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Collapse Theories

First published Thu Mar 7, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jun 28, 2007

Quantum mechanics, with its revolutionary implications, has posed innumerable problems to philosophers of science. In particular, it has suggested reconsidering basic concepts such as the existence of a world that is, at least to some extent, independent of the observer, the possibility of getting reliable and objective knowledge about it, and the possibility of taking (under appropriate circumstances) certain properties to be objectively possessed by physical systems. It has also raised many others questions which are well known to those involved in the debate on the interpretation of this pillar of modern science. One can argue that most of the problems are not only due to the intrinsic revolutionary nature of the phenomena which have led to the development of the theory. They are also related to the fact that, in its standard formulation and interpretation, quantum mechanics is a theory which is excellent (in fact it has met with a success unprecedented in the history of science) in telling us everything about what we observe, but it meets with serious difficulties in telling us what is. We are making here specific reference to the central problem of the theory, usually referred to as the measurement problem, or, with a more appropriate term, as the macro-objectification problem. It is just one of the many attempts to overcome the difficulties posed by this problem that has led to the development of Collapse Theories, i.e., to the Dynamical Reduction Program (DRP). As we shall see, this approach consists in accepting that the dynamical equation of the standard theory should be modified by the addition of stochastic and nonlinear terms. The nice fact is that the resulting theory is capable, on the basis of a unique dynamics which is assumed to govern all natural processes, to account at the same time for all well-established facts about microscopic systems as described by the standard theory as well as for the so-called postulate of wave packet reduction (WPR). As is well known, such a postulate is assumed in the standard scheme just in order to guarantee that measurements have outcomes but, as we shall discuss below, it meets with insurmountable difficulties if one takes the measurement itself to be a process governed by the linear laws of the theory. Finally, the collapse theories account in a completely satisfactory way for the classical behavior of macroscopic systems.

Two specifications are necessary in order to make clear from the beginning what are the limitations and the merits of the program. The only satisfactory explicit models of this type (which are essentially variations and refinements of the one, usually referred to as the GRW theory, proposed in refs. [Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber, 1985, 1986]) are phenomenological attempts to solve a foundational problem. At present, they involve phenomenological parameters which, if the theory is taken seriously, acquire the status of new constants of nature. Moreover, the problem of building satisfactory relativistic generalizations of these models has encountered serious mathematical difficulties due to the appearance of untractable divergences. Only very recently, some important steps we will discuss in what follows have led to the first satisfactory formulations of a genuinely relativistically invariant version of a dynamical reduction model, which, however, covers only the case of noninteracting particles. More important, the debate raised by these attempts and by claims that the desired generalization is impossible to achieve have elucidated some crucial points and have made clear that there is no reason of principle preventing to reach this goal.

In spite of their phenomenological character, we think that Collapse Theories have a remarkable relevance, since they have made clear that there are new ways to overcome the difficulties of the formalism, to close the circle in the precise sense defined by Abner Shimony [Shimony, 1989], ways which until a few years ago were considered impracticable, and which, on the contrary, have been shown to be perfectly viable. Moreover, they have allowed a clear identification of the formal features which should characterize any unified theory of micro and macro processes. Last but not least, Collapse theories qualify themselves as rival theories of quantum mechanics and one can easily identify some of their physical implications which, in principle, would allow crucial tests discriminating between the two. This possibility, for the moment, seems to require experiments which go beyond the present tecnological possibilities. However two aspects of the problem have to be taken into account: due to the remarkable improvements in dealing with mesoscopic systems a crucial test of GRW might become feasible, and the model suggests the kind of physical processes in which a violation of the linear nature of the formalism might occur. Accordingly, even though the experimental investigations might very well turn out not to confirm the proposed new dynamical features of natural processes, they might lead, in the end, to extremely relevant discoveries.

1. General Considerations

As stated already, a very natural question which all scientists who are concerned about the meaning and the value of science have to face, is whether one can develop a coherent worldview that can accommodate our knowledge concerning natural phenomena as it is embodied in our best theories. Such a program meets serious difficulties with quantum mechanics, essentially because of two formal aspects of the theory which are common to all of its versions, from the original nonrelativistic formulations of the 1920s, to the quantum field theories of recent years: the linear nature of the state space and of the evolution equation, i.e., the validity of the superposition principle and the related phenomenon of entanglement, which, in Schrödinger's words:

is not one but the characteristic trait of quantum mechanics, the one that enforces its entire departure from classical lines of thought [Schrödinger, 1935, p. 807].

These two formal features have embarrassing consequences, since they imply

For the sake of generality, we shall first of all present a very concise sketch of ‘the rules of the game’.

2. The Formalism: A Concise Sketch

Let us recall the axiomatic structure of quantum theory:

1. States of physical systems are associated with normalized vectors in a Hilbert space, a complex, infinite-dimensional, complete and separable linear vector space equipped with a scalar product. Linearity implies that the superposition principle holds: if |f> is a state and |g> is a state, then (for a and b arbitrary complex numbers) also

|K> = a|f> + b|g>

is a state. Moreover, the state evolution is linear, i.e., it preserves superpositions: if |f,t> and |g,t> are the states obtained by evolving the states |f,0> and |g,0>, respectively, from the initial time t=0 to the time t, then a|f,t> + b|g,t> is the state obtained by the evolution of a|f,0> + b|g,0>. Finally, the completeness assumption is made, i.e., that the knowledge of its statevector represents, in principle, the most accurate information one can have about the state of an individual physical system.

2. The observable quantities are represented by self-adjoint operators B on the Hilbert space. The associated eigenvalue equations B|bk> = bk|bk> and the corresponding eigenmanifolds (the linear manifolds spanned by the eigenvectors associated to a given eigenvalue, also called eigenspaces) play a basic role for the predictive content of the theory. In fact:

  1. The eigenvalues bk of an operator B represent the only possible outcomes in a measurement of the corresponding observable.
  2. The norm (i.e. the length) of the projection of the normalized vector (i.e. of length 1) describing the state of the system onto the eigenmanifold associated to a given eigenvalue gives the probability of obtaining the corresponding eigenvalue as the outcome of the measurement. In particular, it is useful to recall that when one is interested in the probability of finding a particle at a given place, one has to resort to the so-called configuration space representation of the statevector. In such a case the statevector becomes a square-integrable function of the position variables of the particles of the system, whose modulus squared yields the probability density for the outcomes of position measurements.

We stress that, according to the above scheme, quantum mechanics makes only conditional probabilistic predictions (conditional on the measurement being actually performed) for the outcomes of prospective (and in general incompatible) measurement processes. Only if a state belongs already before the act of measurement to an eigenmanifold of the observable which is going to be measured, can one predict the outcome with certainty. In all other cases — if the completeness assumption is made — one has objective nonepistemic probabilities for different outcomes.

The orthodox position gives a very simple answer to the question: what determines the outcome when different outcomes are possible? Nothing — the theory is complete and, as a consequence, it is illegitimate to raise any question about possessed properties referring to observables for which different outcomes have non-vanishing probabilities of being obtained. Correspondingly, the referent of the theory are the results of measurement procedures. These are to be described in classical terms and involve in general mutually exclusive physical conditions.

As regards the legitimacy of attributing properties to physical systems, one could say that quantum mechanics warns us against requiring too many properties to be actually possessed by physical systems. However — with Einstein — one can adopt as a sufficient condition for the existence of an objective individual property that one be able (without in any way disturbing the system) to predict with certainty the outcome of a measurement. This implies that, whenever the overall statevector factorizes into the product of a state of the Hilbert space of the physical system S and of the rest of the world, S does possess some properties (actually a complete set of properties, i.e., those associated to a maximal set of commuting observables).

Before concluding this section we must add some comments about the measurement process. Quantum theory was created to deal with microscopic phenomena. In order to obtain information about them one must be able to establish strict correlations between the states of the microscopic systems and the states of objects we can perceive. Within the formalism, this is described by considering appropriate micro-macro interactions. The fact that when the measurement is completed one can make statements about the outcome is accounted for by the already mentioned WPR postulate [Dirac, 1948]: a measurement always causes a system to jump in an eigenstate of the observed quantity. Correspondingly, also the statevector of the apparatus ‘jumps’ into the manifold associated to the recorded outcome.

