# Quantum Logic and Probability Theory

*First published Mon Feb 4, 2002; substantive revision Mon Feb 27, 2006*

At its core, quantum mechanics can be regarded as a non-classical
probability calculus resting upon a non-classical propositional logic.
More specifically, in quantum mechanics each probability-bearing
proposition of the form “the value of physical quantity *A* lies
in the range *B*” is represented by a projection operator on a
Hilbert space **H**. These form a non-Boolean — in
particular, non-distributive — orthocomplemented lattice.
Quantum-mechanical states correspond exactly to probability measures
(suitably defined) on this lattice.

What are we to make of this? Some have argued that the empirical
success of quantum mechanics calls for a revolution in logic itself.
This view is associated with the demand for a realistic interpretation
of quantum mechanics, i.e., one not grounded in any primitive notion of
measurement. Against this, there is a long tradition of interpreting
quantum mechanics operationally, that is, as being precisely a theory
of measurement. On this latter view, it is not surprising that a
“logic” of measurement-outcomes, in a setting where not all
measurements are compatible, should prove not to be Boolean. Rather,
the mystery is why it should have the *particular* non-Boolean
structure that it does in quantum mechanics. A substantial literature
has grown up around the programme of giving some independent motivation
for this structure — ideally, by deriving it from more primitive and
plausible axioms governing a generalized probability theory.

- 1. Quantum Mechanics as a Probability Calculus
- Supplement 1: The Basic Theory of Hilbert Spaces [Not yet available]
- Supplement 2: The Basic Theory of Ordering Relations

- 2. Interpretations of Quantum Logic
- 3. Generalized Probability Theory
- 4. Logics Associated to Probabilistic Models
- 5. Piron's Theorem
- 6. Classical Representations
- 7. Composite Systems
- 8. Recent Developments [Not yet available]
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Quantum Mechanics as a Probability Calculus

It is uncontroversial (though remarkable) that the formal apparatus
of quantum mechanics reduces neatly to a generalization of classical
probability in which the role played by a Boolean algebra of events in
the latter is taken over by the “quantum logic” of projection operators
on a Hilbert
space.^{[1]}
Moreover, the usual statistical
interpretation of quantum mechanics asks us to take this generalized
quantum probability theory quite literally — that is, not as merely a
formal analogue of its classical counterpart, but as a genuine doctrine
of chances. In this section, I survey this quantum probability theory
and its supporting quantum
logic.^{[2]}

[For further background on Hilbert spaces, see Supplement 1: The Basic Theory of Hilbert Spaces. For further background on ordered sets and lattices, see Supplement 2: The Basic Theory of Ordering Relations. Concepts and results explained these supplements will be used freely in what follows.]

### Quantum Probability in a Nutshell

The quantum-probabilistic formalism, as developed by von Neumann
[1932], assumes that each physical system is associated with a
(separable) Hilbert space **H**, the unit vectors of which
correspond to possible physical *states* of the system. Each
“observable” real-valued random quantity is represented by a
self-adjoint operator *A* on **H**, the spectrum of
which is the set of possible values of *A*. If *u* is a
unit vector in the domain of *A*, representing a state, then the
expected value of the observable represented by *A* in this
state is given by the inner product <*Au*,*u*>. The
observables represented by two operators *A* and *B* are
commensurable iff *A* and *B* commute, i.e., *AB =
BA*. (For further discussion, see the entry on Quantum
Mechanics.)

### The “Logic” of Projections

As stressed by von Neumann, the {0,1}-valued observables may be
regarded as encoding propositions about — or, to use his phrasing,
properties of — the state of the system. It is not difficult to show
that a self-adjoint operator *P* with spectrum contained in the
two-point set {0,1} must be a projection; i.e., *P*^{2}
= *P*. Such operators are in one-to-one correspondence with the
closed subspaces of **H**. Indeed, if *P* is a
projection, its range is closed, and any closed subspace is the range
of a unique projection. If *u* is any unit vector, then
<*Pu*,*u*> = ||*Pu*||^{2} is the
expected value of the corresponding observable in the state represented
by *u*. Since this is {0,1}-valued, we can interpret this as the
*probability* that a measurement of the observable will produce
the “affirmative” answer 1. In particular, the affirmative answer will
have probability 1 if and only if *Pu = u*; that is, *u*
lies in the range of *P*. Von Neumann concludes that

… the relation between the properties of a physical system on the one hand, and the projections on the other, makes possible a sort of logical calculus with these. However, in contrast to the concepts of ordinary logic, this system is extended by the concept of “simultaneous decidability” which is characteristic for quantum mechanics [1932, p. 253].

Let's examine this “logical calculus” of projections. Ordered by
set-inclusion, the closed subspaces of **H** form a
complete lattice, in which the meet (greatest lower bound) of a set of
subspaces is their intersection, while their join (least upper bound)
is the closed span of their union. Since a typical closed subspace has
infinitely many complementary closed subspaces, this lattice is not
distributive; however, it is orthocomplemented by the mapping

M→M^{⊥}= {v∈H| ∀u∈M(<v,u> = 0)}.

In view of the above-mentioned one-one correspondence between closed
subspaces and projections, we may impose upon the set
*L*(**H**) the structure of a complete
orthocomplemented lattice, defining *P*≤*Q*, where
*ran*(*P*) ⊆ *ran*(*Q*) and
*P*′ = 1 − *P* (so that
*ran*(*P*′) =
*ran*(*P*)^{⊥}). It is straightforward that
*P*≤*Q* just in case *PQ = QP = P*. More
generally, if *PQ = QP*, then *PQ* = *P*∧*Q*, the meet of *P* and
*Q* in *L*(**H**); also in this case their
join is given by *P*∨*Q* = *P*+*Q* −
*PQ*.

1.1 Lemma:

LetPandQbe projection operators on the Hilbert spaceH. The following are equivalent:

PQ=QP- The sublattice of
L(H) generated byP,Q,P′ andQ′ is BooleanP,Qlie in a common Boolean sub-ortholattice ofL(H).

