion asking him to purchase these three books from Philolaus was forged in order to “authenticate” them (Burkert 1972a, 223–225). Heraclides Lembus in the second century BCE gives a list of six books ascribed to Pythagoras (Diogenes Laertius, VIII. 7; Thesleff 1965, 155–186 provides a complete collection of the spurious writings assigned to Pythagoras). The second of these is a Sacred Discourse, which some have wanted to trace back to Pythagoras himself. The idea that Pythagoras wrote such a Sacred Discourse seems to arise from a misreading of the early evidence. Herodotus says that the Pythagoreans agreed with the Egyptians in not allowing the dead to be buried in wool and then asserts that there is a sacred discourse about this (II. 81). Herodotus' focus here is the Egyptians and not the Pythagoreans, who are introduced as a Greek parallel, so that the Sacred Discourse to which he refers is Egyptian and not Pythagorean, as similar passages elsewhere in Book II of Herodotus show (e.g., II. 62; see Burkert 1972a, 219).Various lines of hexameter verse were already circulating in Pythagoras' name in the third century BCE and were later combined into a compilation known as the Golden Verses, which marks the culmination of the tradition of a Sacred Discourse assgined to Pythagoras (Burkert 1972a, 219, Thesleff 1965, 158–163; and most recently Thom 1995, although his dating of the compilation before 300 BCE is questionable). The lack of any viable written text which could be reasonably ascribed to Pythagoras is shown most clearly by the tendency of later authors to quote either Empedocles or Plato, when they needed to quote “Pythagoras” (e.g., Sextus Empiricus, M. IX. 126–30; Nicomachus, Introduction to Arithmetic I. 2). For an interesting but ultimately unconvincing attempt to argue that the historical Pythagoras did write books, see Riedweg 2005, 42–43 and the response by Huffman 2008a, 205–207.

4. The Philosophy of Pythagoras

For the reasons given in 1. The Pythagorean Question and 2. Sources above, the following account of Pythagoras' philosophy is based in the first place on the evidence prior to Aristotle and in the second place on evidence that our sources explicitly identify as deriving from Aristotle's books on the Pythagoreans as well as from the books of his pupils such as Aristoxenus and Dicaearchus. One of the manifestations of the attempt to glorify Pythagoras in the later tradition is the report that he, in fact, invented the word philosophy. This story goes back to the early Academy, since it is first found in Heraclides of Pontus (Cicero, Tusc. V 3.8; Diogenes Laertius, Proem). The story depends on a conception of a philosopher as having no knowledge but being situated between ignorance and knowledge and striving for knowledge. Such a conception is thoroughly Platonic, however, (see, e.g., Symposium 204A) and Burkert demonstrated that it could not belong to the historical Pythagoras (1960). For a recent attempt to defend at least the partial accuracy of the story, see Riedweg 2005: 90–97 and the response by Huffman 2008a:207–208.

4.1 The Fate of the Soul—Metempsychosis

The earliest evidence makes clear that above all Pythagoras was known as an expert on the fate of our soul after death. Herodotus tells the story of the Thracian Zalmoxis, who taught his countrymen that they would never die but instead go to a place where they would eternally possess all good things (IV. 95). Among the Greeks the tradition arose that this Zalmoxis was the slave of Pythagoras. Herodotus himself thinks that Zalmoxis lived long before Pythagoras, but the Greeks' willingness to portray Zalmoxis as Pythagoras' slave shows that they thought of Pythagoras as the expert from whom Zalmoxis derived his teaching. Ion of Chios (5th c. BCE) says of Phercydes of Syros that “although dead he has a pleasant life for his soul, if Pythagoras is truly wise, who knew and learned wisdom beyond all men.” Here Pythagoras is again the expert on the life of the soul after death. A famous fragment of Xenophanes, Pythagoras' contemporary, provides some more specific information on what happens to the soul after death. He reports that “once when he [Pythagoras] was present at the beating of a puppy, he pitied it and said ‘stop, don't keep hitting him, since it is the soul of a man who is dear to me, which I recognized, when I heard it yelping’” (Fr. 7). Although Xenophanes clearly finds the idea ridiculous, the fragment shows that Pythagoras believed in metempsychosis or reincarnation, according to which human souls were reborn into other animals after death. This early evidence is emphatically confirmed by Dicaearchus in the fourth century, who first comments on the difficulty of determining what Pythagoras taught and then asserts that his most recognized doctrines were “that the soul is immortal and that it transmigrates into other kinds of animals” (Porphyry, VP 19). Unfortunately we can say little more about the details of Pythagoras' conception of metempsychosis. According to Herodotus, the Egyptians believed that the soul was reborn as every sort of animal before returning to human form after 3,000 years. Without naming names, he reports that some Greeks both earlier and later adopted this doctrine; this seems very likely to be a reference to Pythagoras (earlier) and perhaps Empedocles (later). Many doubt that Herodotus is right to assign metempsychosis to the Egyptians, since none of the other evidence we have for Egyptian beliefs supports his claim, but it is nonetheless clear that we cannot assume that Pythagoras accepted the details of the view Herodotus ascribes to them. Similarly both Empedocles (see Inwood 2001, 55–68) and Plato (e.g., Republic X and Phaedrus) provide a more detailed account of transmigration of souls, but neither of them ascribes these details to Pythagoras nor should we. Did he think that we ever escape the cycle of reincarnations? We simply do not know. The fragment of Ion quoted above may suggest that the soul could have a pleasant existence after death between reincarnations or even escape the cycle of reincarnation altogether, but the evidence is too weak to be confident in such a conclusion. In the fourth century several authors report that Pythagoras remembered his previous human incarnations, but the accounts do not agree on the details. Dicaearchus (Aulus Gellius IV. 11.14) and Heraclides (Diogenes Laertius VIII. 4) agree that he was the Trojan hero Euphorbus in a previous life. Dicaearchus is probably having fun, when he suggests that Pythagoras was the beautiful prostitute, Alco, in another incarnation.