3. The Macro-Objectification Problem

In this Section we shall clarify why the formalism we have just presented gives rise to the measurement or macro-objectification problem. To this purpose we shall, first of all, discuss the standard oversimplified argument based on the so-called von Neumann ideal measurement scheme. Then we shall discuss more recent results [Bassi and Ghirardi, 2000], which relinquish von Neumann's assumptions.

Let us begin by recalling the basic points of the standard argument:

Suppose that a microsystem S, just before the measurement of an observable B, is in the eigenstate |bj> of the corresponding operator. The apparatus (a macrosystem) used to gain information about B is initially assumed to be in a precise macroscopic state, its ready state, corresponding to a definite macro property — e.g., its pointer points at 0 on a scale. Since the apparatus A is made of elementary particles, atoms and so on, it must be described by quantum mechanics, which will associate to it the state vector |A0>. One then assumes that there is an appropriate system-apparatus interaction lasting for a finite time, such that when the initial apparatus state is triggered by the state |bj> it ends up in a final configuration |Aj>, which is macroscopically distinguishable from the initial one and from the other configurations |Ak> in which it would end up if triggered by a different eigenstate |bk>. Moreover, one assumes that the system is left in its initial state. In brief, one assumes that one can dispose things in such a way that the system-apparatus interaction can be described as:
  1. (initial state): |bk>|A0>
    (final state): |bk>|Ak>

Equation (1) and the hypothesis that the superposition principle governs all natural processes tell us that, if the initial state of the microsystem is a linear superposition of different eigenstates (for simplicity we will consider only two of them), one has:

  1. (initial state): (a|bk> + b|bj>)|A0>
    (final state): (a|bk>|Ak> + b|bj>|Aj>).

Some remarks about this are in order:

Nowadays, there is a general consensus that this solution is absolutely unacceptable for two basic reasons:

  1. It corresponds to assuming that the linear nature of the theory is broken at a certain level. Thus, quantum theory is unable to explain how it can happen that the apparata behave as required by the WPR postulate (which is one of the axioms of the theory).
  2. Even if one were to accept that quantum mechanics has a limited field of applicability, so that it does not account for all natural processes and, in particular, it breaks down at the macrolevel, it is clear that the theory does not contain any precise criterion for identifying the borderline between micro and macro, linear and nonlinear, deterministic and stochastic, reversible and irreversible. To use J.S. Bell's words, there is nothing in the theory fixing such a borderline and the split between the two above types of processes is fundamentally shifty. As a matter of fact, if one looks at the historical debate on this problem, one can easily see that it is precisely by continuously resorting to this ambiguity about the split that adherents of the Copenhagen orthodoxy or easy solvers [Bell, 1990] of the measurement problem have rejected the criticism of the heretics [Gottfried, 2000]. For instance, Bohr succeeded in rejecting Einstein's criticisms at the Solvay Conferences by stressing that some macroscopic parts of the apparatus had to be treated fully quantum mechanically; von Neumann and Wigner displaced the split by locating it between the physical and the conscious (but what is a conscious being?), and so on. Also other proposed solutions to the problem, notably certain versions of many-worlds interpretations, suffer from analogous ambiguities.

It is not our task to review here the various attempts to solve the above difficulties. One can find many exhaustive treatments of this problem in the literature. On the contrary, we would like to discuss how the macro-objectification problem is indeed a consequence of very general, in fact unavoidable, assumptions on the nature of measurements, and not specifically of the assumptions of von Neumann's model. This was established in a series of theorems of increasing generality, notably the ones by Fine [1970], d'Espagnat [1971], Shimony [1974], Brown [1986] and Busch and Shimony [1996]. Possibly the most general and direct proof is given by Bassi and Ghirardi [2000], whose results we briefly summarize. The assumptions of the theorem are:

  1. that a microsystem can be prepared in two different eigenstates of an observable (such as, e.g., the spin component along the z-axis) and in a superposition of two such states;
  2. that one has a sufficiently reliable way of ‘measuring’ such an observable, meaning that when the measurement is triggered by each of the two above eigenstates, the process leads in the vast majority of cases to macroscopically and perceptually different situations of the universe. This requirement allows for cases in which the experimenter does not have perfect control of the apparatus, the apparatus is entangled with the rest of the universe, the apparatus makes mistakes, or the measured system is altered or even destroyed in the measurement process;
  3. that all natural processes obey the linear laws of the theory.

From these very general assumptions one can show that, repeating the measurement on systems prepared in the superposition of the two given eigenstates, in the great majority of cases one ends up in a superposition of macroscopically and perceptually different situations of the whole universe. If one wishes to have an acceptable final situation, one mirroring the fact that we have definite perceptions, one is arguably compelled to break the linearity of the theory at an appropriate stage.

4. The Birth of Collapse Theories

The debate on the macro-objectification problem continued for many years after the early days of quantum mechanics. In the early 1950s an important step was taken by D. Bohm who presented [Bohm, 1952] a mathematically precise deterministic completion of quantum mechanics (see the entry on Bohmian Mechanics). In the area of Collapse Theories, one should mention the contribution by Bohm and Bub [1966], which was based on the interaction of the statevector with Wiener — Siegel hidden variables. But let us come to Collapse Theories in the sense currently attached to this expression.

Various investigations during the 1970s can be considered as preliminary steps for the subsequent developments. In the years 1970-1973 L. Fonda, A. Rimini, T. Weber and myself were seriously concerned with quantum decay processes and in particular with the possibility of deriving, within a quantum context, the exponential decay law [Fonda, Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber; 1973, Fonda et al., 1978]. Some features of this approach are extremely relevant for the DRP. Let us list them:

Obviously, in these papers the reduction processes which are involved were not assumed to be ‘spontaneous and fundamental’ natural processes, but due to system-environment interactions. Accordingly, these attempts did not represent original proposals for solving the macro-objectification problem but they have paved the way for the elaboration of the GRW theory.

Almost in the same years, P. Pearle [Pearle, 1976,1979], and subsequently N. Gisin [Gisin, 1984] and others, had entertained the idea of accounting for the reduction process in terms of a stochastic differential equation. These authors were really looking for a new dynamical equation and for a solution to the macro-objectification problem. Unfortunately, they have not been able to give any precise suggestion about how to identify the states to which the dynamical equation should lead. Indeed, these states were assumed to depend on the particular measurement process one was considering. Without a clear indication on this point there was no way to identify a mechanism whose effect could be negligible for microsystems but extremely relevant for the macroscopic ones. N. Gisin gave subsequently an interesting (though not uncontroversial) argument [Gisin, 1989] that nonlinear modifications of the standard equation without stochasticity are unacceptable since they imply the possibility of sending superluminal signals. Soon afterwards, R. Grassi and myself [Ghirardi and Grassi, 1991] showed that stochastic modifications without nonlinearity can at most induce ensemble and not individual reductions, i.e., they do not guarantee that the state vector of each individual physical system is driven in a manifold corresponding to definite properties.

5. The Original Collapse Model

As already mentioned, the Collapse Theory [Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber, 1986] we are going to describe amounts to accepting a modification of the standard evolution law of the theory such that microprocesses and macroprocesses are governed by a unique dynamics. Such a dynamics must imply that the micro-macro interaction in a measurement process leads to WPR. Bearing this in mind, recall that the characteristic feature distinguishing quantum evolution from WPR is that, while Schrödinger's equation is linear and deterministic (at the wave function level), WPR is nonlinear and stochastic. It is then natural to consider, as was suggested for the first time in the above quoted papers by P. Pearle, the possibility of nonlinear and stochastic modifications of the standard Schrödinger dynamics. However, the initial attempts to implement this idea were unsatisfactory for various reasons. The first, which we have already discussed, concerns the choice of the preferred basis: if one wants to have a universal mechanism leading to reductions, to which linear manifolds should the reduction mechanism drive the statevector? Or, equivalently, which of the (generally) incompatible ‘potentialities’ of the standard theory should we choose to make actual? The second, referred to as the trigger problem by Pearle [Pearle, 1989], is the problem of how the reduction mechanism can become more and more effective in going from the micro to the macro domain. The solution to this problem constitutes the central feature of the Collapse Theories of the GRW type. To discuss these points, let us briefly review the first consistent Collapse model [Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber, 1985] to appear in the literature.

