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Quantum Gravity

First published Mon Dec 26, 2005

Quantum Gravity: A physical theory describing the gravitational interactions of matter and energy in which matter and energy are described by quantum theory. In most, but not all, theories of quantum gravity, gravity is also quantized. Since the contemporary theory of gravity, general relativity, describes gravitation as the curvature of spacetime by matter and energy, a quantization of gravity implies some sort of quantization of spacetime itself. Insofar as all extant physical theories rely on a classical spacetime background, this presents profound methodological and ontological challenges for the philosopher and the physicist.

1. Introduction

Dutch artist M.C. Escher's elegant pictorial paradoxes are prized by many, not least by philosophers, physicists, and mathematicians. Some of his work, for example Ascending and Descending, relies on optical illusion to depict what is actually an impossible situation. Other works are paradoxical in the broad sense, but not impossible: Relativity depicts a coherent arrangement of objects, albeit an arrangement in which the force of gravity operates in an unfamiliar fashion. (See the Other Internet Resources section below for images.) Quantum gravity itself may be like this: an unfamiliar yet coherent arrangement of familiar elements. Or it may be like Ascending and Descending, an impossible construction which looks sensible in its local details but does not fit together into a coherent whole.

‘Quantum gravity’ primarily refers to an area of research, rather than a particular theory of quantum gravity. Several approaches exist, none of them entirely successful to date. Thus the philosopher's task, if indeed she has one, is different from what it is when dealing with a more-or-less settled body of theory such as classical Newtonian mechanics, general relativity, or quantum mechanics. In such cases, one typically proceeds by assuming the validity of the theory or theoretical framework and drawing the ontological and perhaps epistemological consequences of the theory, trying to understand what it is that the theory is telling us about the nature of space, time, matter, causation, and so on. Theories of quantum gravity, on the other hand, are bedeviled by a host of technical and conceptual problems, questions, and issues which make them unsuited to this approach. However, philosophers who have a taste for a broader and more open-ended form of inquiry will find much to think about.

2. Gravity Meets Quantum Theory

The difficulties in reconciling quantum theory and gravity into some form of quantum gravity come from the prima facie incompatibility of general relativity, Einstein's relativistic theory of gravitation, with quantum field theory, the framework for the description of the other three forces (electromagnetism and the strong and weak nuclear interactions). Whence the incompatibility? General relativity is described by Einstein's equations, which amount to constraints on the curvature of spacetime (the Einstein tensor on the left-hand side) due to the presence of mass and other forms of energy, such as electromagnetic radiation (the stress-energy-momentum tensor on the right-hand side). (See John Baez's webpages in Other Internet Resources for an excellent introduction.) In doing so, they manage to encompass traditional, Newtonian gravitational phenomena such as the mutual attraction of two or more massive objects, while also predicting new phenomena such as the bending of light by these objects (which has been observed) and the existence of gravitational radiation (which has to date only been indirectly observed via the decrease in the period of binary pulsars). (For the latter observation, see the 1993 Physics Nobel Prize presentation speech by Carl Nordling .)

In general relativity, mass and energy are treated in a purely classical manner, where ‘classical’ means that physical quantities such as the strengths and directions of various fields and the positions and velocities of particles have definite values. These quantities are represented by tensor fields, sets of (real) numbers associated with each spacetime point. For example, the stress, energy, and momentum Tab(x,t) of the electromagnetic field at some point (x,t), are functions of the three components Ei, Ej, Ek, Bi, Bj, Bk of the electric and magnetic fields E and B at that point. These quantities in turn determine, via Einstein's equations, an aspect of the ‘curvature’ of spacetime, a set of numbers Gab(x,t) which is in turn a function of the spacetime metric. The metric gab(x,t) is a set of numbers associated with each point which gives the distance to neighboring points. At the end of the day, a model of the world according to general relativity consists of a spacetime manifold with a metric, the curvature of which is constrained by the stress-energy-momentum of the matter distribution. All physical quantities — the value of the x-component of the electric field at some point, the scalar curvature of spacetime at some point — have definite values, given by real (as opposed to complex or imaginary) numbers. Thus general relativity is a classical theory in the sense given above.