It is not clear how Pythagoras conceived of the nature of the transmigrating soul but a few tentative conclusions can be drawn (Huffman 2009). Transmigration does not require that the soul be immortal; it could go through several incarnations before perishing. Dicaearchus explicitly says that Pythagoras regarded the soul as immortal, however, and this agrees with Herodotus' description of Zalmoxis' view. It is likely that he used the Greek word psychê to refer to the transmigrating soul, since this is the word used by all sources reporting his views, unlike Empedocles, who used daimon. His successor, Philoalus, uses psychê to refer not to a comprehensive soul but rather to just one psychic faculty, the seat of emotions, which is located in the heart along with the faculty of sensation (Philolaus, Fr. 13). This psychê is explicitly said by Philolaus to be shared with animals. Herodotus uses psychê in a similar way to refer to the seat of emotions. Thus it seems likely that Pythagoras too thought of the transmigrating psychê in this way. If so, it is unlikely that Pythagoras thought that humans could be reincarnated as plants, since psychê is not assigned to plants by Philolaus. It has often been assumed that the transmigrating soul is immaterial, but Philolaus seems to have a materialistic conception of soul and he may be following Pythagoras. Similarly, it is doubtful that Pythagoras thought of the transmigrating soul as a comprehensive soul that includes all psychic faculties. His ability to recognize something distinctive of his friend in the puppy (if this is not pushing the evidence of a joke too far) and to remember his own previous incarnations show that personal identity was preserved through incarnations. This personal identity could well be contained in the pattern of emotions, that constitute a person's character and that is preserved in the psychê and need not presuppose all psychic faculties. In Philolaus this psychê explicitly does not include the nous (intellect), which is not shared with animals. Thus, it would appear that what is shared with animals and which led Pythagoras to suppose that they had special kinship with human beings (Dicaearchus in Porphyry, VP 19) is not intellect, as some have supposed (Sorabji 1993, 78 and 208) but rather the ability to feel emotions such as pleasure and pain.

It is crucial to recognize that most Greeks followed Homer in believing that the soul was an insubstantial shade, which lived a shadowy existence in the underworld after death, an existence so bleak that Achilles famously asserts that he would rather be the lowest mortal on earth than king of the dead (Homer, Odyssey IX. 489). Pythagoras' teachings that the soul was immortal, would have other physical incarnations and might have a good existence after death were striking innovations that must have had considerable appeal in comparison to the Homeric view. According to Dicaearchus, in addition to the immortality of the soul and reincarnation, Pythagoras believed that “after certain periods of time the things that have happened once happen again and nothing is absolutely new” (Porphyry, VP 19). This doctrine of “eternal recurrence” is also attested by Aristotle's pupil Eudemus (Fr. 88 Wehrli). The doctrine of transmigration thus seems to have been extended to include the idea that we and indeed the whole world will be reborn into lives that are exactly the same as those we are living and have already lived.

4.2 Pythagoras as a Wonder-worker

Some have wanted to relegate the more miraculous features of Pythagoras' persona to the later tradition, but these characteristics figure prominently in the earliest evidence and are thus central to understanding Pythagoras. Aristotle emphasized his superhuman nature in the following ways: there was a story that Pythagoras had a golden thigh (a sign of divinity); the people of Croton called him the Hyperborean Apollo (one of the god Apollo's manifestations); the Pythagoreans taught that “of rational beings, one sort is divine, one is human, and another such as Pythagoras” (Iamblichus, VP 31); Pythagoras was seen on the same day at the same time in both Metapontum and Croton; he killed a deadly snake by biting it; as he was crossing a river it spoke to him (all citations are from Aristotle, Fr. 191, unless otherwise noted). There is a clear parallel for these remarkable abilities in the later figure of Empedocles, who promises to teach his pupils to control the winds and bring the dead back to life (Fr. 111). There are recognizable traces of this tradition about Pythagoras even in the pre-Aristotelian evidence, and his wonder-working clearly evoked diametrically opposed reactions. Heraclitus' description of Pythagoras as “the chief of the charlatans” (Fr. 81) and of his wisdom as “fraudulent art” (Fr. 129) is most easily understood as an unsympathetic reference to his miracles. Empedocles, on the other hand, is clearly sympathetic to Pythagoras, when he describes him as “ a man who knew remarkable things” and who “possessed the greatest wealth of intelligence” and again probably makes reference to his wonder-working by calling him “accomplished in all sorts of wise deeds” (Fr. 129). In Herodotus' report, Zalmoxis, whom some of the Greeks identified as the slave and pupil of Pythagoras, tried to gain authority for his teachings about the fate of the soul by claiming to have journeyed to the next world (IV. 95). The skeptical tradition represented in Herodotus' report treats this as a ruse on Zalmoxis' part; he had not journeyed to the next world but had in reality hidden in an underground dwelling for three years. Similarly Pythagoras may have claimed authority for his teachings concerning the fate of our soul on the basis of his remarkable abilities and experiences, and there is some evidence that he too claimed to have journeyed to the underworld and that this journey may have been transferred from Pythagoras to Zalmoxis (Burkert 1972a,154 ff.).