Within such a model, originally referred to as QMSL (Quantum Mechanics with Spontaneous Localizations), the problem of the choice of the preferred basis is solved by remarking that the most embarrassing superpositions, at the macroscopic level, are those involving different spatial locations of macroscopic objects. Actually, as Einstein has stressed [Born, 1971, p. 223], this is a crucial point which has to be faced by anybody aiming to take a macro-objective position about natural phenomena: ‘A macro-body must always have a quasi-sharply defined position in the objective description of reality’. Accordingly, QMSL considers the possibility of spontaneous processes, which are assumed to occur instantaneously and at the microscopic level, which tend to suppress the linear superpositions of differently localized states. The required trigger mechanism must then follow consistently.

The key assumption of QMSL is the following: each elementary constituent of any physical system is subjected, at random times, to random and spontaneous localization processes (which we will call hittings) around appropriate positions. To have a precise mathematical model one has to be very specific about the above assumptions; in particular one has to make explicit HOW the process works, i.e. which modifications of the wave function are induced by the localizations, WHERE it occurs, i.e. what determines the occurrence of a localization at a certain position rather than at another one, and finally WHEN, i.e. at what times, it occurs. The answers to these questions are as follows.

Let us consider a system of N distinguishable particles and let us denote by F(q1, q2, … , qN) the coordinate representation (wave function) of the state vector (we disregard spin variables since hittings are assumed not to act on them).

  1. The answer to the question HOW is then: if a hitting occurs for the i-th particle at point x, the wave function is instantaneously multiplied by a Gaussian function (appropriately normalized)
    G(qi, x) = K exp[−{1/(2 d2)}(qix)2],

    where d represents the localization accuracy. Let us denote as

    Li(q1, q2, … , qN ; x) = F(q1, q2, … , qN) G(qi, x)

    the wave function immediately after the localization, as yet unnormalized.

  2. As concerns the specification of WHERE the localization occurs, it is assumed that the probability density P(x) of its taking place at the point x is given by the norm of the state Li (the length, or to be more precise, the integral of the modulus squared of the function Li over the 3N-dimensional space). This implies that hittings occur with higher probability at those places where, in the standard quantum description, there is a higher probability of finding the particle. Note that the above prescription introduces nonlinear and stochastic elements in the dynamics. The constant K appearing in the expression of G(qi, x) is chosen in such a way that the integral of P(x) over the whole space equals 1.
  3. Finally, the question WHEN is answered by assuming that the hittings occur at randomly distributed times, according to a Poisson distribution, with mean frequency f.

It is straightforward to convince oneself that the hitting process leads, when it occurs, to the suppression of the linear superpositions of states in which the same particle is well localized at different positions separated by a distance greater than d. As a simple example we can consider a single particle whose wavefunction is different from zero only in two small and far apart regions h and t. Suppose that a localization occurs around h; the state after the hitting is then appreciably different from zero only in a region around h itself. A completely analogous argument holds for the case in which the hitting takes place around t. As concerns points which are far from both h and t, one easily sees that the probability density for such hittings , according to the multiplication rule determining Li, turns out to be practically zero, and moreover, that if such a hitting were to occur, after the wave function is normalized, the wave function of the system would remain almost unchanged.

We can now discuss the most important feature of the theory, i.e., the Trigger Mechanism. To understand the way in which the spontaneous localization mechanism is enhanced by increasing the number of particles which are in far apart spatial regions (as compared to d), one can consider, for simplicity, the superposition |S>, with equal weights, of two macroscopic pointer states |H> and |T>, corresponding to two different pointer positions H and T, respectively. Taking into account that the pointer is ‘almost rigid’ and contains a macroscopic number N of microscopic constituents, the state can be written, in obvious notation, as:

  1. |S> = [|1 near h1> … |N near hN> + |1 near t1> … |N near tN>],

where hi is near H, and ti is near T. The states appearing in first term on the right-hand side of Eq. (4) have coordinate representations which are different from zero only when their arguments (1,…,N) are all near H, while those of the second term are different from zero only when they are all near T. It is now evident that if any of the particles (say, the i-th particle) undergoes a hitting process, e.g. near the point hi, the multiplication prescription leads practically to the suppression of the second term in (4). Thus any spontaneous localization of any of the constituents amounts to a localization of the pointer. The hitting frequency is therefore effectively amplified proportionally to the number of constituents. Notice that, for simplicity, the argument makes reference to an almost rigid body, i.e. to one for which all particles are around H in one of the states of the superposition and around T in the other. It should however be obvious that what really matters in amplifying the reductions is the number of particles which are in different positions in the two states appearing in the superposition itself.

Under these premises we can now proceed to choose the parameters d and f of the theory, i.e., the localization accuracy and the mean localization frequency. The argument just given allows one to understand how one can choose the parameters in such a way that the quantum predictions for microscopic systems remain fully valid while the embarrassing macroscopic superpositions in measurement-like situations are suppressed in very short times. Accordingly, as a consequence of the unified dynamics governing all physical processes, individual macroscopic objects acquire definite macroscopic properties. The choice suggested in the GRW-model is:

  1. f = 10−16 s−1
    d = 10−5 cm

It follows that a microscopic system undergoes a localization, on average, every hundred million years, while a macroscopic one undergoes a localization every 10−7 seconds. With reference to the challenging version of the macro-objectification problem presented by Schrödinger with the famous example of his cat, J.S. Bell comments [Bell, 1987, p.44]: [within QMSL] the cat is not both dead and alive for more than a split second . Besides the extremely low frequency of the hittings for microscopic systems, also the fact that the localization width is large compared to the dimensions of atoms (so that even when a localization occurs it does very little violence to the internal economy of an atom) plays an important role in guaranteeing that no violation of well-tested quantum mechanical predictions is implied by the modified dynamics.

Some remarks are appropriate. First of all, QMSL, being precisely formulated, allows to locate precisely the ‘split’ between micro and macro, reversible and irreversible, quantum and classical. The transition between the two types of ‘regimes’ is governed by the number of particles which are well localized at positions further apart than 10−5 cm in the two states whose coherence is going to be dynamically suppressed. Second, the model is, in principle, testable against quantum mechanics. As a matter of fact, an essential part of the program consists in proving that its predictions do not contradict any established fact about microsystems and macrosystems.

6. The Continuous Spontaneous Localization Model (CSL)

The model just presented (QMSL) has a serious drawback: it does not allow to deal with systems containing identical constituents because it does not respect the symmetry or antisymmetry requirements for such particles. A quite natural idea to overcome this difficulty would be that of relating the hitting process not to the individual particles but to the particle number density averaged over an appropriate volume. This can be done by introducing a new phenomenological parameter in the theory which however can be eliminated by an appropriate limiting procedure (see below).

Another way to overcome this problem derives from injecting the physically appropriate principles of the GRW model within the original approach of P. Pearle. This line of thought has led to a quite elegant formulation of a dynamical reduction model, usually referred to as CSL [Pearle, 1989; Ghirardi, Pearle and Rimini, 1990] in which the discontinuous jumps which characterize QMSL are replaced by a continuous stochastic evolution in the Hilbert space (a sort of Brownian motion of the statevector).

We will not enter into the rather technical details of this interesting development of the original GRW proposal, since the basic ideas and physical implications are precisely the same as those of the original formulation. Actually, one could argue that the above idea of tackling the problem of identical particles by considering the average particle number within an appropriate volume is correct. In fact it has been proved [Ghirardi, Pearle and Rimini, 1990] that for any CSL dynamics there is a hitting dynamics which, from a physical point of view, is ‘as close to it as one wants’. Instead of entering into the details of the CSL formalism, it is useful, for the discussion below, to analyze a simplified version of it.