Adhering to the idea that commuting observables — in particular,
projections — are simultaneously measurable, we conclude that the
members of a Boolean “block” (that is, a Boolean sub-ortholattice) of
*L*(**H**) are simultaneously testable. This
suggests that we can maintain a classical logical interpretation of the
meet, join and orthocomplement as applied to commuting projections.

### Probability Measures and Gleason's Theorem

The foregoing discussion motivates the following. Call projections
*P* and *Q* *orthogonal*, and write
*P*⊥*Q* iff *P* ≤ *Q*′. Note
that *P*⊥*Q* iff *PQ = QP =* 0. If *P*
and *Q* are orthogonal projections, then their join is simply
their sum; traditionally, this is denoted *P*⊕*Q*.
We denote the identity mapping on **H** by
**1**.

1.2 Definition:

A (countably additive)probability measureonL(H) is a mapping μ :L→ [0,1] such that μ(1) = 1 and, for any sequence of pair-wise orthogonal projectionsP_{i},i= 1,2,...μ(⊕_{i}P_{i}) = ∑_{i}μ(P_{i})

Here is one way in which we can manufacture a probability measure on
*L*(**H**). Let *u* be a unit vector of
**H**, and set
μ_{u}(*P*) =
<*Pu*,*u*>. This gives the usual quantum-mechanical
recipe for the probability that *P* will have value 1 in the
state *u*. Note that we can also express
μ_{u} as μ_{u}(P) =
*Tr*(*P* *P*_{u}), where
*P*_{u} is the one-dimensional projection
associated with the unit vector *u*.

More generally, if μ_{i},
*i*=1,2,…, are probability measures on
*L*(**H**), then so is any “mixture”, or convex
combination μ = Σ_{i}
*t*_{i}μ_{i} where
0≤*t*_{i}≤1 and
Σ_{i} *t*_{i} =
1. Given any sequence *u*_{1},
*u*_{2},…, of unit vectors, let
μ_{i} = μ_{u}*i* and let
*P*_{i} =
*P*_{u}*i*. Forming the operator

W=t_{1}P_{1}+t_{2}P_{2}+ … ,

one sees that

μ(P) =t_{1}Tr(PP_{1}) +t_{2}Tr(PP_{2}) + ... =Tr(WP)

An operator expressible in this way as a convex combination of
one-dimensional projections in is called a *density operator*.
Thus, every density operator *W* gives rise to a countably
additive probability measure on *L*(**H**). The
following striking converse, due to A. Gleason [1957], shows that the
theory of probability measures on *L*(**H**) is
co-extensive with the theory of (mixed) quantum mechanical states on
**H**:

1.3 Gleason's Theorem:

LetHhave dimension > 2. Then every countably additive probability measure onL(H) has the form μ(P) =Tr(WP), for a density operatorWonH.

An important consequence of Gleason's Theorem is that
*L*(**H**) does not admit any probability measures
having only the values 0 and 1. To see this, note that for any density
operator *W*, the mapping *u* →
<*Wu*,*u*> is continuous on the unit sphere of
**H**. But since the latter is connected, no continuous
function on it can take only the two values 0 and 1. This result is
often taken to rule out the possibility of ‘hidden
variables’ — an issue taken up in more detail in section 6.

### The Reconstruction of QM

From the single premise that the “experimental propositions”
associated with a physical system are encoded by projections in the way
indicated above, one can reconstruct the rest of the formal apparatus
of quantum mechanics. The first step, of course, is Gleason's theorem,
which tells us that probability measures on
*L*(**H**) correspond to density operators. There
remains to recover, e.g., the representation of “observables” by
self-adjoint operators, and the dynamics (unitary evolution). The
former can be recovered with the help of the Spectral theorem and the
latter with the aid of a deep theorem of E. Wigner on the projective
representation of groups. See also R. Wright [1980]. A detailed outline
of this reconstruction (which involves some distinctly non-trivial
mathematics) can be found in the book of Varadarajan [1985]. The
point to bear in mind is that, once the quantum-logical skeleton
*L*(**H**) is in place, the remaining statistical
and dynamical apparatus of quantum mechanics is essentially fixed. In
this sense, then, quantum mechanics — or, at any rate, its
mathematical framework — *reduces to* quantum logic and its
attendant probability theory.

## 2. Interpretations of Quantum Logic

The reduction of QM to probability theory based on
*L*(**H**) is mathematically compelling, but what
does it tell us about QM — or, assuming QM to be a correct and
complete physical theory, about the world? How, in other words, are we
to interpret the quantum logic *L*(**H**)? The
answer will turn on how we unpack the phrase, freely used above,

(*) The value of the observableAlies in the rangeB.

One possible reading of (*) is *operational*: “measurement of
the observable *A* would yield (or will yield, or has yielded) a
value in the set *B*”. On this view, projections represent
statements about the possible results of measurements. This sits badly
with realists of a certain stripe, who, shunning reference to
‘measurement’, prefer to understand (*) as a *property
ascription*: “the system has a certain categorical property, which
corresponds to the observable *A* having, independently of any
measurement, a value in the set *B*”. (One must be careful in
how one understands this last phrase, however: construed incautiously,
it seems to posit a hidden-variables interpretation of quantum
mechanics of just the sort ruled out by Gleason's Theorem. I will have
more to say about this below.)

### Realist Quantum Logic

The interpretation of projection operators as representing the
properties of a physical system is already explicit in von Neumann's
*Grundlagen.*. However, the logical operations discussed there
apply only to commuting projections, which are identified with
simultaneously decidable propositions. In [1936] von Neumann and
Birkhoff took a step further, proposing to interpret the
lattice-theoretic meet and join of projections as their conjunction and
disjunction, *whether or not* they commute. Immediately this
proposal faces the problem that the lattice
*L*(**H**) is not distributive, making it
impossible to give these ‘quantum’ connectives a
truth-functional interpretation. Undaunted, von Neumann and Birkhoff
suggested that the empirical success of quantum mechanics as a
framework for physics casts into doubt the universal validity of the
distributive laws of propositional logic. Their phrasing remains
cautious:

Whereas logicians have usually assumed that properties … of negation were the ones least able to withstand a critical analysis, the study of mechanics points to the distributive identities … as the weakest link in the algebra of logic. [1937, p. 839]

In the 1960s and early 1970s, this thesis was advanced rather more
aggressively by a number of authors, including especially David
Finkelstein and Hilary Putnam, who argued that quantum mechanics
requires a revolution in our understanding of logic *per se*.
According to Putnam [1968], “Logic is as empirical as geometry.
… We live in a world with a non-classical logic.”