4.3 The Pythagorean Way of Life

The testimony of both Plato (R. 600a) and Isocrates (Busiris 28) shows that Pythagoras was above all famous for having left behind him a way of life, which still had adherents in the fourth century over 100 years after his death. It is plausible to assume that many features of this way of life were designed to insure the best possible future reincarnations, but it is important to remember that nothing in the early evidence connects the way of life to reincarnation in any specific fashion. Pythagoras' beliefs about the soul and his way of life, which is described below, show interesting similarities to a Greek religious movement known as Orphism, but the evidence for Orphism is at least as complicated as that for Pythagoras and complicates rather than clarifies our understanding of Pythagoras (for detailed dicussion, see Burkert 1972a, 125 ff.; Kahn 2002, 19–22; Riedweg 2002).

One of the clearest strands in the early evidence for Pythagoras is his expertise in religious ritual. Isocrates emphasizes that “he more conspicuously than others paid attention to sacrifices and rituals in temples” (Busiris 28). Herodotus describes Pythagorean practices as “rituals” and gives as an example that the Pythagoreans agree with the Egyptians in not allowing the dead to be buried in wool (II. 81). It is not surprising that Pythagoras, as an expert on the fate of the soul after death. should also be an expert on the religious rituals surrounding death. A significant part of the Pythagorean way of life thus consisted in the proper observance of religious ritual. One major piece of evidence for this emphasis on ritual is the acusmata (“things heard”), short maxims that were handed down orally. The earliest source to quote acusmata is Aristotle, in the fragments of his now lost treatise on the Pythagoreans. It is not always possible to be certain which of the acusmata quoted in the later tradition go back to Aristotle and which of the ones that do go back to Pythagoras. Most of Iamblichus' examples in sections 82–86 of On the Pythagorean Life, however, appear to derive from Aristotle (Burkert 1972a, 166 ff.), and many are in accord with the early evidence we have for Pythagoras' interest in ritual. Thus the acusmata advise Pythagoreans to pour libations to the gods from the ear (i.e., the handle) of the cup, to refrain from wearing the images of the gods on their fingers, not to sacrifice a white cock, and to sacrifice and enter the temple barefoot. A number of these practices can be paralleled in Greek mystery religions of the day (Burkert 1972a, 177).

A second characteristic of the Pythagorean way of life was the emphasis on dietary restrictions. There is no direct evidence for these restrictions in the pre-Aristotelian evidence, but both Aristotle and Aristoxenus discuss them extensively. Unfortunately the evidence is contradictory and it is difficult to establish any points with certainty. One might assume that Pythagoras advocated vegetarianism on the basis of his belief in metempsychosis, as did Empedocles after him (Fr. 137). Indeed, the fourth-century mathematician and philosopher Eudoxus says that “he not only abstained from animal food but would also not come near butchers and hunters” (Porphyry, VP 7). According to Dicaearchus, one of Pythagoras' most well-known doctrines was that “all animate beings are of the same family” (Porphyry, VP 19), which suggests that we should be as hesitant about eating other animals as other humans. Unfortunately, Aristotle reports that “the Pythagoreans refrain from eating the womb and the heart, the sea anemone and some other such things but use all other animal food” (Aulus Gellius IV. 11. 11–12). This makes it sound as if Pythagoras forbade the eating of just certain parts of animals and certain species of animals rather than all animals; such specific prohibitions are easy to parallel elsewhere in Greek ritual (Burkert 1972a, 177). Aristoxenus asserts that Pythagoras only refused to eat plough oxen and rams (Diogenes Laertius VIII. 20) and that he was fond of young kids and suckling pigs as food (Aulus Gellius IV. 11. 6). Some have tried to argue that Aristoxenus is refashioning Pythagoreanism in order to make it more rational, but this does not explain Aristotle's testimony or many of the acusmata. Certainly animal sacrifice was the central act of Greek religious worship and to abolish it completely would be a radical step. The acusma reported by Aristotle, in response to the question “what is most just?” has Pythagoras answer “to sacrifice” (Iamblichus, VP 82). Based on the direct evidence for Pythagoras' practice in Aristotle and Aristoxenus, it seems most prudent to conclude that he did not forbid the eating of all animal food. The later tradition proposes a number of ways to reconcile metempsychosis with the eating of some meat. Pythagoras may have adopted one of these positions, but no certainty is possible. For example, he may have argued that it was legitimate to kill and eat sacrificial animals, on the grounds that the souls of men do not enter into these animals (Iamblichus, VP 85). Perhaps the most famous of the Pythagorean dietary restrictions is the prohibition on eating beans, which is first attested by Aristotle and assigned to Pythagoras himself (Diogenes Laertius VIII. 34). Aristotle suggests a number of explanations including one that connects beans with Hades, hence suggesting a possible connection with the doctrine of metempsychosis. A number of later sources suggest that it was believed that souls returned to earth to be reincarnated through beans (Burkert 1972a, 183). There is also a physiological explanation. Beans, which are difficult to digest, disturb our abilities to concentrate. Moreover, the beans involved are a European vetch (Vicia faba) rather than the beans commonly eaten today. Certain people with an inherited blood abnormality develop a serious disorder called favism, if they eat these beans or even inhale their pollen. Aristoxenus interestingly denies that Pythagoras forbade the eating of beans and says that “he valued it most of all vegetables, since it was digestible and laxative” (Aulus Gellius IV. 11.5). The discrepancies between the various fourth-century accounts of the Pythagorean way of life suggest that there were disputes among fourth-century Pythagoreans as to the proper way of life and as to the teachings of Pythagoras himself.