7. A Simplified Version of CSL

With the aim of understanding the physical implications of the CSL model, such as the rate of suppression of coherence, we make now some simplifying assumptions. First, we assume that we are dealing with only one kind of particles (e.g., the nucleons), secondly, we disregard the standard Schrödinger term in the evolution and, finally, we divide the whole space in cells of volume d3. We denote by |n1, n2, … > a state in which there are ni particles in cell i, and we consider a superposition of two states |n1, n2, … > and |m1, m2, … > which differ in the occupation numbers of the various cells of the universe. With these assumptions it is quite easy to prove that the rate of suppression of the coherence between the two states (so that the final state is one of the two and not their superposition) is governed by the quantity:

  1. exp{−f [(n1m1)2 + (n2m2)2 + …]t},

the sum being extended to all cells in the universe. Apart from differences relating to the identity of the constituents, the overall physics is quite similar to that implied by QMSL. Obviously, there are interesting physical implications which deserve to be discussed. A detailed analysis has been presented in [Ghirardi and Rimini, 1990]. As shown there and as follows from estimates about possible effects for superconducting devices [Rae, 1990; Gallis and Fleming, 1990; Rimini, 1995], and for the excitation of atoms [Squires, 1991], it turns out not to be possible, with present technology, to perform clear-cut experiments allowing to discriminate the model from standard quantum mechanics [Benatti et al., 1995]. Very recently, an interesting proposal of testing the superposition principle by resorting to an experimental set-up involving a (mesoscopic) mirror has been advanced [Marshall et al., 2003]. This stimulating proposal has led a group of scientists directly interested in Collapse Theories [Bassi et al., 2005] to check whether the proposed experiment might be a crucial one for dynamical reduction models versus quantum mechanics. The rigorous conclusion has been that this is not the case: in the devised situation the GRW and CSL theories have implications which agree with those of the standard theory.

There is however an interesting aspect which might be relevant to the idea of relating the suppression of coherence to gravitational effects. Given Eq. (6), notice that the worst case scenario (from the point of view of the time necessary to suppress coherence) is the superposition of two states for which the occupation numbers of the individual cells differ only by one unit. Indeed, in this case the amplifying effect of taking the square of the differences disappears. Let us then raise the question: how many nucleons (at worst) should occupy different cells, in order for the given superposition to be dynamically suppressed within the time which characterizes human perceptual processes? Since such a time is of the order of 10−2 sec and f = 10−16 sec−1, the number of displaced nucleons must be of the order of 1018, which corresponds, to a remarkable accuracy, to a Planck mass. This figure seems to point in the same direction as attempts such as Penrose's attempts to relate reduction mechanisms to quantum gravitational effects [Penrose, 1989].

8. Some remarks about Collapse Theories

A. Pais famously recalls in his biography of Einstein:

We often discussed his notions on objective reality. I recall that during one walk Einstein suddenly stopped, turned to me and asked whether I really believed that the moon exists only when I look at it [Pais, 1982, p. 5].

In the context of Einstein's remarks in Albert Einstein, Philosopher-Scientist [Schilpp, 1949], we can regard this reference to the moon as an extreme example of ‘a fact that belongs entirely within the sphere of macroscopic concepts’, as is also a mark on a strip of paper that is used to register the outcome of a decay experiment, so that

as a consequence, there is hardly likely to be anyone who would be inclined to consider seriously […] that the existence of the location is essentially dependent upon the carrying out of an observation made on the registration strip. For, in the macroscopic sphere it simply is considered certain that one must adhere to the program of a realistic description in space and time; whereas in the sphere of microscopic situations one is more readily inclined to give up, or at least to modify, this program [p. 671].


the ‘macroscopic’ and the ‘microscopic’ are so inter-related that it appears impracticable to give up this program in the ‘microscopic’ alone [p. 674].

One might speculate that Einstein would not have taken the DRP seriously, given that it is a fundamentally indeterministic program. On the other hand, the DRP allows precisely for this middle ground, between giving up a ‘classical description in space and time’ altogether (the moon is not there when nobody looks), and requiring that it be applicable also at the microscopic level (as within some kind of ‘hidden variables’ theory). It would seem that the pursuit of ‘realism’ for Einstein was more a program that had been very successful rather than an a priori commitment, and that in principle he would have accepted attempts requiring a radical change in our classical conceptions concerning microsystems, provided they would nevertheless allow to take a macrorealist position matching our definite perceptions at this scale.

In the DRP, we can say of an electron in an EPR-Bohm situation that ‘when nobody looks’, it has no definite spin in any direction , and in particular that when it is in a superposition of two states localised far away from each other, it cannot be thought to be at a definite place (see, however, the remarks in Section 11). In the macrorealm, however, objects do have definite positions and are generally describable in classical terms. That is, in spite of the fact that the DRP program is not adding ‘hidden variables’ to the theory, it implies that the moon is definitely there even if no sentient being has ever looked at it. In the words of J. S. Bell, the DRP

allows electrons (in general microsystems) to enjoy the cloudiness of waves, while allowing tables and chairs, and ourselves, and black marks on photographs, to be rather definitely in one place rather than another, and to be described in classical terms [Bell, 1986, p. 364].

Such a program, as we have seen, is implemented by assuming only the existence of wave functions, and by proposing a unified dynamics that governs both microscopic processes and ‘measurements’. As regards the latter, no vague definitions are needed. The new dynamical equations govern the unfolding of any physical process, and the macroscopic ambiguities that would arise from the linear evolution are theoretically possible, but only of momentary duration, of no practical importance and no source of embarrassment.

We have not yet analyzed the implications about locality, but since in the DRP program no hidden variables are introduced, the situation can be no worse than in ordinary quantum mechanics: ‘by adding mathematical precision to the jumps in the wave function, it simply makes precise the action at a distance of ordinary quantum mechanics’ [Bell, 1987, p. 46]. Indeed, a detailed investigation of the locality properties of the theory becomes possible, and the analysis carried on so far proves that at least in the non-relativistic version a program of dynamical reduction can be consistently developed. Moreover, as it will become clear when we will discuss the interpretation of the theory in terms of mass density, the QMSL and CSL theories lead in a natural way to account for a behaviour of macroscopic objects corresponding to our definite perceptions about them, the main objective of Einstein's requirements.

The achievements of the DRP which are relevant for the debate about the foundations of quantum mechanics can also be concisely summarized in the words of H.P. Stapp:

The collapse mechanisms so far proposed could, on the one hand, be viewed as ad hoc mutilations designed to force ontology to kneel to prejudice. On the other hand, these proposals show that one can certainly erect a coherent quantum ontology that generally conforms to ordinary ideas at the macroscopic level [Stapp, 1989, p. 157].

9. Relativistic Dynamical Reduction Models

As soon as our proposal appeared and attracted the attention of J.S. Bell it also stimulated him to look at it from the point of view of relativity theory. As he stated subsequently [Bell, 1989]:

When I saw this theory first, I thought that I could blow it out of the water, by showing that it was grossly in violation of Lorentz invariance. That's connected with the problem of ‘quantum entanglement’, the EPR paradox.

Actually, he had already investigated this point by studying the effect on the theory of a transformation mimicking a nonrelativistic approximation of a Lorentz transformation and he arrived [Bell, 1987] at a surprising conclusion:

… the model is as Lorentz invariant as it could be in its nonrelativistic version. It takes away the ground of my fear that any exact formulation of quantum mechanics must conflict with fundamental Lorentz invariance.

What Bell had actually proved in a rather complicated way by resorting to a two-times formulation of the Schrödinger equation is that the model violates locality by violating outcome independence and not, as deterministic hidden variable theories do, parameter independence.

Indeed, with reference to this point we recall that, as is well known, [Suppes and Zanotti, 1976; van Fraassen, 1982; Jarrett, 1984; Shimony, 1983; see also the entry on Bell's Theorem], Bell's locality assumption is equivalent to the conjunction of two other assumptions, viz., in Shimony's terminology, parameter independence and outcome independence. In view of the experimental violation of Bell's inequality, one has to give up either or both of these assumptions. The above splitting of the locality requirement into two logically independent conditions is particularly useful in discussing the different status of CSL and deterministic hidden variable theories with respect to relativistic requirements. Actually, as proved by Jarrett himself, when parameter independence is violated, if one had access to the variables which specify completely the state of individual physical systems, one could send faster-than-light signals from one wing of the apparatus to the other. Moreover, in refs. [Ghirardi and Grassi, 1994, 1996] it has been proved that it is impossible to build a genuinely relativistically invariant theory which, in its nonrelativistic limit, exhibits parameter dependence. Here we use the term genuinely invariant to denote a theory for which there is no (hidden) preferred reference frame. On the other hand, if locality is violated only by the occurrence of outcome dependence then faster-than-light signaling cannot be achieved [Eberhard, 1978; Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber, 1980; Ghirardi, Grassi, Rimini and Weber, 1988]. Few years after the just mentioned proof by Bell, it has been shown in complete generality [Ghirardi, Grassi, Butterfield and Fleming, 1993; Butterfield et al., 1993] that the GRW and CSL theories, just as standard quantum mechanics, exhibit only outcome dependence. This is to some extent encouraging and shows that there are no reasons of principle making unviable the project of building a relativistically invariant DRM.