For Putnam, the elements of *L*(**H**) represent
categorical properties that an object possesses, or does not,
independently of whether or not we look. Inasmuch as this picture of
physical properties is confirmed by the empirical success of quantum
mechanics, we must, on this view, accept that the way in which physical
properties actually hang together is not Boolean. Since logic is, for
Putnam, very much the study of how physical properties actually hang
together, he concludes that classical logic is simply mistaken: the
distributive law is not universally valid.

Classically, if *S* is the set of states of a physical
system, then *every* subset of *S* corresponds to a
categorical property of the system, and vice versa. In quantum
mechanics, the state space is the (projective) unit sphere *S* =
*S*(**H**) of a Hilbert space. However, not all
subsets of *S* correspond to quantum-mechanical properties of
the system. The latter correspond only to subsets of the special form
*S* ∩ **M**, for **M** a
closed linear subspace of **H**. In particular, only
subsets of this form are assigned probabilities. This leaves us with
two options. One is to take only these special properties as
‘real’ (or ‘physical’, or
‘meaningful’), regarding more general subsets of *S*
as corresponding to no real categorical properties at all. The other is
to regard the ‘quantum’ properties as a small subset of the
set of all physically (or at any rate, metaphysically) reasonable, but
not necessarily *observable*, properties of the system. On this
latter view, the set of *all* properties of a physical system is
entirely classical in its logical structure, but we decline to assign
probabilities to the non-observable
properties.^{[3]}

This second position, while certainly not inconsistent with realism
*per se*, turns upon a distinction involving a notion of
“observation”, “measurement”, “test”, or something of this sort — a
notion that realists are often at pains to avoid in connection with
fundamental physical theory. Of course, any realist account of a
statistical physical theory such as quantum mechanics will ultimately
have to render up some explanation of how measurements are supposed to
take place. That is, it will have to give an account of which physical
interactions between “object” and “probe” systems count as
measurements, and of how these interactions cause the probe system to
evolve into final ‘outcome-states’ that correspond to —
and have the same probabilities as — the outcomes predicted by the
theory. This is the notorious *measurement problem*.

In fact, Putnam advanced his version of quantum-logical realism as
offering a (radical) dissolution of the measurement problem: According
to Putnam, the measurement problem (and indeed every other
quantum-mechanical “paradox”) arises through an improper application of
the distributive law, and hence *disappears* once this is
recognized. This proposal, however, is widely regarded as
mistaken.^{[4]}

As mentioned above, realist interpretations of quantum mechanics
must be careful in how they construe the phrase “the observable
*A* has a value in the set *B*”. The simplest and most
traditional proposal — often dubbed the “eigenstate-eigenvalue link”
(Fine 1973) — is that (*) holds if and only if a measurement of
*A* yields a value in the set *B* with certainty, i.e.,
with (quantum-mechanical!) probability 1. While this certainly gives a
realist interpretation of
(*),^{[5]}
it does not provide a solution to the
measurement problem. Indeed, we can use it to give a sharp formulation
of that problem: even though *A* is certain to yield a value in
*B* when measured, unless the quantum state is an eigenstate of
the measured observable *A*, the system does not possess any
categorical property corresponding to *A*'s having a specific
value in the set *B*. Putnam seems to assume that a realist
interpretation of (*) should consist in assigning to *A* some
unknown value within *B*, for which quantum mechanics yields a
non-trivial probability. However, an attempt to make such assignments
simultaneously for all observables runs afoul of Gleason's
Theorem.^{[6]}

### Operational Quantum Logic

If we put aside scruples about ‘measurement’ as a
primitive term in physical theory, and accept a principled distinction
between ‘testable’ and non-testable properties, then the
fact that *L*(**H**) is not Boolean is
unremarkable, and carries no implication about logic *per se*.
Quantum mechanics is, on this view, a theory about the possible
statistical distributions of outcomes of certain measurements, and its
non-classical ‘logic’ simply reflects the fact that not all
observable phenomena can be observed simultaneously. Because of this,
the set of probability-bearing events (or propositions) is
*less* rich than it would be in classical probability theory,
and the set of possible statistical distributions, accordingly, less
tightly constrained. That some ‘non-classical’ probability
distributions allowed by this theory are actually manifested in nature
is perhaps surprising, but in no way requires any deep shift in our
understanding of logic or, for that matter, of probability.

This is hardly the last word, however. Having accepted all of the
above, there still remains the question of *why* the logic of
measurement outcomes should have the very special form
*L*(**H**), and never anything more
general.^{[7]}
This question entertains the idea that the
formal structure of quantum mechanics may be *uniquely
determined* by a small number of reasonable assumptions, together
perhaps with certain manifest regularities in the observed phenomena.
This possibility is already contemplated in von Neumann's
*Grundlagen* (and also his later work in continuous geometry),
but first becomes explicit — and programmatic — in the work of George
Mackey [1957, 1963]. Mackey presents a sequence of six axioms, framing
a very conservative generalized probability theory, that underwrite the
construction of a ‘logic’ of experimental propositions, or,
in his terminology, ‘questions’, having the structure of a
sigma-orthomodular poset. The outstanding problem, for Mackey, was to
explain why this poset *ought to* be isomorphic to
*L*(**H**):

Almost all modern quantum mechanics is based implicitly or explicitly on the following assumption, which we shall state as an axiom:Axiom VII: The partially ordered set of all questions in quantum mechanics is isomorphic to the partially ordered set of all closed subspaces of a separable, infinite dimensional Hilbert space.This axiom has rather a different character from Axioms I through VI. These all had some degree of physical naturalness and plausibility. Axiom VII seems entirely ad hoc. Why do we make it? Can we justify making it? … Ideally, one would like to have a list of physically plausible assumptions from which one could deduce Axiom VII. Short of this one would like a list from which one could deduce a set of possibilities for the structure … all but one of which could be shown to be inconsistent with suitably planned experiments. [19, pp. 71-72]

Since Mackey's writing there has grown up an extensive technical literature exploring variations on his axiomatic framework in an effort to supply the missing assumptions. The remainder of this article presents a brief survey of the current state of this project.