The acusmata indicate that the Pythagorean way of life embodied a strict regimen not just regarding religious ritual and diet but also in almost every aspect of life. Some of the restrictions appear to be largely arbitrary taboos, e.g., “one must put the right shoe on first” or “one must not travel the public roads” (Iamblichus, VP 83, probably from Aristotle). On the other hand, some aspects of the Pythagorean life involved a moral discipline that was greatly admired, even by outsiders. Pythagorean silence is an important example. Isocrates reports that even in the fourth century people “marvel more at the silence of those who profess to be his pupils than at those who have the greatest reputation for speaking” (Busiris 28). The ability to remain silent was seen as important training in self-control, and the later tradition reports that those who wanted to become Pythagoreans had to observe a five-year silence (Iamblichus, VP 72). Isocrates is contrasting the marvelous self-control of Pythagorean silence with the emphasis on public speaking in traditional Greek education. Pythagoreans also displayed great loyalty to their friends as can be seen in Aristoxenus' story of Damon who is willing to stand surety for his friend Phintias, who has been sentenced to death (Iamblichus, VP 233 ff.). In addition to silence as a moral discipline, there is early evidence that secrecy was kept about certain of the teachings of Pythagoras. Aristoxenus reports that the Pythagoreans thought that “not all things were to be spoken to all people” (Diogenes Laertius, VIII. 15) and Dicaearchus complains that it is not easy to say what Pythagoras taught his pupils because they observed no ordinary silence about it (Porphyry, VP 19). Indeed, one would expect that an exclusive society such as that of the Pythagoreans would have secret doctrines and symbols. Aristotle says that the Pythagoreans “guarded among their very secret doctrines that one type of rational being is divine, one human, and one such as Pythagoras” (Iamblichus, VP 31). That there should be secret teachings about the special nature and authority of the master is not surprising. This does not mean, however, that all Pythagorean philosophy was secret. Aristotle discusses the fifth-century metaphysical system of Philolaus in some detail with no hint that there was anything secret about it, and Plato's discussion of Pythagorean harmonic theory in Book VII of the Republic gives no suggestion of any secrecy. Aristotle singles out the acusma quoted above (Iamblichus, VP 31) as secret, but this statement in itself implies that others were not. The idea that all of Pythagoras' teachings were secret was used in the later tradition to explain the lack of Pythagorean writings and to try to validate forged documents as recently discovered secret treatises.

The testimony of fourth-century authors such as Aristoxenus and Dicaearchus indicates that the Pythagoreans also had an important impact on the politics and society of the Greek cities in southern Italy. Dicaearchus reports that, upon his arrival in Croton, Pythagoras gave a speech to the elders and that the leaders of the city then asked him to speak to the young men of the town, the boys and the women (Porphyry, VP 18). Women, indeed, may have played an unusually large role in Pythagoreanism, since both Timaeus and Dicaearchus report on the fame of Pythagorean women including Pythagoras' daughter (Porphyry, VP 4 and 19). The acusmata teach men to honor their wives and to beget children in order to insure worship for the gods (Iamblichus, VP 84–6). Dicaearchus reports that the teaching of Pythagoras was largely unknown, so that Dicaearchus cannot have known of the content of the speech to the women or of any of the other speeches; the speeches presented in Iamblichus (VP 37–57) are thus likely to be later forgeries (Burkert 1972a, 115). The attacks on the Pythagoreans both in Pythagoras' own day and in the middle of the fifth century are presented by Dicaearchus and Aristoxenus as having a wide-reaching impact on Greek society in southern Italy; the historian Polybius (II. 39) reports that the deaths of the Pythagoreans meant that “the leading citizens of each city were destroyed,” which clearly indicates that many Pythagoreans had positions of political authority. On the other hand, it is noteworthy that Plato explicitly presents Pythagoras as a private rather than a public figure (R. 600a). It seems most likely that the Pythagorean societies were in essence private associations but that they also could function as political clubs, while not being a political party in the modern sense; their political impact should perhaps be better compared to modern fraternal organizations such as the Masons. See further Burkert 1972a, 115 ff., von Fritz 1940, and Minar 1942.