Let us be more specific about this crucial problem. P. Pearle was the first to propose [Pearle, 1990] a relativistic generalization of CSL to a quantum field theory describing a fermion field coupled to a meson scalar field enriched with the introduction of stochastic and nonlinear terms. A quite detailed discussion of this proposal was presented in [Ghirardi et al,1990a] where it was shown that the theory enjoys of all properties which are necessary in order to meet the relativistic constraints. Pearle's approach requires the precise formulation of the idea of stochastic Lorentz invariance. The proposal can be summarized in the following terms.

One considers a fermion field coupled to a meson field and puts forward the idea of inducing localizations for the fermions through their coupling to the mesons and a stochastic dynamical reduction mechanism acting on the meson variables. In practice, one considers Heisenberg evolution equations for the coupled fields and a Tomonaga-Schwinger CSL-type evolution equation with a skew-hermitian coupling to a c-number stochastic potential for the state vector. This approach has been systematically investigated in refs. [Ghirardi, Grassi and Pearle, 1990a, 1990b] to which we refer the reader for a detailed discussion. Here we limit ourselves to stressing that, under certain approximations, one obtains in the non-relativistic limit a CSL-type equation inducing spatial localization. However, due to the white noise nature of the stochastic potential, novel renormalization problems arise: the increase per unit time and per unit volume of the energy of the meson field is infinite due to the fact that infinitely many mesons are created. For these reasons one cannot consider this as a satisfactory example of a relativistic reduction model.

The years following the original attempts just mentioned saw a fluorishing of researches aimed to get the desired result, most of them having been proposed by P. Pearle himself. However, no real steps forward were made concerning the suppression of the untractable divergencies as plainly recognized by Pearle himself [Pearle, 2006]. As already mentioned, there are indications that their appearence is due to the white character of the noise which accounts for the stochastic nature of the evolution. For this reason P. Pearle [Pearle, 1999], L. Diosi [Diosi, 1990] and A. Bassi and myself [Bassi et al., 2002] reconsidered the problem from the beginning by investigating nonrelativistic theories with nonwhite Gaussian noises. It is not yet clear whether this approach will lead to a real step forward.

It is interesting to remark that precisely in the same years similar attempts to get a relativistic generalization of the other existing ‘ exact’ theory, i.e., Bohmian Mechanics, were going on and that they too have encountered serious difficulties. Important steps are represented by a paper [Dürr, 1999] resorting to a preferred spacetime slicing, by the investigations of Goldstein and Tumulka [Goldstein 2003] and by other scientists [Berndl, 1996]. However, we must recognize that no one of these attempts has led to a fully satisfactory solution of the problem of having a theory without observers, like Bohmian mechanics, which is perfectly satisfactory from the relativistic point of view.

Let us come back to the relativistic DRP. With reference to it we mention an attempt by Dove and Squires [Dove,1996] based on discrete rather than continuous stochastic processes and one by Dewdney and Horton [Dewdney,2001] formulated on a discrete space-time. All other attempts towards a relativistic collapse model are based on a continuous spontaneous localization description of the reduction mechasnism. Among them mention must be made of the investigations by Pearle [Pearle, 1999b] and by Nicrosini and Rimini [Nicrosini, 2003]. The first one, however, is not fully relativistic, and the second is based on a Tomonaga-Schwinger equation which turns out to be not integrable.

Some important changes, in my opinion, have occurred quite recently. Tumulka [Tumulka, 2006] succeeded in proposing a relativistic version of the GRW theory for N non-interacting distinguishable particles, based on the consideration of a multi-time wavefunction whose evolution is governed by Dirac like equations and adopts as its Primitive Ontology (see the next section) the one which attaches a primary role to the space and time points at which spontaneous localizations occur, as originally suggested by Bell [Bell, 1987]. To my knowledge this represents the first proposal of a relativistic dynamical reduction mechanism which satisfies all relativistic requirementes, even though it can deal only with systems of noninteracting particles. His second step has been to present [Tumulka, 2006b] a quantum field theoretical model of dynamical reduction. Presently he is trying to combine the two approaches to get a fully relativistic and realistic field theoretical scheme of a quantum mechanics without observers.

I consider particularly interesting the conclusions which he draws from his deep analysis concerning both Bohiam-like and GRW-like approaches to the relativistic macro-objectification process:

A somewhat surprising feature of the present situation is that we seem to arrive at the following alternative: Bohmian mechanics shows that one can explain quantum mechanics, exactly and completely, if one is willing to pay with using a preferred slicing of spacetime; our model suggests that one should be able to avoid a preferred slicing of spacetime if one is willing to pay with a certain deviation from quantum mechanics,

a conclusion that he has rephrased and reinforced in [Tumulka, 2006c]:

Thus, with the presently available models we have the alternative: either the conventional understanding of relativity is not right, or quantum mechanics is not exact.

I believe that this position is perfectly consistent with the present ideas concerning the attempts to transform relativistic standard quantum mechanics into an ‘exact ’ theory in the sense which has been made precise by J. Bell. Since the only unified, mathematically precise and formally consistent formulations of the quantum description of natural processes are Bohmian mechanics and GRW-like theories, if one chooses the first alternative one has to accept the existence of a preferred reference frame, while in the second case one is not led to such a drastic change of position with respect to relativistic concepts but must accept that the ensuing theory — even though only in a presently non-testable manner - disagrees with the predictions of quantum mechanics and acquires the status of a rival theory with respect to it.

In spite of the above remarks, it has to be recognized that the efforts which have been spent on such a program have led to a better understanding of some points and have thrown light on some important conceptual issues. First, they have led to a completely general and rigorous formulation of the concept of stochastic invariance [Ghirardi, Grassi and Pearle, 1990a]. Second, they have prompted a critical reconsideration, based on the discussion of smeared observables with compact support, of the problem of locality at the individual level. This analysis has brought out the necessity of reconsidering the criteria for the attribution of objective local properties to physical systems. In specific situations, one cannot attribute any local property to a microsystem: any attempt to do so gives rise to ambiguities. However, in the case of macroscopic systems, the impossibility of attributing to them local properties (or, equivalently, the ambiguity associated to such properties) lasts only for time intervals of the order of those necessary for the dynamical reduction to take place. Moreover, no objective property corresponding to a local observable, even for microsystems, can emerge as a consequence of a measurement-like event occurring in a space-like separated region: such properties emerge only in the future light cone of the considered macroscopic event. Finally, recent investigations [Ghirardi and Grassi, 1994, 1996; Ghirardi, 1996, 2000] have shown that the very formal structure of the theory is such that it does not allow, even conceptually, to establish cause-effect relations between space-like events.

Having listed some interesting results obtained along these lines, in concluding this section it is necessary to stress once more that the question of whether a relativistic dynamical reduction program will find a satisfactory formulation still remains ‘the big problem’ for this type of investigations.

Recently, a paper by Conway and Kochen [Conway, 2006] which has raised a lot of interest has been published, and we cannot avoid to spend few words on it to clarify possible misunderstandings. The first and most important aim of the paper is the derivation of what the authors have called The Free Will Theorem , putting forward the provocative idea that if human beings are free to make their choices about the measurements they will perform on one of a pair of far-away entangled particles, then one must admit that also the elementary particles involved in the experiment have free will. One might make several comments on this statement. For what concerns us here the relevant fact is that the authors claim that their theorem implies, as a byproduct, the impossibility of elaborating a relativistically invariant dynamical reduction model. A lively debate has arosen; we refer the reader to the papers by Adler [Adler, 2006], Bassi and Ghirardi [Bassi, 2007], Tumulka [Tumulka, 2007] in which it is proved that the conclusion drawn by Conway and Kochen is not pertinent to the problem. Very recently the above authors have replied [Conway et al., 2007] to all criticisms raised in the just mentioned papers, in a way which, in my opinon, is not correct. I am sure that, in principle, nothing forbids a relativistic generalization of the GRW theory, and there are many elements which clearly point in this direction.