The problem is that our fundamental theories of matter and energy, the theories describing the interactions of various particles via the electromagnetic force and the strong and weak nuclear forces, are all quantum theories. In quantum theories, these physical quantities do not in general have definite values. For example, in quantum mechanics, the position of an electron may be specified with arbitrarily high accuracy only at the cost of a loss of specificity in the description of its momentum, hence its velocity. At the same time, in the quantum theory of the electromagnetic field known as quantum electrodynamics (QED), the electric and magnetic fields associated with the electron suffer an associated uncertainty. In general, physical quantities are described by a quantum state which gives a probability distribution over many different values, and increased specificity (narrowing of the distribution) of one property (e.g., position, electric field) gives rise to decreased specificity of its canonically conjugate property (e.g., momentum, magnetic field). This is an expression of Heisenberg's Uncertainty Principle.

On the surface, the incompatibility between general relativity and quantum theory might seem rather trivial. Why not just follow the model of QED and quantize the gravitational field, similar to the way in which the electromagnetic field was quantized? Just as we associate a quantum state of the electromagnetic field with the quantum state of electrically charged matter, we should, one might think, similarly just associate a quantum state of the gravitational field with the quantum state of both charged and uncharged matter. This is more or less the path that has been taken, but it encounters extraordinary difficulties. Some physicists consider these to be technical difficulties, having to do with the non-renormalizability of the gravitational interaction and the consequent failure of the perturbative methods which have proven effective in ordinary quantum field theories. However, these technical problems are closely related to a set of daunting conceptual difficulties, of interest to both physicists and philosophers.

The conceptual difficulties basically follow from the nature of the gravitational interaction, in particular the equivalence of gravitational and inertial mass, which allows one to represent gravity as a property of spacetime itself, rather than as a field propagating in a (passive) spacetime background. When one attempts to quantize gravity, one is subjecting some of the properties of spacetime to quantum fluctuations. But ordinary quantum theory presupposes a well-defined classical background against which to define these fluctuations (Weinstein, 2001a, b), and so one runs into trouble not only in giving a mathematical characterization of the quantization procedure (how to take into account these fluctuations in the effective spacetime structure?) but also in giving a conceptual and physical account of the theory that results, should one succeed. We will look in more detail at how these conceptual problems arise in two different research programs below. But first, we will talk a bit about some general methodological issues which haunt the field.

3. Methodology

Research in quantum gravity has a rather peculiar flavor, owing to both the technical and conceptual difficulty of the field and the remoteness from experiment. Thus conventional notions of the relation between theory and experiment have a tenuous foothold, at best.

3.1 Theory

As remarked in the introduction, there is no single, generally agreed-upon body of theory in quantum gravity. The majority of the physicists working in the field work on string theory, an ambitious program which aims at providing a unified theory of all interactions. A non-negligible minority work on what is now called loop quantum gravity, the goal of which is simply to provide a quantum theory of the gravitational interaction. There is also significant work in other areas. [Good recent reviews of the theoretical landscape include Carlip 2001 and Smolin 2001 (Other Internet Resources section below), 2003.] But there is no real consensus, for two reasons.

The first reason is that it is extremely difficult to make any concrete predictions in these theories. String theory, in particular, is plagued by a lack of predictions because of the tremendous number of distinct ground or vacuum states in the theory, with an absence of guiding principles for singling out the physically significant ones. Though the string community prides itself on the dearth of free parameters in the theory (in contrast to the nineteen or so free parameters found in the standard model of particle physics), the problem arguably resurfaces in the huge number of vacua associated with different compactifications of the nine space dimensions to the three we observe. Attempts to explain why we live in the particular vacuum that we do have recently given rise to appeals to the infamous anthropic principle (Susskind, 2003), whereby the existence of humans is invoked to, in some sense, “explain” the fact that we find ourselves in a particular world.

Loop quantum gravity is less plagued by a lack of predictions, and indeed it is often claimed that the discreteness of area and volume are concrete predictions of the theory. Proponents of this approach argue that this makes the theory more susceptible to falsification, thus more scientific (in the sense of Popper; see the entry on Karl Popper) than string theory. However, it is still quite unclear, in practice and even in principle, how one might actually observe these quantities.