5. Was Pythagoras a Mathematician or Cosmologist?

In the modern world Pythagoras is most of all famous as a mathematician, because of the theorem named after him, and secondarily as a cosmologist, because of the striking view of a universe ascribed to him in the later tradition, in which the heavenly bodies produce “the music of the spheres” by their movements. It should be clear from the discussion above that, while the early evidence shows that Pythagoras was indeed one of the most famous early Greek thinkers, there is no indication in that evidence that his fame was primarily based on mathematics or cosmology. Neither Plato nor Aristotle treats Pythagoras as having contributed to the development of Presocratic cosmology, although Aristotle in particular discusses the topic in some detail in the first book of the Metaphysics and elsewhere. Aristotle evidently knows of no cosmology of Pythagoras that antedates the cosmological system of the “so-called Pythagoreans,” which he dates to the middle of the fifth century, and which is found in the fragments of Philolaus. There is also no mention of Pythagoras' work in geometry or of the Pythagorean theorem in the early evidence. Dicaearchus comments that “what he said to his associates no one can say reliably,” but then identifies four doctrines that became well known: 1) that the soul is immortal; 2) that it transmigrates into other kinds of animals; 3) that after certain intervals the things that have happened once happen again, so that nothing is completely new; 4) that all animate beings belong to the same family (Porphyry, VP 19). Thus, for Dicaearchus too, it is not as a mathematician or Presocratic writer on nature that Pythagoras is famous. It might not be too surprising that Plato, Aristotle and Dicaearchus do not mention Pythagoras' work in mathematics, because they are not primarily dealing with the history of mathematics. On the other hand, Aristotle's pupil Eudemus did write a history of geometry in the fourth century and what we find in Eudemus is very significant. A substantial part of Eudemus' overview of the early history of Greek geometry is preserved in the prologue to Proclus' commentary on Book One of Euclid's Elements (p. 65, 12 ff.), which was written much later, in the fifth century CE. At first sight, it appears that Eudemus did assign Pythagoras a significant place in the history of geometry. Eudemus is reported as beginning with Thales and an obscure figure named Mamercus, but the third person mentioned by Proclus in this report is Pythagoras, immediately before Anaxagoras. There is no mention of the Pythagorean theorem, but Pythagoras is said to have transformed the philosophy of geometry into a form of liberal education, to have investigated its theorems in an immaterial and intellectual way and specifically to have discovered the study of irrational magnitudes and the construction of the five regular solids. Unfortunately close examination of the section on Pythagoras in Proclus' prologue reveals numerous difficulties and shows that it comes not from Eudemus but from Iamblichus with some additions by Proclus himself (Burkert 1972a, 409 ff.). The first clause is taken word for word from Iamblichus' On Common Mathematical Science (p. 70.1 Festa). Proclus elsewhere quotes long passages from Iamblichus and is doing the same here. As Burkert points out, however, as soon as we recognize that Proclus has inserted a passage from Iamblichus into Eudemus' history, we must also recognize that Proclus was driven to do so by the lack of any mention of Pythagoras in Eudemus. Thus, not only is Pythagoras not commonly known as a geometer in the time of Plato and Aristotle, but also the most authoritative history of early Greek geometry assigns him no role in the history of geometry at all. According to Proclus, Eudemus did report that two propositions, which are later found in Euclid's Elements, were discoveries of the Pythagoreans (Proclus 379 and 419). Eudemus does not assign the discoveries to any specific Pythagorean, and they are hard to date. The discoveries might be as early as Hippasus in the middle of the fifth century, who is associated with a group of Pythagoreans known as the mathematici, who arose after Pythagoras' death (see below). The crucial point to note is that Eudemus does not assign these discoveries to Pythagoras himself. The first Pythagorean whom we can confidently identify as an accomplished mathematician is Archytas in the late fifth and the first half of the fourth century.