10. Collapse Theories and Definite Perceptions

Some authors [Albert and Vaidman, 1989; Albert, 1990, 1992] have raised an interesting objection concerning the emergence of definite perceptions within Collapse Theories. The objection is based on the fact that one can easily imagine situations leading to definite perceptions, that nevertheless do not involve the displacement of a large number of particles up to the stage of the perception itself. These cases would then constitute actual measurement situations which cannot be described by the GRW theory, contrary to what happens for the idealized (according to the authors) situations considered in many presentations of it, i.e. those involving the displacement of some sort of pointer. To be more specific, the above papers consider a ‘measurement-like’ process whose output is the emission of a burst of few photons triggered by the position in which a particle hits a screen. This can easily be devised by considering, e.g., a Stern-Gerlach set-up in which the two paths followed by the microsystem according to the value of its spin component hit a fluorescent screen and excite a small number of atoms which subsequently decay, emitting a small number of photons. The argument goes as follows: if one triggers the apparatus with a superposition of two spin states, since only a few atoms are excited, since the excitations involve displacements which are smaller than the characteristic localization distance of GRW, since GRW does not induce reductions on photon states and, finally, since the photon states immediately overlap, there is no way for the spontaneous localization mechanism to become effective in suppressing the ensuing superposition of the states ‘photons emerging from point A of the screen’ and ‘photons emerging from point B of the screen’. On the other hand, since the visual perception threshold is quite low (about 6-7 photons), there is no doubt that the naked eye of a human observer is sufficient to detect whether the luminous spot on the screen is at A or at B. The conclusion follows: in the case under consideration no dynamical reduction can take place and as a consequence no measurement is over, no outcome is definite, up to the moment in which a conscious observer perceives the spot.

We have presented a detailed answer to this criticism [Aicardi et al., 1991]. The crucial points of our argument are the following: we perfectly agree that in the case considered the superposition persists for long times (actually the superposition must persist, since, the system under consideration being microscopic, one could perform interference experiments which everybody would expect to confirm quantum mechanics). However, to deal in the appropriate and correct way with such a criticism, one has to consider all the systems which enter into play (electron, screen, photons and brain) and the universal dynamics governing all relevant physical processes. A simple estimate of the number of ions which are involved in the visual perception mechanism makes perfectly plausible that, in the process, a sufficient number of particles are displaced by a sufficient spatial amount to satisfy the conditions under which, according to the GRW theory, the suppression of the superposition of the two nervous signals will take place within the time scale of perception.

To avoid misunderstandings, this analysis by no means amounts to attributing a special role to the conscious observer or to perception. The observer's brain is the only system present in the set-up in which a superposition of two states involving different locations of a large number of particles occurs. As such it is the only place where the reduction can and actually must take place according to the theory. It is extremely important to stress that if in place of the eye of a human being one puts in front of the photon beams a spark chamber or a device leading to the displacement of a macroscopic pointer, or producing ink spots on a computer output, reduction will equally take place. In the given example, the human nervous system is simply a physical system, a specific assembly of particles, which performs the same function as one of these devices, if no other such device interacts with the photons before the human observer does. It follows that it is incorrect and seriously misleading to claim that the GRW theory requires a conscious observer in order that measurements have a definite outcome.

A further remark may be appropriate. The above analysis could be taken by the reader as indicating a very naive and oversimplified attitude towards the deep problem of the mind-brain correspondence. There is no claim and no presumption that GRW allows a physicalist explanation of conscious perception. It is only pointed out that, for what we know about the purely physical aspects of the process, one can state that before the nervous pulses reach the higher visual cortex, the conditions guaranteeing the suppression of one of the two signals are verified. In brief, a consistent use of the dynamical reduction mechanism in the above situation accounts for the definiteness of the conscious perception, even in the extremely peculiar situation devised by Albert and Vaidman.

11. The Interpretation of the Theory and its Primitive Ontologies

As stressed in the opening sentences of this contribution, the most serious problem of standard quantum mechanics lies in its being extremely successful in telling us about what we observe, but being basically silent on what is. This specific feature is closely related to the probabilistic interpretation of the statevector, combined with the completeness assumption of the theory. Notice that what is under discussion is the probabilistic interpretation, not the probabilistic character, of the theory. Also collapse theories have a fundamentally stochastic character, but, due to their most specific feature, i.e. that of driving the statevector of any individual physical system into appropriate and physically meaningful manifolds, they allow for a different interpretation. One could even say (if one wants to avoid that they too, as the standard theory, speak only of what we find) that they require a different interpretation, one that accounts for our perceptions at the appropriate, i.e. macroscopic, level.

We must admit that this opinion is not universally shared. According to various authors, the ‘rules of the game’ embodied in the precise formulation of the GRW and CSL theories represent all there is to say about them. However, this cannot be the whole story: stricter and more precise requirements than the purely formal ones must be imposed for a theory to be taken seriously as a fundamental description of natural processes (an opinion shared by J. Bell). This request of going beyond the purely formal aspects of a theoretical scheme has been denoted as (the necessity of specifying) the Primitive Ontology (PO) of the theory in an extremely interesting recent paper [Allori, 2007]. The fundamental requisite of the PO is that it should make absolutely precise what the theory is fundamentally about.

This is not a new problem; as already mentioned it has been raised by J. Bell since his first presentation of the GRW theory. Let me summarize the terms of the debate. Given that the wavefunction of a many-particle system lives in a (high-dimensional) configuration space, which is not endowed with a direct physical meaning connected to our experience of the world around us, Bell wanted to identify the ‘local beables’ of the theory, the quantities on which one could base a description of the perceived reality in ordinary three-dimensional space. In the specific context of QMSL, he [Bell 1987, p. 45] suggested that the ‘GRW jumps’, which we called ‘hittings’, could play this role. In fact they occur at precise times in precise positions of the three-dimensional space. As suggested in [Allori, 2007] we will denote this position concerning the PO of the GRW theory as the ‘flashes ontology.’

However, later, Bell himself suggested that the most natural interpretation of the wavefunction in the context of a collapse theory would be that it describes the ‘density […] of stuff’ in the 3N-dimensional configuration space [Bell, 1990, p. 30], the natural mathematical framework for describing a system of N particles. The authors of ref. [Allori, 2007] appropriately have pointed out that this position amounts to avoid to committing oneself about the PO ontology of the theory and, consequently, to leave vague the precise and meaningful connections it allows to establish between the mathematical description of the unfolding of physical processes and our perception of them.

The interpretation which, in the opinion of the present writer, is most appropriate for collapse theories, has been proposed in series of papers [Ghirardi, Grassi and Benatti, 1995, Ghirardi, 1997a, 1997b] and has been referred in [Allori, 2007] as ‘the mass density ontology’. Let us briefly describe it.

First of all, various investigations [Pearle and Squires, 1994] had made clear that QMSL and CSL needed a modification, i.e., the characteristic localization frequency of the elementary constituents of matter had to be made proportional to the mass characterizing the particle under consideration. In particular, the original frequency for the hitting processes f = 10−16 sec−1 is the one characterizing the nucleons, while, e.g., electrons would suffer hittings with a frequency reduced by about 2000 times. Unfortunately we have no space to discuss here the physical reasons which make this choice appropriate; we refer the reader to the above paper, as well as to the recent detailed analysis by Peruzzi and Rimini [Peruzzi and Rimini, 2000]. With this modification, what the nonlinear dynamics strives to make ‘objectively definite’ is the mass distribution in the whole universe. Second, a deep critical reconsideration [Ghirardi, Grassi and Benatti, 1995] has made evident how the concept of ‘distance’ that characterizes the Hilbert space is inappropriate in accounting for the similarity or difference between macroscopic situations. Just to give a convincing example, consider three states |h>, |h*> and |t> of a macrosystem (let us say a massive macroscopic bulk of matter), the first corresponding to its being located here, the second to its having the same location but one of its atoms (or molecules) being in a state orthogonal to the corresponding state in |h>, and the third having exactly the same internal state of the first but being differently located (there). Then, despite the fact that the first two states are indistinguishable from each other at the macrolevel, while the first and the third correspond to completely different and directly perceivable situations, the Hilbert space distance between |h> and |h*>, is equal to that between |h> and |t>.