3.2 Experiment

The second reason for the absence of consensus is that there are no experiments in quantum gravity, and little in the way of observations that might qualify as direct or indirect data or evidence. This stems in part from the lack of theoretical predictions, since it is difficult to design an observational test of a theory if one does not know where to look or what to look at. But it also stems from the fact that most theories of quantum gravity appear to predict departures from classical relativity only at energy scales on the order of 1019 GeV. (By way of comparison, the proton-proton collisions at Fermilab have an energy on the order of 103 GeV.) Whereas research in particle physics proceeds in large part by examining the data collected in large particle accelerators, accelerators which are able to smash particles together at sufficiently high energies to probe the properties of atomic nuclei, gravity is so weak that there is no way to do a comparable experiment that would reveal properties at the energy scales at which quantum gravitational effects are expected to be important.

Though progress is being made in trying to at least draw observational consequences of loop quantum gravity, a theory of quantum gravity which arguably does make predictions (Amelino-Camelia, 2003, in the Other Internet Resources section below; D. Mattingly, 2005), it is remarkable that the most notable “test” of quantum theories of gravity imposed by the community to date involves a phenomenon which has never been observed, the so-called Hawking radiation from black holes. Based on earlier work of Bekenstein (1973) and others, Hawking (1974) predicted that black holes would radiate energy, and would do so in proportion to their gravitational “temperature,” which was in turn understood to be proportional to their mass, angular momentum, and charge. Associated with this temperature is an entropy (see the entry on the philosophy of statistical mechanics), and one would expect a theory of quantum gravity to allow one to calculate the entropy associated with a black hole of given mass, angular momentum, and charge, the entropy corresponding to the number of quantum states of the gravitational field having the same mass, charge, and angular momentum. (See Unruh (2001) and references therein.)

In their own ways, string theory and loop quantum gravity have both passed the test of predicting an entropy for black holes which accords with Hawking's calculation. String theory gets the number right for a not-particularly physically realistic subset of black holes called near-extremal black holes, while loop quantum gravity gets it right for generic black holes, but only up to an overall constant. If the Hawking effect is real, then this consonance could be counted as evidence in favor of either or both theories.

It should be noted, finally, that to date neither of the main research programs has been shown to give rise to the world we see at low energies. Indeed, it is a major challenge of loop quantum gravity to show that it has general relativity as a low-energy limit, and a major challenge of string theory to show that it has the standard model of particle physics plus general relativity as a low-energy limit.

The absence of relevant experiments in quantum gravity is a peculiarity which has drawn little attention to date from philosophers of science (an exception is Butterfield & Isham, 2001). However, it would seem to be fertile ground for philosophical analysis, in that it raises the interesting question of how a science should and does proceed in the absence of data.

4. Theoretical Frameworks

4.1 String Theory

Known variously as string theory, superstring theory, and M-theory, this program has its roots, indirectly, in the observation, dating back to at least the 1950s, that classical general relativity looks in many ways like the theory of a massless ‘spin-two’ field propagating on the flat Minkowski spacetime of special relativity. [See Rovelli 2001b (Other Internet Resources section below), and 2006 for a capsule history, and Greene 2000 for a popular account.] This observation led to early attempts to formulate a quantum theory of gravity by “quantizing” this spin-two theory. However, it turned out that the theory is not perturbatively renormalizable, meaning that there are ineliminable infinities. Attempts to modify the classical theory to eliminate this problem led to a different problem, non-unitarity, and so this general approach was moribund until the mid-1970s, when it was discovered that a theory of one-dimensional “strings” developed around 1970 to account for the strong interaction, actually provided a framework for a unified theory which included gravity, because one of the modes of oscillation of the string corresponded to a massless spin-two particle (the ‘graviton’).

The original and still prominent idea behind string theory was to replace the point particles of ordinary quantum field theory (particles like photons, electrons, etc) with one-dimensional extended objects called strings. (See Weingard, 2001 and Witten, 2001 for overviews of the conceptual framework.) In the early development of the theory, it was recognized that construction of a consistent quantum theory of strings required that the strings “live” in a larger number of spatial dimensions than the observed three; eventually, most string theories came to be formulated in nine space dimensions and one time dimension. Strings can be open or closed, and have a characteristic tension and hence vibrational spectrum. The various modes of vibration correspond to various particles, one of which is the graviton. The resulting theories have the advantage of being perturbatively renormalizable, at least to second order. This means that perturbative calculations are at least mathematically tractable. Since perturbation theory is an almost indispensable tool for physicists, this is deemed a good thing.