Are we to conclude, then, that Pythagoras had nothing to do with mathematics or cosmology? The evidence is not quite that simple. The tradition regarding Pythagoras' connection to the Pythagorean theorem reveals the complexity of the problem. None of the early sources, including Plato, Aristotle and their pupils shows any knowledge of Pythagoras' connection to the theorem. Almost a thousand years later, in the fifth century CE, Proclus, in his commentary on Euclid's proof of the theorem (Elements I. 47), gives the following report: “If we listen to those who wish to investigate ancient history, it is possible to find them referring this theorem back to Pythagoras and saying that he sacrificed an ox upon its discovery” (426.6). Proclus gives no indication of his source, but a number of other late reports (Diogenes Laertius VIII. 12; Athenaeus 418f; Plutarch, Moralia 1094b) show that it ultimately relied on two lines of verse whose context is unknown: “When Pythagoras found that famous diagram, in honor of which he offered a glorious sacrifice of oxen...” The author of these verses is variously identified as Apollodorus the calculator or Apollodorus the arithmetician. This Apollodorus probably dates before Cicero, who alludes to the story (On the Nature of the Gods III. 88), and, if he can be identified with Apollodorus of Cyzicus, the follower of Democritus, the story would go back to the fourth century BCE (Burkert 1972a, 428). Two lines of poetry of indeterminate date are obviously a very slender support upon which to base Pythagoras' reputation as a geometer, but they cannot be simply ignored. Several things need to be noted about this tradition, however, in order to understand its true significance. First, Proclus does not ascribe a proof of the theorem to Pythagoras but rather goes on to contrast Pythagoras as one of those “knowing the truth of the theorem” with Euclid who not only gave the proof found in Elements I.47 but also a more general proof in VI. 31. Although a number of modern scholars have speculated on what sort of proof Pythagoras might have used (e.g., Heath 1956, 352 ff.), it is important to note that there is not a jot of evidence for a proof by Pythagoras; what we know of the history of Greek geometry makes such a proof by Pythagoras improbable, since the first work on the elements of geometry, upon which a rigorous proof would be based, is not attested until Hippocrates of Chios, who was active after Pythagoras in the latter part of the fifth century (Proclus, A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid's Elements, 66). All that this tradition ascribes to Pythagoras, then, is discovery of the truth contained in the theorem. The truth may not have been in general form but rather focused on the simplest such triangle (with sides 3, 4 and 5), pointing out that such a triangle and all others like it will have a right angle. Modern scholarship has shown, moreover, that the truth of the theorem as an arithmetical technique, once again without proof, was known before Pythagoras among the Babylonians (Burkert 1972a, 429), so it is possible that Pythagoras just passed on to the Greeks a truth that he learned from the East. The emphasis in the two lines of verse is not just on Pythagoras' discovery of the truth of the theorem, it is as much or more on his sacrifice of oxen in honor of the discovery. We are probably supposed to imagine that the sacrifice was not of a single ox; Apollodorus describes it as “a famous sacrifice of oxen” and Diogenes Laertius paraphrases this as a hecatomb, which need not be, as it literally says, a hundred oxen, but still suggests a large number. Some have wanted to doubt the whole story, including the discovery of the theorem, because it conflicts with Pythagoras' supposed vegetarianism, but it is far from clear to what extent he was a vegetarian (see above). If the story is to have any force and if it dates to the fourth century, it shows that Pythagoras was famous for a certain piece of geometrical knowledge, but it also shows that he was just as famous for his enthusiastic response to that knowledge, as evidenced in his sacrifice of oxen. What emerges from this evidence, then, is not Pythagoras as the master geometer, who provides rigorous proofs, but rather Pythagoras as someone who recognizes and celebrates certain geometrical relationships as of high importance.

It is striking that a very similar picture of Pythagoras emerges from the evidence for his cosmology. A famous discovery is attributed to Pythagoras in the later tradition, i.e., that the central musical concords (the octave, fifth and fourth) correspond to the whole number ratios 2 : 1, 3 : 2 and 4 : 3 respectively (e.g., Nicomachus, Handbook 6 = Iamblichus, On the Pythagorean Life 115). The only early source to ascribe this discovery to Pythagoras is Xenocrates (Fr. 9) in the early Academy, but the early Academy is precisely one source of the later exaggerated tradition about Pythagoras (see above). One story has it that Pythagoras passed by a blacksmith's shop and heard the concords in the sounds of the hammers striking the anvil and then discovered that the sounds made by hammers whose weights are in the ratio 2 : 1 will be an octave apart, etc. Unfortunately, the stories of Pythagoras' discovery of these relationships are clearly false, since none of the techniques for the discovery ascribed to him would, in fact, work (e.g., the pitch of sounds produced by hammers is not directly proportional to their weight: see Burkert 1972a, 375). An experiment ascribed to Hippasus, who was active in the first half of the fifth century, after Pythagoras' death, would have worked, and thus we can trace the scientific verification of the discovery at least to Hippasus; knowledge of the relation between whole number ratios and the concords is clearly found in the fragments of Philolaus (Fr. 6a, Huffman), in the second half of the fifth century. There is some evidence that the truth of the relationship was already known to Pythagoras' contemporary, Lasus, who was not a Pythagorean (Burkert 1972a, 377). It may be once again that Pythagoras knew of the relationship without either having discovered it or having demonstrated it scientifically. The acusmata reported by Aristotle, which may go back to Pythagoras, report the following question and answer “What is the oracle at Delphi? The tetraktys, which is the harmony in which the Sirens sing” (Iamblichus, On the Pythagorean Life, 82, probably derived from Aristotle). The tetraktys, literally “the four,” refers to the first four numbers, which when added together equal the number ten, which was regarded as the perfect number in fifth-century Pythagoreanism. Here in the acusmata, these four numbers are identified with one of the primary sources of wisdom in the Greek world, the Delphic oracle. In the later tradition the tetraktys is treated as the summary of all Pythagorean wisdom, since the Pythagoreans swore oaths by Pythagoras as “the one who handed down the tetraktys to our generation.” The tetraktys can be connected to the music which the Sirens sing in that all of the ratios that correspond to the basic concords in music (octave, fifth and fourth) can be expressed as whole number ratios of the first four numbers. This acusma thus seems to be based on the knowledge of the relationship between the concords and the whole number ratios. The picture of Pythagoras that emerges from the evidence is thus not of a mathematician, who offered rigorous proofs, or of a scientist, who carried out experiments to discover the nature of the natural world, but rather of someone who sees special significance in and assigns special prominence to mathematical relationships that were in general circulation. This is the context in which to understand Aristoxenus' remark that “Pythagoras most of all seems to have honored and advanced the study concerned with numbers, having taken it away from the use of merchants and likening all things to numbers” (Fr. 23, Wehrli). Some might suppose that this is a reference to a rigorous treatment of arithmetic, such as that hypothesized by Becker (1936), who argued that Euclid IX. 21–34 was a self-contained unit that represented a deductive theory of odd and even numbers developed by the Pythagoreans (see Mueller 1997, 296 ff. and Burkert 1972a, 434 ff.). It is crucial to recognize, however, that, whatever the plausibilty of Becker's reconstruction of the deductive system, no ancient source assigns it even to the Pythagoreans, let alone to Pythagoras himself. There is, moreover, no talk of mathematical proof or a deductive system in the passage from Aristoxenus just quoted. Pythagoras is known for the honor he gives to number and for removing it from the practical realm of trade and instead pointing to correspondences between the behavior of number and the behavior of things. Such correspondences were highlighted in Aristotle's book on the Pythagoreans, e.g., the female is likened to the number two and the male to the number three and their sum, five, is likened to marriage (Aristotle, Fr. 203).