## 3. Generalized Probability Theory

Rather than restate Mackey's axioms verbatim, I shall paraphrase
them in the context of an approach to generalized probability theory
due to D. J. Foulis and C. H. Randall having — among the many more or
less homologous approaches
available^{[8]}
— certain advantages of
simplicity and flexibility. References for this section are [Foulis,
Greechie and Rüttimann 1992, Foulis, Piron and Randall 1983,
Foulis and Randall 1982, Randall and Foulis 1983; see also Gudder 1985
and Wilce 2000b for surveys.]

### Discrete Classical Probability Theory

It will be helpful to begin with a review of classical probability
theory**.** In its simplest formulation, classical
probability theory deals with a (discrete) set *E* of mutually
exclusive outcomes, as of some measurement, experiment, etc., and with
the various *probability weights* that can be defined thereon
— that is, with mappings ω : *E* → [0,1]
summing to 1 over
*E*.^{[9]}

Notice that the set Δ(*E*) of all probability weights
on *E* is *convex*, in that, given any sequence
ω_{1},ω_{2},… of probability weights
and any sequence *t*_{1},*t*_{2},…
of non-negative real numbers summing to one, the convex sum or
‘mixture’ *t*_{1}ω_{1} +
*t*_{2}ω_{2} + … (taken pointwise
on *E*) is again a probability weight. The extreme points of
this convex set are exactly the “point-masses” δ(*x*)
associated with the outcomes *x* ∈ *E*:

δ(x)(y) = 1 ifx=y, and 0 otherwise.

Thus, Δ(*E*) is a *simplex*: each point
ω∈Δ(*E*) is representable in a unique way as a
convex combination of extreme points, namely:

ω = ∑ω(x)δ(x)

We need also to recall the concept of a *random variable*. If
*E* is an outcome set and *V*, some set of
‘values’ (real numbers, pointer-readings, or what not), a
*V*-*valued random variable* is simply a mapping
*f* : *E* → *V*. The heuristic (but it need
only be taken as that) is that one ‘measures’ the random
variable *f* by ‘performing’ the experiment
represented by *E* and, upon obtaining the outcome *x*
∈ *E*, recording *f*(*x*) as the measured
value. Note that if *V* is a set of real numbers, or, more
generally, a subset of a vector space, we may define the *expected
value* of *f* in a state ω ∈ Δ(*E*)
by:

E(f,ω) = ∑_{x∈E}f(x)ω(x).

### Test Spaces

A very natural direction in which to generalize discrete classical
probability theory is to allow for a multiplicity of outcome-sets, each
representing a different ‘experiment’. To formalize
this, let us agree that a *test space* is a non-empty collection
A of non-empty sets *E*,*F*,…, each construed as a
discrete outcome-set as in classical probability theory. Each set
*E* ∈
A
is called a
*test*. The set *X* =
∪A of all outcomes of all tests belonging to
A
is called the *outcome space*
of
A. Notice that we allow distinct tests
to overlap, i.e., to have outcomes in
common.^{[10]}

If
A
is a test space with
outcome-space *X*, a *state* on
A
is a mapping ω : *X* → [0,1] such
that Σ_{x∈E} ω(*x*) =
1 for every test *E* ∈
A.
Thus,
a state is a consistent assignment of a probability weight to
each test — consistent in that, where two distinct tests share a
common outcome, the state assigns that outcome the same probability
whether it is secured as a result of one test or the other. (This may
be regarded as a normative requirement on the outcome-identifications
implicit in the structure of
A:
if
outcomes of two tests are not equiprobable in all states, they ought
not to be identified.) The set of all states on
A
is denoted by
ω(A).
This is a convex set, but in contrast to the situation in discrete
classical probability theory, it is generally not a simplex.

The concept of a random variable admits several generalizations to
the setting of test spaces. Let us agree that a *simple
(real-valued) random variable* on a test space
A
is a mapping *f* : *E* →
**R** where *E* is a test in
A.
We define the *expected value* of *f* in a
state ω ∈
ω(A) in the
obvious way, namely, as the expected value of *f* with respect
to the probability weight obtained by restricting ω to *E*
(provided, of course, that this expected value exists). One can go on
to define more general classes of random variables by taking suitable
limits (for details, see [Younce, 1987]).

In classical probability theory (and especially in classical
statistics) one usually focuses, not on the set of all possible
probability weights, but on some designated subset of these (e.g.,
those belonging to a given family of distributions). Accordingly,
by a *probabilistic model*, I mean pair
(A,Δ) consisting of a test space
A
and a designated set of states Δ
⊆
ω(A) on
A.
I'll refer to
A
as the
*test space* and to Δ as the *state space* of the
model.

I'll now indicate how this framework can accommodate both the usual measure-theoretic formalism of full-blown classical probability theory and the Hilbert-space formalism of quantum probability theory.

### Kolmogorovian Probability Theory

Let *S* be a set, construed for the moment as the state-space of
a physical system, and let Σ be a sigma-field of subsets of
*S*. We can regard each partition *E* of *S* into
countably many pair-wise disjoint Σ-measurable subsets as
representing a ‘coarse-grained’ approximation to an
imagined perfect experiment that would reveal the state of the system.
Let
A
be the test space consisting of
all such partitions. Note that the outcome set for
A
is the set *X* = *B* − {∅} of
non-empty Σ-measurable subsets of *S*. Evidently, the
probability weights on
A
correspond
exactly to the countably additive probability measures on Σ.