String theory has undergone several mini-revolutions over the last several years, one of which involved the discovery of various duality relations, mathematical transformations connecting, in this case, what appeared to be mathematically distinct string theories — type I, type IIA, type IIB, HE and HO — to one another and to eleven-dimensional supergravity (a particle theory). The discovery of these connections led to the conjecture that all of the string theories are really aspects of a single underlying theory, which was given the name ‘M-theory’ (though M-theory is also used more specifically to describe the unknown theory of which eleven-dimensional supergravity is the low energy limit). The rationale is that what looks like one theory at strong coupling (high energy description) looks like another theory at weak coupling (lower energy, more tractable description), and that if all the theories are related to one another, then they must all be aspects of some more fundamental theory. Though attempts have been made, there has been no successful formulation of this theory: its very existence, much less its nature, is still largely a matter of conjecture.

4.2 Canonical and Loop Quantum Gravity

Whereas string theory views the curved spacetime of general relativity as an effective modification of a flat (or other fixed) background geometry by a massless spin-two field, the canonical quantum gravity program treats the spacetime metric itself as a kind of field, and attempts to quantize it directly.

Technically, most work in this camp proceeds by writing down general relativity in so-called ‘canonical’ or ‘Hamiltonian’ form, since there is a more-or-less clearcut way to quantize theories once they are put in this form (Kuchar, 1993; Belot & Earman, 2001). In a canonical description, one chooses a particular set of configuration variables xi and canonically conjugate momentum variables pi which describe the state of a system at some time. Then, one obtains the time-evolution of these variables from the Hamiltonian H(xi,pi). Quantization proceeds by treating the configuration and momentum variables as operators on a quantum state space (a Hilbert space) obeying certain commutation relations analogous to the classical Poisson-bracket relations, which effectively encode the quantum fuzziness associated with Heisenberg's uncertainty principle.

Although advocates of the canonical approach often accuse string theorists of relying too heavily on classical background spacetime, the canonical approach does something which is arguably quite similar, in that one begins with a theory that conceives time-evolution in terms of evolving some data given on a spacelike surface, and then quantizing the theory. The problem is that if spacetime is quantized, this assumption does not make sense in anything but an approximate way. This issue in particular is decidedly neglected in both the physical and philosophical literature (but see Isham (1993)), and there is more that might be said.

4.2.1 Geometric variables

Early attempts at quantizing general relativity by Dirac, Wheeler, DeWitt and others in the 1950s and 1960s worked with a seemingly natural choice for configuration variables, namely geometric variables gij corresponding to the various components of the ‘three-metric’ describing the intrinsic geometry of the given spatial slice of spacetime. One can think about arriving at this via an arbitrary slicing of a 4-dimensional “block” universe by 3-dimensional spacelike hypersurfaces. The conjugate momenta πij then effectively encode the time rate-of-change of the metric, which, from the 4-dimensional perspective, is directly related to the extrinsic curvature of the slice (meaning the curvature relative to the spacetime in which the slice is embedded). This approach is known as ‘geometrodynamics’.

In these geometric variables, as in any other canonical formulation of general relativity, one is faced with constraints, which encode the fact that the canonical variables cannot be specified independently. A familiar example of a constraint is Gauss's law from ordinary electromagnetism, which states that, in the absence of charges, ∇·E(x) = 0 at every point x. It means that the three components of the electric field at every point must be chosen so as to satisfy this constraint, which in turn means that there are only two “true” degrees of freedom possessed by the electric field at any given point in space. (Specifying two components of the electric field at every point dictates the third component.)

The constraints in electromagnetism may be viewed as stemming from the U(1) gauge invariance of Maxwell's theory, while the constraints of general relativity stem from the diffeomorphism invariance of the theory. Diffeomorphism invariance means, informally, that one can take a solution of Einstein's equations and drag it (meaning the metric and the matter fields) around on the spacetime manifold and obtain a mathematically distinct but physically equivalent solution. The three ‘supermomentum’ constraints in the canonical theory reflect the freedom to drag the metric and matter fields around in various directions on a given three-dimensional spacelike hypersurface, while the ‘super-Hamiltonian’ constraint reflects the freedom to drag the fields in the “time” direction, and so to the “next” hypersurface. (Each constraint applies at each point of the given spacelike hypersurface, so that there are actually 4 × ∞3 constraints, four for each point.) In the classical (unquantized) canonical formulation of general relativity, the constraints do not pose any particular conceptual problems. One effectively chooses a background space and time (via a choice of the lapse and shift functions) “on the fly”, and one can be confident that the spacetime that results is independent of the particular choice. Effectively, different choices of these functions give rise to different choices of background against which to evolve the foreground. However, the constraints pose a serious problem when one moves to quantum theory.