What then was the nature of Pythagoras' cosmos? Some scholars (e.g., Zhmud 1997, 2003) point to the doxographical tradition which reports that Pythagoras discovered the sphericity of the earth, the five celestial zones and the identity of the evening and morning star (Diogenes Laertius VIII. 48, Aetius III.14.1, Diogenes Laertius IX. 23). In each case, however, Burkert has shown that these reports seem to be false and the result of the glorification of Pythagoras in the later tradition, since the earliest and most reliable evidence assigns these same discoveries to someone else (1972a, 303 ff.). Thus, Theophrastus, who is the primary basis of the doxographical tradition, says that it was Parmenides who discovered the sphericity of the earth (Diogenes Laertius VIII. 48). Parmenides is also identified as the discoverer of the identity of the morning and evening star (Diogenes Laertius IX. 23), and Pythagoras' claim appears to be based on a poem forged in his name, which was rejected already by Callimachus in the third century BCE (Burkert 1972a, 307). The identification of the five celestial zones depends on the discovery of the obliquity of the ecliptic, and some of the doxography duly assigns this discovery to Pythagoras as well and claims that Oenopides stole it from Pythagoras (Aetius II.12.2); the history of astronomy by Aristotle's pupil Eudemus, our most reliable source, seems to attribute the discovery to Oenopides (there are problems with the text), however (Eudemus, Fr. 145 Wehrli). It thus appears that the later tradition, finding no evidence for Pythagoras' cosmology in the early evidence, assigned the discoveries of Parmenides back to Pythagoras, encouraged by traditions which made Parmenides the pupil of Pythagoras. In the end, there is no evidence for Pythagoras' cosmology in the early evidence, beyond what can be reconstructed from acusmata. As was shown above, Pythagoras saw the cosmos as structured according to number insofar as the tetraktys is the source of all wisdom. His cosmos was also imbued with a moral significance, which is in accordance with his beliefs about reincarnation and the fate of the soul. Thus, in answer to the question “What are the Isles of the Blest?”(where we might hope to go, if we lived a good life), the answer is “the sun and the moon.” Again “the planets are the hounds of Persephone,” i.e., the planets are agents of vengeance for wrong done (Aristotle in Porphyry VP 41). Aristotle similarly reports that for the Pythagoreans thunder “is a threat to those in Tartarus, so that they will be afraid” (Posterior Analytics 94b) and another acusma says that “an earthquake is nothing other than a meeting of the dead” (Aelian, Historical Miscellany, IV. 17). Pythagoras' cosmos thus embodied mathematical relationships that had a basis in fact and combined them with moral ideas tied to the fate of the soul. The best analogy for the type of account of the cosmos which Pythagoras gave might be some of the myths which appear at the end of Platonic dialogues such as the Phaedo, Gorgias or Republic, where cosmology has a primarily moral purpose. Should the doctrine of the harmony of the spheres be assigned to Pythagoras? Certainly the acusma which talks of the sirens singing in the harmony represented by the tetraktys suggests that there might have been a cosmic music and that Pythagoras may well have thought that the heavenly bodies, which we see move across the sky at night, made music by their motions. On the other hand, there is no evidence for “the spheres,” if we mean by that a cosmic model according to which each of the heavenly bodies is associated with a series of concentric circular orbits, a model which is at least in part designed to explain celestical phenomena. The first such cosmic model in the Pythagorean tradition is that of Philolaus in the second half of the fifth century, a model which still shows traces of the connection to the moral cosmos of Pythagoras in its account of the counter-earth and the central fire (see Philolaus).