### Quantum Probability Theory

Let **H** denote a complex Hilbert space and let
A
denote the collection of (unordered)
orthonormal bases of **H**. Thus, the outcome-space
*X* of
∪A will be the unit
sphere of **H**. Note that if *u* is any unit
vector of **H** and *E* ∈
A
is any orthonormal basis, we have

∑_{x∈E}|<u,x>|^{2}= ||u||^{2}= 1

Thus, each unit vector of **H** determines a
probability weight on
A.
Quantum
mechanics asks us to take this literally: any ‘maximal’
discrete quantum-mechanical observable is modeled by an orthonormal
basis, and any pure quantum mechanical state, by a unit vector in
exactly this way. Conversely, every orthonormal basis and every unit
vector are understood to correspond to such a measurement and such a
state.

Gleason's theorem can now be invoked to identify the states on
A
with the density operators on
**H**: to each state ω in
ω(A_{H}) there corresponds a unique
density operator *W* such that, for every unit vector *x*
of **H**, ω(*x*) =
<*Wx*,*x*> =
*Tr*(*WP*_{x}),
*P*_{x} being the one-dimensional projection
associated with *x*. Conversely, of course, every such density
operator defines a unique state by the formula above. We can also
represent simple real-valued random variables operator-theoretically.
Each bounded simple random variable *f* gives rise to a bounded
self-adjoint operator *A* =
Σ_{x∈E}
*f*(*x*)*P*_{x}. The spectral
theorem tells us that every self-adjoint operator on **H**
can be obtained by taking suitable limits of operators of this
form.

## 4. Logics associated with probabilistic models

Associated with any statistical model
(A,Δ) are several partially ordered sets, each of
which has some claim to the status of an ‘empirical logic’
associated with the model. In this section, I'll discuss two: the
so-called *operational logic*
Π(A) and the *property lattice*
**L**(A,Δ). Under
relatively benign conditions on
A,
the
former is an *orthoalgebra.* The latter is always a complete
lattice, and under plausible further assumptions, atomic. Moreover,
there is a natural order preserving mapping from Π to
**L**. This is not generally an order-isomorphism, but
when it is, we obtain a complete orthomodular lattice, and thus come a
step closer to the projection lattice of a Hilbert space.

### Operational Logics

If
A
is a test space, an
A*-event* is a set of
A-outcomes
that is contained in some test.
In other words, an
A-event
is simply an
event in the classical sense for any one of the tests comprising
A.
Now, if *A* and *B* are
two
A-events, we say that *A* and
*B* are *orthogonal*, and write
*A*⊥*B*, if they are disjoint and their union is
again an event. We say that two orthogonal events are
*complements* of one another if their union is a test. We say
that events *A* and *B* are *perspective*, and
write *A*~*B*, if they share any common complement.
(Notice that any two tests *E* and *F* are perspective,
since they are both complementary to the empty event.)

4.1 Definition:

A test space A is said to bealgebraicif for all eventsA,B,Cof A,A~BandB⊥CimpliesA⊥C.

While it is possible to construct perfectly plausible examples of test spaces that are not algebraic, most test spaces that one encounters ‘in nature’ — including the Borel and quantum test spaces described in the preceding section — do seem to enjoy this property. The more important point is that, as an axiom, algebraicity is relatively benign, in the sense that many test spaces can be ‘completed’ to become algebraic. In particular, if every outcome has probability greater than .5 in at least one state, then A is contained in an algebraic test space B having the same outcomes and the same states as A. (See [Gudder, 1985] for details).

Suppose now that
A
is algebraic. It
is easy to see that the relation **~** of perspectivity is
then an equivalence relation on the set of
A-events.
More than this, if
A
is algebraic, then **~** is a
*congruence* for the partial binary operation of forming unions
of orthogonal events: in other words, *A*~*B* and
*B*⊥*C* imply that *A*∪*C* ~
*B*∪*C* for all
A-events
*A*, *B*, and *C*.

Let
Π(A) be the set of
equivalence classes of
A-events
under
perspectivity, and denote the equivalence class of an event *A*
by *p*(*A*); we then have a natural partial binary
operation on
Π(A) defined by
*p*(*A*)⊕*p*(*B*) =
*p*(*A*∪*B*) for orthogonal events *A*
and *B*. Setting 0 := *p*(∅) and 1 :=
*p*(*E*), *E* any member of
A,
we obtain a partial-algebraic structure
(Π(A),⊕,0,1), called the *logic*
of
A.
This satisfies the following
conditions:

- ⊕ is associative and commutative:
- If
*a*⊕(*b*⊕*c*) is defined, so is (*a*⊕*b*)⊕*c*, and the two are equal - If
*a*⊕*b*is defined, so is*b*⊕*a*, and the two are equal.

- If
- 0⊕
*a*=*a*, for every*a*∈**L** - For every
*a*∈**L**, there exists a unique*a*′ ∈**L**with*a*⊕*a*′ = 1 *a*⊕*a*exists only if*a*= 0

We may now define:

4.2 Definition:

A structure (L,⊕,0,1) satisfying conditions (a)-(d) above is called anorthoalgebra.

Thus, the logic of an algebraic test space is an orthoalgebra. One can show that, conversely, every orthoalgebra arises as the logic Π(A) of an algebraic test space A (Golfin [1988]). Note that non-isomorphic test spaces can have isomorphic logics.

### Orthocoherence

Any orthoalgebra **L** is partially ordered by the
relation *a*≤*b* iff *b* =
*a*⊕*c* for some *c*⊥*a*.
Relative to this ordering, the mapping
*a*→*a*′ is an orthocomplementation and
*a*⊥*b* iff *a*≤*b*′. It can
be shown that *a*⊕*b* is always a minimal upper
bound for *a* and *b*, but it is generally not the
*least* upper bound. Indeed, we have the following [ref]:

4.3 Lemma:

For an orthoalgebra (L,⊕,0,1), the following are equivalent:

a⊕b=a∨b, for alla,binL- If
a⊕b,b⊕c, andc⊕aall exist, then so doesa⊕b⊕c- The orthoposet (
L,≤,′) isorthomodular, i.e., for alla,b∈L, ifa≤bthen (b∧a′) ∨aexists and equalsb.