When the localization frequency is related to the mass of the constituents, then, in completely generality (i.e. even when one is dealing with a body which is not almost rigid, such as a gas or a cloud), the mechanism leading to the suppression of the superpositions of macroscopically different states is fundamentally governed by the the integral of the squared differences of the mass densities associated to the two superposed states. Actually, in the original paper [Ghirardi, Grassi and Benatti, 1995] the mass density at a point was identified with its average over the characteristic volume of the theory, i.e., 10−15 cm 3 around that point. It is however easy to convince onself that there is no need to do so [Ghirardi, 2007] and that the mass density at any point, directly identified by the statevector (see below), is the appropriate quantity on which to base an appropriate ontology. Accordingly, we take the following attitude: what the theory is about, what is real ‘out there’ at a given space point x, is just a field, i.e. a variable m(x,t) given by the expectation value of the mass density operator M(x) at x obtained by multiplying the mass of any kind of particle times the number density operator for the considered type of particle and summing over all possible types of particles which can be present:

  1. m(x,t) = < F,t | M(x) | F,t >;

Here |F,t> is the statevector characterizing the system at the given time, and a*(k)(x) and a(k)(x) are the creation and annhilation operators for a particle of type k at point x. It is obvious that within standard quantum mechanics such a function cannot be endowed with any objective physical meaning due to the occurrence of linear superpositions which give rise to values that do not correspond to what we find in a measurement process or what we perceive. In the case of GRW or CSL theories, if one considers only the states allowed by the dynamics one can give a description of the world in terms of m(x,t), i.e., one recovers a physically meaningful account of physical reality in the usual 3-dimensional space and time. To illustrate this crucial point we consider, first of all, the embarrassing situation of a macroscopic object in the superposition of two differently located position states. We have then simply to recall that in a collapse model relating reductions to mass density differences, the dynamics suppresses in extremely short times the embarrassing superpositions of such states to recover the mass distribution corresponding to our perceptions. Let us come now to a microsystem and let us consider the equal weight superposition of two states |h> and |t> describing a microscopic particle in two different locations. Such a state gives rise to a mass distribution corresponding to 1/2 of the mass of the particle in the two considered space regions. This seems, at first sight, to contradict what is revealed by any measurement process. But in such a case we know that the theory implies that the dynamics running all natural processes within GRW ensures that whenever one tries to locate the particle he will always find it in a definite position, i.e., one and only one of the Geiger counters which might be triggered by the passage of the proton will fire, just because a superposition of ‘a counter which has fired’ and ‘one which has not fired ’ is dynamically forbidden.

This analysis shows that one can consider at all levels (the micro and the macroscopic ones) the field m(x,t) as accounting for ‘what is out there’, as originally suggested by Schrödinger with his realistic interpretation of the square of the wave function of a particle as representing the ‘ fuzzy ’ character of the mass (or charge) of the particle. Obviously, within standard quantum mechanics such a position cannot be mantained because ‘wavepackets diffuse, and with the passage of time become infinitely extended … but however far the wavefunction has extended, the reaction of a detector … remains spotty’, as appropriately remarked in [Bell, 1990]. As we hope to have made clear, the picture is radically different when one takes into account the new dynamics which succeeds perfectly in reconciling the spread and sharp features of the wavefunction and of the detection process, respectively.

It is also extremely important to stress that, by resorting to the quantity (7) one can define an appropriate ‘distance’ between two states as the integral over the whole 3-dimensional space of the square of the difference of m(x,t) for the two given states, a quantity which turns out to be perfectly appropriate to ground the concept of macroscopically similar or distinguishable Hilbert space states. In turn, this distance can be used as a basis to define a sensible psychophysical correspondence within the theory.

12. The Problem of the Tails of the Wave Function

In recent years, there has been a lively debate around a problem which has its origin, according to some of the authors which have raised it, in the fact that even though the localization process which corresponds to multiplying the wave function times a Gaussian and thus lead to wave functions strongly peaked around the position of the hitting, they allow nevertheless the final wavefuntion to be different from zero over the whole of space. The first criticism of this kind was raised by A. Shimony [Shimony, 1990] and can be summarized by his sentence,

one should not tolerate tails in wave functions which are so broad that their different parts can be discriminated by the senses, even if very low probability amplitude is assigned to them.

After a localization of a macroscopic system, typically the pointer of the apparatus, its centre of mass will be associated to a wave function which is different from zero over the whole space. If one adopts the probabilistic interpretation of the standard theory, this means that even when the measurement process is over, there is a nonzero (even though extremely small) probability of finding its pointer in an arbitrary position, instead of the one corresponding to the registered outcome. This is taken as inacceptable, as indicating that the DRP does not actually overcome the macro-objectification problem.

Let us state immediately that the (alleged) problem arises entirely from keeping the standard interpretation of the wave function unchanged, in particular assuming that its modulus squared gives the probability density of the position variable. However, as we have discussed in the previous section, there are much more serious reasons of principle which require to abandon the probabilistic interpretation and replace it either with the ‘flash ontology’, or with the ‘ mass density ontology’ which we have discussed above.

Before entering into a detailed discussion of this subtle point we need to focus better the problem. We cannot avoid making two remarks. Suppose one adopts, for the moment, the conventional quantum position. We agree that, within such a framework, the fact that wave functions never have strictly compact spatial support can be considered puzzling. However this is an unavoidable problem arising directly from the mathematical features (spreading of wave functions) and from the probabilistic interpretation of the theory, and not at all a problem peculiar to the dynamical reduction models. Indeed, the fact that, e.g., the wave function of the centre of mass of a pointer or of a table has not a compact support has never been taken to be a problem for standard quantum mechanics. When, e.g., the wave function of a table is extremely well peaked around a given point in space, it has always been accepted that it describes a table located at a certain position, and that this corresponds in some way to our perception of it. It is obviously true that, for the given wave function, the quantum rules entail that if a measurement were performed the table could be found (with an extremely small probability) to be kilometers far away, but this is not the measurement or the macro-objectification problem of the standard theory. The latter concerns a completely different situation, i.e., that in which one is confronted with a superposition with comparable weights of two macroscopically separated wave functions, both of which possess tails (i.e., have non-compact support) but are appreciably different from zero only in far-away narrow intervals. This is the really embarrassing situation which conventional quantum mechanics is unable to make understandable. To which perception of the position of the pointer (of the table) does this wave function correspond?

The implications for this problem of the adoption of the QMSL theory should be obvious. Within GRW, the superposition of two states which, when considered individually, are assumed to lead to different and definite perceptions of macroscopic locations, are dynamically forbidden. If some process tends to produce such superpositions, then the reducing dynamics induces the localization of the centre of mass (the associated wave function being appreciably different from zero only in a narrow and precise interval). Correspondingly, the possibility arises of attributing to the system the property of being in a definite place and thus of accounting for our definite perception of it. Summarizing, we stress once more that the criticism about the tails as well as the requirement that the appearance of macroscopically extended (even though extremely small) tails be strictly forbidden is exclusively motivated by uncritically committing oneself to the probabilistic interpretation of the theory, even for what concerns the psycho-physical correspondence: when this position is taken, states assigning non-exactly vanishing probabilities to different outcomes of position measurements should correspond to ambiguous perceptions about these positions. Since neither within the standard formalism nor within the framework of dynamical reduction models a wave function can have compact support, taking such a position leads to conclude that it is just the Hilbert space description of physical systems which has to be given up.

It ought to be stressed that there is nothing in the GRW theory which would make the choice of functions with compact support problematic for the purpose of the localizations, but it also has to be noted that following this line would be totally useless: since the evolution equation contains the kinetic energy term, any function, even if it has compact support at a given time, will instantaneously spread acquiring a tail extending over the whole of space. If one sticks to the probabilistic intepretation and one accepts the completeness of the description of the states of physical systems in terms of the wave function, the tail problem cannot be avoided.

The solution to the tails problem can only derive from abandoning completely the probabilistic interpretation and from adopting a more physical and realistic intepretation relating ‘what is out there’ to, e.g., the mass density distribution over the whole universe. In this connection, the following example will be instructive [Ghirardi, Grassi and Benatti, 1995]. Take a massive sphere of normal density and mass of about 1 kg. Classically, the mass of this body would be totally concentrated within the radius of the sphere, call it r. In QMSL, after the extremely short time interval in which the collapse dynamics leads to a ‘regime’ situation, and if one considers a sphere with radius r + 10−5 cm, the integral of the mass density over the rest of space turns out to be an incredibly small fraction (of the order of 1 over 10 to the power 1015) of the mass of a single proton. In such conditions, it seems quite legitimate to claim that the macroscopic body is localised within the sphere.