4.2.2 Problem of time

All approaches to canonical quantum gravity face the so-called “problem of time” in one form or another (Kuchař (1992) and Isham (1993) are excellent reviews). The problem stems from the fact that in preserving the diffeomorphism-invariance of general relativity — depriving the coordinates of the background manifold of any physical meaning — the “slices” of spacetime one is considering inevitably include time, just as they include space. In the canonical formulation, the diffeomorphism invariance is reflected in the constraints, and the inclusion of what would ordinarily be a ‘time’ variable in the data is reflected in the existence of the super-Hamiltonian constraint. The difficulties presented by this constraint constitute the problem of time.

Attempts to quantize general relativity in the canonical framework proceed by turning the canonical variables into operators on an appropriate state space (e.g., the space of square-integrable functions over three-metrics), and dealing somehow with the constraints. When quantizing a theory with constraints, there are two possible approaches. The approach usually adopted in gauge theories is to deal with the constraints before quantization, so that only true degrees of freedom are promoted to operators when passing to the quantum theory. There are a variety of ways of doing this so-called ‘gauge fixing’, but they all involve removing the extra degrees of freedom by imposing some special conditions. In general relativity, fixing a gauge is tantamount to specifying a particular coordinate system with respect to which the “physical” data is described (spatial coordinates) and with respect to which it evolves (time coordinate). This is difficult already at the classical level, since the utility and, moreover, the very tractability of any particular gauge generally depends on the properties of the solution to the equations, which of course is what one is trying to find in the first place. But in the quantum theory, one is faced with the additional concern that the resulting theory may well not be independent of the choice of gauge. This is closely related to the problem of identifying true, gauge-invariant observables in the classical theory (Torre 2005, in the Other Internet Resources section).

The preferred approach in canonical quantum gravity is to impose the constraints after quantizing. In this ‘constraint quantization’ approach, due to Dirac, one treats the constraints themselves as operators A, and demands that “physical” states ψ be those which are solutions to the resulting equations A ψ = 0. The problem of time is associated with the super-Hamiltonian constraint. The super-Hamiltonian H is responsible for describing time-evolution in the classical theory, yet its counterpart in the constraint-quantized theory, H ψ = 0, would prima facie seem to indicate that the true physical states of the system do not evolve at all. Trying to understand how, and in what sense, the quantum theory describes the time-evolution of something, be it states or observables, is the essence of the problem of time.

4.2.3 Ashtekar, loop, and other variables

In geometrodynamics, all of the constraint equations are difficult to solve (though the super-Hamiltonian constraint, known as the Wheeler-DeWitt equation, is especially difficult), even in the absence of particular boundary conditions. Lacking solutions, one does not have a grip on what the true, physical states of the theory are, and one cannot hope to make much in the way of predictions. The difficulties associated with geometric variables are addressed by the program initiated by Ashtekar and developed by his collaborators (for a review and further references see Rovelli 2001b (Other Internet Resources), 2001a, 2004). Ashtekar used a different set of variables, a complexified ‘connection’ (rather than a three-metric) and its canonical conjugate, which made it simpler to solve the constraints. The program underwent further refinements with the introduction of the loop transform, and further refinements still when it was understood that equivalence classes of loops could be identified with spin networks. (See Smolin (2001, 2004) for a popular introduction.)

4.3 Other Approaches

There are many other approaches to quantum gravity as well. Some (e.g., Huggett 2001, Wüthrich 2004 (Other Internet Resources section); J. Mattingly 2005) have argued that semiclassical gravity, a theory in which matter is quantized but spacetime is classical, is a viable alternative. Other approaches include twistor theory (currently enjoying a revival in conjunction with string theory), Bohmian approaches (Goldstein & Teufel, 2001), causal sets (see Sorkin 2003, in the Other Internet Resources section) in which the universe is described as a set of discrete events along with a stipulation of their causal relations, and other discrete approaches (see Loll, 1998). Also of interest are arguments to the effect that gravity itself may play a role in quantum state reduction (Christian, 2001; Penrose, 2001).