An orthoalgebra satisfying condition (b) is said to be
*orthocoherent*. In other words: an orthoalgebra is
ortho-coherent if and only if finite pair-wise summable subsets of
**L** are jointly summable. The lemma tells us that every
orthocoherent orthoalgebra is, *inter alia*, an orthomodular
poset. Conversely, an orthocomplemented poset is orthomodular iff
*a*⊕*b* = *a*∨*b* is defined for all pairs with
*a*≤*b*′ and the resulting partial binary
operation is associative — in which case the resulting structure
(**L**,⊕,0,1) is an orthocoherent orthoalgebra, the
canonical ordering on which agrees with the given ordering on
**L**. Thus, orthomodular posets (the framework for
Mackey's version of quantum logic) are equivalent to orthocoherent
orthoalgebras.

Some version of orthocoherence was taken by Mackey and many of his successors as an axiom. (It appears, in an infinitary form, as Mackey's axiom V; a related but stronger condition appears in the definition of a partial Boolean algebra in the work of Kochen and Specker [1965].) However, it is quite easy to construct simple model test spaces, having perfectly straightforward — even classical — interpretations, the logics of which are not orthocoherent. As far as I know, there has never been given any entirely compelling reason for regarding orthocoherence as an essential feature of all reasonable physical models. Moreover, certain apparently quite well-motivated constructions that one wants to perform with test spaces tend to destroy orthocoherence (see Section 7).

### Lattices of Properties

The decision to accept measurements and their outcomes as primitive
concepts in our description of physical systems does not mean that we
must forgo talk of the physical properties of such a system. Indeed,
such talk is readily accommodated in our present
formalism.^{[11]}
In the
approach we have been pursuing, a physical system is represented by a
probabilistic model
(A,Δ), and
the system's states are identified with the probability weights in
Δ. Classically, *any* subset Γ of the state-space
Δ corresponds to a categorical property of the system. However,
in quantum mechanics, and indeed even classically, not every such
property will be testable (or “physical”). (In quantum mechanics, only
subsets of the state-space corresponding to closed subspaces of the
Hilbert space are testable; in classical mechanics, one usually takes
only, e.g., Borel sets to correspond to testable properties: the
difference is that the testable properties in the latter case happen
still to form a Boolean algebra of sets, where in the former case, they
do not.)

One way to frame this distinction is as follows. The
*support* of a set of states Γ⊆Δ is the set

S(Γ) = {x∈X| ∃ω∈Γ(ω(x) > 0) }

of outcomes that are possible when the property Γ obtains.
There is a sense in which two properties are empirically
indistinguishable if they have the same support: we cannot distinguish
between them by means of a single execution of a single test. We might
therefore wish to identify physical properties with classes of
physically indistinguishable classical properties, or, equivalently,
with their associated supports. However, if we wish to adhere to the
programme of representing physical properties as subsets (rather than
as equivalence-classes of subsets) of the state-space, we can do so, as
follows. Define a mapping *F* :
℘(*X*) →
℘(Δ)
by *F*(*J*) = {ω
∈Δ| *S*(ω) ⊆ *J* }. The mapping
Γ → *F*(*S*(Γ)) is then a *closure
operator* on
℘(Δ),
and the
collection of closed sets (that is, the range of *F*) is a
complete lattice of sets, closed under arbitrary
intersection.^{[12]}
Evidently, classical properties — subsets of Δ — have the same
support iff they have the same closure, so we may identify physical
properties with closed subsets of the state-space:

4.4 Definition:

Theproperty latticeof the model (A,Δ) is the complete latticeL=L(A,Δ) of all subsets of δ of the formF(J),Jany set of outcomes.^{[13]}

We now have two different ‘logics’ associated with an
entity
(A,Δ) with
A
algebraic: a ‘logic’
Π(A) of experimental propositions that is an
orthoalgebra, but generally not a lattice, and a ‘logic’
**L**(A,Δ) of
properties that is a complete lattice, but rarely orthocomplemented in
any natural way (Randall and Foulis, 1983). The two are connected by a
natural mapping [ ] : Π → **L**, given by
*p* → [*p*] =
*F*(*J*_{p}) where for each
*p*∈Π, *J*_{p} =
{*x*∈ *X* |
*p*(*x*)
≰
*p*′ }. That is,
*J*_{p} is the set of outcomes that are
consistent with *p*, and [*p*] is the largest (i.e.,
weakest) physical property making *p* certain to be confirmed if
tested.

The mapping *p* → [*p*] is order preserving. For
both the classical and quantum-mechanical models considered above, it
is in fact an order-isomorphism. Note that whenever this is the case,
Π will inherit from **L** the structure of a complete
lattice, which will then automatically be orthomodular by Lemma 4.3. In
other words, in such cases we have only *one* logic, which is a
complete orthomodular lattice. While it is surely too much to expect
that every *conceivable* physical system should enjoy this
property — indeed, we can easily construct toy examples to the
contrary — the condition is at least reasonably transparent in its
meaning.

## 5. Piron's Theorem

Suppose that the logic and property lattices of a model *are*
isomorphic, so that the logic of propositions/properties is a complete
orthomodular lattice. The question then arises: how close does this
bring us to quantum mechanics — that is, to the projection lattice
*L*(**H**) of a Hilbert space?

The answer is: without additional assumptions, not very. The lattice
*L*(**H**) has several quite special
order-theoretic features. First it is *atomic* — every element
is the join of minimal non-zero elements (i.e., one-dimensional
subspaces). Second, it is *irreducible* — it can not be
expressed as a non-trivial direct product of simpler
OMLs.^{[14]}
Finally,
and most significantly, it satisfies the so-called *atomic covering
law*: if *p* ∈ *L*(**H**) is an
atom and *p*
≰
*q*,
then *p*
∨
*q*
*covers* *q* (no element of
*L*(**H**) lies strictly between *p*
∨
*q* and *q*).