However, also this quite reasonable position has been questioned and it has been claimed [Lewis, 1997], that the very existence of the tails implies that the enumeration principle (i.e. the fact that the claim ‘particle 1 is within this box & particle 2 is within this box & … & particle n is within this box & no other particle is within this box’ implies the claim ‘there are n particles within this box’) does not hold, if one takes seriously the mass density interpretation of collapse theories. This paper has given rise to a long debate which would be inappropriate to reproduce here. We refer the reader to the following papers [Ghirardi and Bassi, 1999; Clifton and Monton, 1999a, 1999b; Bassi and Ghirardi, 1999, 2001]. Various arguments have been presented in favour and against the criticism by Lewis.

We would like to conclude this brief analysis by stressing once more that, in our opinion, all the disagreements and the misunderstandings concerning this problem have their origin in the fact that the idea that the probabilistic interpretation of the wave function must be abandoned has not been fully accepted by the authors who find some difficulties in the proposed mass density intepretation of the Collapse Theories. For a recent reconsideration of the problem we refer the reader to the paper by [Lewis, 2003].

13. The Status of Collapse Models and Recent Positions about them

We recall that, as stated in Section 3, the macro-objectification problem has been at the centre of the most lively and most challenging debate originated by the quantum view of natural processes. According to the majority of those who adhere to the orthodox position such a problem does not deserve a particular attention: classical concepts are a logical prerequisite for the very formulation of quantum mechanics and, consequently, the measurement process itself, the dividing line between the quantum and the classical world, cannot and must not be investigated, but simply accepted. This position has been lucidly sunmmarized by J. Bell himself [Bell, 1981]:

Making a virtue of necessity and influenced by positivistic and instrumentalist philosophies, many came to hold not only that it is difficult to find a coherent picture but that it is wrong to look for one - if not actually immoral then certainly unprofessional

The situation has seen many changes in the course of time, and the necessity of making a clear distinction between what is quantum and what is classical has given rise to many proposals for ‘easy solutions’ to the problem which are based on the possibility, for all practical purposes (FAPP), to locate the splitting between these two faces of reality at different levels.

Then came Bohmian mechanics, a theory which has made clear, in a lucid and perfectly consistent way, that there is no reason of principle requiring a dichotomic description of the world. A universal dynamical principle runs all physical processes and even though ‘it completely agrees with standard quantum predictions ’ it implies wave-packet reduction in micro-macro interactions and the classical behaviour of classical objects.

As we have mentioned, the other consistent proposal, at the nonrelativistic level, of a conceptually satisfactory solution of the macro-objectification problem is represented by the Collapse Theories which are the subject of these pages. Contrary to bohmian mechanics, they are rival theory of quantum mechanics, since they make different predictions (even though quite difficult to put into evidence) concerning various physical processes.

Let us now analyze some of the recent critical positions concerning the two just mentioned approaches (in what follows I will take advantage of the nice analysis of a paper which I have been asked to referee and of which I do not know the author). Various physicists have criticized Bohm approach on the basis that, being empirically indistinguishable from quantum mechanics, such an approach is an example of ‘bad science ’ or of ‘a degenerate research program ’. Useless to say, I do not consider such criticisms as appropriate; the conceptual advantages and the internal consistency of the approach render it an extremely appealing theoretical scheme (incidentally, one should not forget that it has been just the critical investigations on such a theory which have led Bell to derive his famous and conceptually extremely relevant inequality).

This being the situation, one would think that theories like the GRW model would be exempt from an analogous charge, since they actually are (in principle) empirically different from the standard theory. For instance they disagree from such a theory since they forbid the occurrence of macroscopic massive entangled states. In spite of this, they have been the object of an analogous attach by the adherents to the ‘new orthodoxy ’ [Bub 1997, Joos et al., 1996, Zurek, 1993] pointing out that environmental induced decoherence shows that, FAPP, collapse theories are simply phenomenological accounts of the reduced state to which one has to resort since one has no control of the degrees of freedom of the environment. When one takes such a position, one is claiming that, essentially, GRW cannot be taken as a fundamental description of nature, mainly because it suffers from the limitation of being empirically indistinguishable from the standard theory, provided such a theory is correctly applied taking into account the actual physical situation. Also in this case, and even at the level at which such an analysis is performed, I do not think that the practical indistinguishability from the standard approach is a sufficient reason not to take seriously collapse models. In fact, there are many very well known and compelling reasons (see, e.g. [Bassi, 2000 and Adler, 2003] to prefer a logically consistent unified theory to one which makes sense only due to the alleged practical impossibility of detecting the superpositions of macroscopically distinguishable states.

But this is not the whole story. Another criticism, aimed to ‘deny’ the potential interest of collapse theories makes reference to the fact that within any such theory the ensuing dynamics for the statistical operator can be considered as the reduced dynamics deriving from a unitary (and, consequently, essentially a standard quantum) dynamics for the states of an enlarged Hilbert space of a composite quantum system S+E involving, besides the physical system S of interest, an ancilla E whose degrees of freedom are completely unaccessible:due to the quantum dynamical semigroup nature of the evolution equation for the statistical operator, any GRW-like model can always be seen as a phenomenological model deriving from a standard quantum evolution on a larger Hilbert space. In this way, the unitary deterministic evolution characterizing quantum mechanics would be fully restored.

Apart from the obvious remark that such a critical attitude completely fails in grasping and purposedly ignores the most important feature of collapse theories, i.e. of dealing with individual quantum systems and not with statistical ensembles and of yielding a perfectly satisfactory description, matching our perceptions concerning individual macroscopic systems, I believe that invoking an unaccessible ancilla to account for the nonlinear and stochastic character of GRW-type theories, is once more a purely verbal way of avoiding to face the real puzzling aspects of the quantum description of macroscopic systems. And this is not the only negative aspect of such a position; any attempt considering legitimate to introduce unaccessible entities in the theory, when one takes into consideration that there are infinitely possible and inequivalent ways of doing this, amounts really to embarking oneself in a ‘degenerate research program ’.

Other reasons for ignoring the dynamical reduction program have been put forward recently by the community of scientists involved in the interesting and exciting field of quantum information. I will not spend too much time in analyzing and discussing the new position about the foundational issues which have motivated the elaboration of collapse theories. The crucial fact is that, from this perspective, one takes the theory not to be about something real ‘occuring out there ’ in a real word, but simply about information. This point is made extremely explicit in a recent paper [Zeilinger, 2006]:

information is the most basic notion of quantum mechanics, and it is information about possible measurement results that is represented in the quantum state. Measurement results are nothing more than state of the classical apparatus used by the experimentalist. The quantum system then is nothing other than the consistently constructed referent of the information represented in the quantum state.

It is clear that if one takes such a position almost all motivations to be worried by the measurement problem disappear, and with them the reasons to work out what Bell has denoted as ‘an exact version of quantum mechanics ’. Accordingly I believe that the most appropriate reply to this type of criticisms is to recall that J. Bell [Bell, 1990] has included ‘information’ among the words which must have no place in a formulation with any pretension to physical precision. In particular he has stressed that one cannot even mention information unless one has given a precise answer to the two following questions: Whose information? and Information about what?

A much more serious attitude, in our opinion, is to call attention, as many serious authors do, on the fact that since collapse theories represent rival theories with respect to standard quantum mechanics they lead to the identification of experimental situations which would allow, in principle, crucial tests to discriminate between the two. As we have discussed above, presently such tests seems not easily feasible, but an analysis of the suggested tests we have mentioned, shows that such tests are not completely out of reach as soon as some tecnological improvements in dealing with mesoscopic systems will become available.


We hope to have succeeded in giving a clear picture of the ideas, the implications, the achievements and the problems of the DRP. We conclude by stressing once more our position with respect to the Collapse Theories. Their interest derives entirely from the fact that they have given some hints about a possible way out from the difficulties characterizing standard quantum mechanics, by proving that explicit and precise models can be worked out which agree with all known predictions of the theory and nevertheless allow, on the basis of a universal dynamics governing all natural processes, to overcome in a mathematically clean and precise way the basic problems of the standard theory. In particular, the Collapse Models show how one can work out a theory that makes perfectly legitimate to take a macrorealistic position about natural processes, without contradicting any of the experimentally tested predictions of standard quantum mechanics. Finally, they might give precise hints about where to look in order to put into evidence, experimentally, possible violations of the superposition principle.


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Bell's Theorem | quantum mechanics | quantum mechanics: Bohmian mechanics