If Pythagoras was primarily a figure of religious and ethical significance, who left behind an influential way of life and for whom number and cosmology primarily had significance in this religious and moral context, how are we to explain the prominence of rigorous mathematics and mathematical cosmology in later Pythagoreans such as Philolaus and Archytas? It is important to note that this is not just a question asked by modern scholars but was already a central question in the fourth century BCE. What is the connection between Pythagoras and fifth-century Pythagoreans? The question is implicit in Aristotle's description of the fifth-century Pythagoreans such as Philolaus as “the so-called Pythagoreans.” This expression is most easily understood as expressing Aristotle's recognition that these people were called Pythagoreans and at the same time his puzzlement as to what connection there could be between the wonder-worker who promulgated the acusmata, which his researches show Pythagoras to have been, and the philosophy of limiters and unlimiteds put forth in fifth-century Pythagoreanism. The tradition of a split between two groups of Pythagoreans in the fifth century, the mathematici and the acusmatici, points to the same puzzlement. The evidence for this split is quite confused in the later tradition, but Burkert (1972a, 192 ff.) has shown that the original and most objective account of the split is found in a passage of Aristotle's book on the Pythagoreans, which is preserved in Iamblichus (On Common Mathematical Science, 76.19 ff). The acusmatici, who are clearly connected by their name to the acusmata, are recognized by the other group, the mathematici, as genuine Pythagoreans, but the acusmatici do not regard the philosophy of the mathematici as deriving from Pythagoras but rather from Hippasus. The mathematici appear to have argued that, while the acusmatici were indeed Pythagoreans, it was the mathematici who were the true Pythagoreans; Pythagoras gave the acusmata to those who did not have the time to study the mathematical sciences, so that they would at least have moral guidance, while to those who had the time to fully devote themselves to Pythagoreanism he gave training in the mathematical sciences, which explained the reasons for this guidance. This tradition thus shows that all agreed that the acusmata represented the teaching of Pythagoras, but that some regarded the mathematical work associated with the mathematici as not deriving from Pythagoras himself, but rather from Hippasus. For fourth-century Greeks as for modern scholars, the question is whether the mathematical and scientific side of later Pythagoreanism derived from Pythagoras or not. If there were no intelligible way to understand how later Pythagoreanism could have arisen out of the Pythagoreanism of the acusmata, the puzzle of Pythagoras' relation to the later tradition would be insoluble. The cosmos of the acusmata, however, clearly shows a belief in a world structured according to mathematics, and some of the evidence for this belief may have been drawn from genuine mathematical truths such as those embodied in the “Pythagorean” theorem and the relation of whole number ratios to musical concords. Even if Pythagoras' cosmos was of primarily moral and symbolic significance, these strands of mathematical truth, which were woven into it, would provide the seeds from which later Pythagoreanism grew. Philolaus' cosmos and his metaphysical system, in which all things arise from limiters and unlimiteds and are known through numbers, are not stolen from Pythagoras. They embody a conception of mathematics, which owes much to the more rigorous mathematics of Hippocrates of Chios in the middle of the fifth century; the contrast between limiter and unlimited makes most sense after Parmenides' emphasis on the role of limit in the first part of the fifth century. Philolaus' system is nonetheless an intelligible development of the reverence for mathematical truth found in Pythagoras' own cosmological scheme, which is embodied in the acusmata.

Some argue that Herodotus' reference to Pythagoras as a wise man (sophistês) and Heraclitus' description of him as pursuing inquiry (historiê), show that in the earlier evidence he was regarded as practicing rational Ionian cosmology (Kahn 2002, 16–17). The concept of a wise man in Herodotus' time was very broad, however, and includes poets and sages as well as Ionian cosmologists; the same is true of the concept of inquiry. Historiê peri physeos (inquiry concerning nature) is later used to refer specifically to the inquiry into nature practiced by the Presocratic cosmologists, but Herodotus' usage shows that at Heraclitus' time historiê referred to inquiry in a quite general sense and has no specific reference to the cosmological inquiry of the Presocratics (Huffman 2008b). In one instance in Herodotus it refers to inquiry into the stories of Menelaus' and Helen's adventures in Egypt (II. 118). Heraclitus may be thinking of Pythagoras' inquiry into and collection of the mythical and religious lore that is found in the acusmata. Thus the description of Pythagoras as a wise man who practiced inquiry is simply too general to aid in deciding what sort of figure Herodotus and Heraclitus saw him as being. It is certainly true that the figure of Empedocles shows that the roles of rational cosmologist and wonder-working religious teacher could be combined in one figure, but this does not prove these roles were combined in Pythagoras' case. The only thing that could prove this in Pythagoras' case is reliable early evidence for a rational cosmology and that is precisely what is lacking.


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Archytas | Aristotle | Heraclitus | Philolaus | Plato | Pythagoreanism