These properties do not quite suffice to capture
*L*(**H**), but they do get us into the right
ballpark. Let **V** be any inner product space over an
involutive division ring *D*. A subspace **M** of
**V** is said to be ⊥-*closed* iff
**M** = **M**^{⊥⊥}, where
**M**^{⊥} =
{*v*∈**V** |
∀*m*∈**M**(
<*v*,*m*> = 0)}. Ordered by set-inclusion, the
collection *L*(**V**) of all ⊥-closed
subspaces of **V** forms a complete atomic lattice,
orthocomplemented by the mapping **M** →
**M**^{⊥}. A theorem of Amemiya and Araki
[1965] shows that a real, complex or quaternionic inner product space
**V** with *L*(**V**) orthomodular, is
necessarily complete. For this reason, an inner product space
**V** over an involutive division ring is called a
*generalized Hilbert space* if its lattice of closed subspaces
*L*(**V**) is orthomodular. The following
representation theorem is due to C. Piron [1964]:

5.1 Theorem:

LetLbe a complete, atomic, irreducible orthomodular lattice satisfying the atomic covering law. IfLcontains at least 4 orthogonal atoms, then there exists an involutive division ringDand an inner-product spaceVoverDsuch thatLis isomorphic toL(V).

It should be noted that generalized Hilbert spaces have been
constructed over fairly exotic division
rings.^{[15]}
Thus, while it brings
us tantalizingly close, Piron's theorem does not quite bring us all the
way back to orthodox quantum mechanics.

### Conditioning and the Covering Law

Let us call a complete orthomodular lattice satisfying the
hypotheses of Piron's theorem a *Piron lattice*. Can we give any
general reason for supposing that the logic/property lattice of a
physical system (one for which these are isomorphic) is a Piron
lattice? Or, failing this, can we at least ascribe some clear physical
content to these assumptions? The atomicity of *L* follows if we
assume that every pure state represents a “physical property”. This is
a strong assumption, but its content seems clear enough. Irreducibility
is usually regarded as a benign assumption, in that a reducible system
can be decomposed into its irreducible parts, to each of which Piron's
Theorem applies.

The covering law presents a more delicate problem. While it is
probably safe to say that no simple and entirely compelling argument
has been given for assuming its general validity, Piron [1964, 1976]
and others (e.g., Beltrametti and Cassinelli [1981] and Guz [1980])
have derived the covering law from assumptions about the way in which
measurement results warrant inference from an initial state to a final
state. Here is a brief sketch of how this argument goes. Suppose that
there is some reasonable way to define, for an initial state *q*
of the system, represented by an atom of the logic/property lattice
*L*, a final state φ_{p}(*q*) —
either another atom, or perhaps 0 — conditional on the proposition
*p* having been confirmed. Various arguments can be adduced
suggesting that the only reasonable candidate for such a mapping is the
*Sasaki projection* φ_{p} : *L*
→ *L*, defined by φ_{p}(*q*) =
(*q*
∨
*p*′)
∧
*p*.^{[16]}
It can be shown that
an atomic OML satisfies the atomic covering law just in case Sasaki
projections take atoms again to atoms, or to 0. Another interesting
view of the covering law is developed by Cohen and Svetlichny
[1987].

## 6. Classical Representations

The perennial question in the interpretation of quantum mechanics is
that of whether or not essentially classical explanations are
available, even in principle, for quantum-mechanical phenomena. Quantum
logic has played a large role in shaping (and clarifying) this
discussion, in particular by allowing us to be quite precise about what
we *mean* by a classical explanation.

### Classical Embeddings

Suppose we are given a statistical model
(A,Δ). A very straightforward approach to constructing
a “classical interpretation” of
(A,Δ) would begin by trying to embed
A
in a Borel test space
B,
with the hope of then accounting for the statistical
states in δ as averages over “hidden” classical — that is,
dispersion-free — states on the latter. Thus, we'd want to find a set
*S* and a mapping *X* →
℘(*S*) assigning to each outcome *x* of
A
a *set* *x** ⊆
*S* in such a way that, for each test *E* ∈
A,
{*x** |
*x* ∈
*E*} forms a partition of *S*. If this can be done, then
each outcome *x* of
A
simply
records the fact that the system is in one of a certain set of states,
namely, *x**. If we let Σ be the Σ-algebra of sets
generated by sets of the form {*x** |
*x* ∈
*X*}, we find that each probability measure μ on Σ
pulls back to a state μ* on
A,
namely,
μ*(*x*) = μ(*x**). So long as every state
in δ is of this form, we may claim to have given a completely
classical interpretation of the model
(A,Δ).

The minimal candidate for *S* is the set of *all*
dispersion-free states on
A.
Setting
*x** = {*s*∈*S* |
*s*(*x*) = 1}
gives us a classical interpretation as above, which I'll call the
*classical image* of
A.
Any
other classical interpretation factors through this one. Notice,
however, that the mapping *x* → *x** is injective
only if there are sufficiently many dispersion-free states to separate
distinct outcomes of
A.
If
A
has *no* dispersion-free states at
all, then its classical image is *empty*. Gleason's theorem
tells us that this is the case for quantum-mechanical models. Thus,
this particular kind of classical explanation is not available for
quantum mechanical models.

It is sometimes overlooked that, even if a test space
A
does have a separating set of
dispersion-free states, there may exist statistical states on
A
that *can not* be realized as
mixtures of these. The classical image provides no explanation for such
states. For a very simple example of this sort of thing, consider the
the test space:

A = {{a,x,b}, {b,y,c}, {c,z,a}}

and the state ω(*a*) = ω(*b*) =
ω(*c*) = ½, ω(*x*) =
ω(*y*) = ω(*z*) = 0. It is a simple exercise
to show that ω cannot be expressed as a weighted average of
{0,1}-valued states on
A.
For further
examples and discussion of this point, see Wright [1980].]

### Contextual Hidden Variables

The upshot of the foregoing discussion is that most test spaces
can't be embedded into any classical test space, and that even where
such an embedding exists, it typically fails to account for some of the
model's states. However, there is one very important class of models
for which a satisfactory classical interpretation is *always*
possible. Let us call a test space
A
*semi-classical* if its tests do not overlap; i.e., if
*E* ∩ *F* = ∅ for *E*, *F*
∈
A,
with
*E*≠*F*.

6.1 Lemma:

Let A be semi-classical. Then A has a separating set of dispersion-free states, and every extreme state on A is dispersion-free.

As long as
A
is locally countable
(i.e., no test *E* in
A
is
uncountable), every state can be represented as a convex combination,
in a suitable sense, of extreme states [Wilce, 1992]. Thus, every state
of a locally countable semi-classical test space has a classical
interpretation.

Even though neither Borel test spaces nor quantum test spaces are semi-classical, one might argue that in any real laboratory situation, semi-classicality is the rule. Ordinarily, when one writes down in one's laboratory notebook that one has performed a given test and obtained a given outcome, one always has a record of which test was performed. Indeed, given any test space A, we may always form a semi-classical test space simply by forming the co-product (disjoint union) of the tests in A. More formally:

6.2 Definition:

For each testEin A, letE˜ = { (x,E) |x∈E}. Thesemi-classical coverof A is the test spaceA˜ = {

E˜ |E∈ A }.

We can regard
A
as arising from
A˜
by deletion of the record of
which test was performed to secure a given outcome. Note that every
state on
A
defines a state
ω˜ on
A˜
by
ω˜(*x*,*E*) = ω(*x*). The mapping
ω → ω˜ is plainly injective; thus, we may
identify the state-space of
A
with a
subset of the state-space of
A˜.
Notice that there will typically be many states
on
A˜ that *do not*
descend to states on
A.
We might wish
to think of these as “non-physical”, since they do not respect the
(presumably, physically motivated) outcome-identifications whereby
A
is defined.

Since it is semi-classical,
A˜
admits a classical interpretation, as per Lemma
7.1. Let's examine this. An element of *S*(A˜) amounts to a mapping
*f* :
A˜
→
*X*, assigning to each test *E* ∈
A,
an outcome *f*(*E*) ∈
*E*. This is a (rather brutal) example of what is meant by a
*contextual (dispersion-free) hidden variable*. The construction
above tells us that such contextual hidden variables will be available
for statistical models quite generally. For other results to the same
effect, see Kochen and Specker [1967], Gudder [1970], Holevo [1982],
and, in a different direction, Pitowsky
[1989].^{[17]}

Note that the simple random variables on
A
correspond exactly to the simple random variables on
A˜,
and that these, in turn,
correspond to *some* of the simple random variables (in the
usual sense) on the measurable space *S*(A˜).
Thus, we have the following
picture: The model
(A,Δ) can
always be obtained from a classical model simply by omitting some
random variables, and identifying outcomes that can no longer be
distinguished by those that remain.

All of this might suggest that our generalized probability theory presents no significant conceptual departure from classical probability theory. On the other hand, models constructed along the foregoing lines have a distinctly ad hoc character. In particular, the set of “physical” states in one of the classical (or semi-classical) models constructed above is determined not by any independent physical principle, but only by consistency with the original, non-semiclassical model. Another objection is that the contextual hidden variables introduced in this section are badly non-local. It is by now widely recognized that this non-locality is the principal locus of non-classicality in quantum (and more general) probability models. (For more on this, see the entry on the Bell inequalities.)

## 7. Composite Systems

Some of the most puzzling features of quantum mechanics arise in connection with attempts to describe compound physical systems. It is in this context, for instance, that both the measurement problem and the non-locality results centered on Bell's theorem arise. It is interesting that coupled systems also present a challenge to the quantum-logical programme. I will conclude this article with a description of two results that show that the coupling of quantum-logical models tends to move us further from the realm of Hilbert space quantum mechanics.

### The Foulis-Randall Example

A particularly striking result in this connection is the observation
of Foulis and Randall [1981] that any reasonable (and reasonably
general) tensor product of orthoalgebras will fail to preserve
ortho-coherence. Let
A_{5}
denote the test space

{{a,x,b}, {b,y,c}, {c,z,d}, {d,w,e}, {e,v,s}}

consisting of five three-outcome tests pasted together in a loop.
This test space is by no means pathological; it is both ortho-coherent
and algebraic. Moreover, it admits a separating set of dispersion-free
states and hence, a classical interpretation. Now consider how we might
model a compound system consisting of two separated sub-systems each
modeled by
A_{5}. We would need
to construct a test space
B
and a
mapping
⊗ :
*X* ×
*X* → *Y* =
∪B
satisfying, minimally, the following;

- For all outcomes
*x*,*y*,*z*∈*X*, if*x*⊥*y*, then*x*⊗*z*⊥*y*⊗*z*and*z*⊗*x*⊥*z*⊗*y*, - For each pair of states α, β ∈
ω(A
_{5}), there exists at least one state ω on B such that ω(*x*⊗*y*) = α(*x*)β(*y*), for all outcomes*x*,*y*∈*X*.

Foulis and Randall show that no such embedding exists for which B is orthocoherent.

### Aerts' Theorem

Another result having a somewhat similar force is that of Aerts
[1982]. If *L*_{1} and *L*_{2} are two
Piron lattices, Aerts constructs in a rather natural way a lattice
*L* representing two *separated* systems, each modeled by
one of the given lattices. Here “separated” means that each pure state
of the larger system *L* is entirely determined by the states of
the two component systems *L*_{1} and
*L*_{2}. Aerts then shows that *L* is again a
Piron lattice iff at least one of the two factors
*L*_{1} and *L*_{2} is classical. (This
result has recently been strengthened by Ischi [2000] in several
ways.)

The thrust of these no-go results is that straightforward
constructions of plausible models for composite systems destroy
regularity conditions (ortho-coherence in the case of the
Foulis-Randall result, orthomodularity and the covering law in that of
Aerts' result) that have widely been used to underwrite reconstructions
of the usual quantum-mechanical formalism. This puts in doubt whether
any of these conditions can be regarded as having the universality that
the most optimistic version of Mackey's programme asks for. Of course,
this does not rule out the possibility that these conditions may yet be
motivated in the case of especially *simple* physical
systems.

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