5. Philosophical Issues

Quantum gravity raises a number of difficult philosophical questions. To date, it is the ontological aspects of quantum gravity that have attracted the most interest from philosophers, and it is these we will discuss in the first three sections below. In the final section, though, we will briefly discuss the methodological and epistemological issues which arise.

First, however, let us discuss the extent to which ontological questions are tied to a particular theoretical framework. In its current stage of development, string theory unfortunately provides little indication of the more fundamental nature of space, time, and matter. Despite the consideration of ever more exotic objects — strings, p-branes, D-branes, etc. — these objects are still understood as propagating in a background spacetime. Since string theory is supposed to describe the emergence of classical spacetime from some underlying quantum structure, these objects are not to be regarded as truly fundamental. Rather, their status in string theory is analogous to the status of particles in quantum field theory (Witten, 2001), which is to say that they are relevant descriptions of the fundamental physics only in situations in which there is a background spacetime with appropriate symmetries.

The duality relations between the various string theories suggest that they are all perturbative expansions of some more fundamental, non-perturbative theory known as ‘M-theory’ (Polchinski, 2002, see the Other Internet Resources section below). This, presumably, is the most fundamental level, and understanding the theoretical framework at that level is central to understanding the underlying ontology of the theory. ‘Matrix theory’ is an attempt to do just this, to provide a mathematical formulation of M-theory, but it remains highly speculative. Thus although string theory purports to be a fundamental theory, the ontological implications of the theory are still obscure.

Canonical quantum gravity, in its loop formulation or otherwise, has to date been of greater interest to philosophers because it appears to confront fundamental questions in a way that string theory, at least in its perturbative guise, does not. Whereas perturbative string theory treats spacetime in an essentially classical way, canonical quantum gravity treats it as quantum-mechanical, at least to the extent of treating the geometric structure (as opposed to, say, the topological or differential structure) as quantum-mechanical.

5.1 Time

As noted in Section 4.2.2 above, the treatment of time presents special difficulties in canonical quantum gravity. These difficulties are connected with the special role time plays in physics, and in quantum theory in particular. Physical laws are, in general, laws of motion, of change from one time to another. They represent change in the form of differential equations for the evolution of, as the case may be, classical or quantum states; the state represents the way the system is at some time, and the laws allow one to predict how it will be in the future (or retrodict how it was in the past).

It is not surprising, then, that a theory of quantum spacetime would have a problem of time, because there is no classical time against which to evolve the “state”. The problem is not so much that the spacetime is dynamical; there is no problem of time in classical general relativity. Rather, the problem is roughly that in quantizing the structure of spacetime itself, the notion of a quantum state, representing the structure of spacetime at some instant, and the notion of the evolution of the state, do not get any traction, since there are no real “instants”. (In some approaches to canonical gravity, one fixes a time before quantizing, and quantizes the spatial portions of the metric only. This approach is not without its problems, however; see Isham (1993) for discussion and further references.)

One can ask whether the problem of time arising from the canonical program tells us something deep and important about the nature of time. Julian Barbour (2001a,b), for one, thinks that it tells us that time is illusory (see also Earman (2002) in this connection). It is argued that the fact that quantum states do not evolve under the super-Hamiltonian means that there is no change. However, it can also be argued (Weinstein, 1999a,b) that the super-Hamiltonian itself should not be expected to generate time-evolution; rather, one or more “true” Hamiltonians should play this role. (See Butterfield & Isham (1999) and Rovelli (2006) for further discussion.)

5.2 Ontology

The problem of time is closely connected with a general puzzle about the ontology associated with “quantum spacetime”. Quantum theory in general resists any straightforward ontological reading, and this goes double for quantum gravity. In quantum mechanics, one has particles, albeit with indefinite properties. In quantum field theory, one again has particles (at least in suitably symmetric spacetimes), but these are secondary to the fields, which again are things, albeit with indefinite properties. On the face of it, the only difference in quantum gravity is that spacetime itself becomes a kind of quantum field, and one would perhaps be inclined to say that the properties of spacetime become indefinite. But space and time traditionally play important roles in individuating objects and their properties—in fact a field is in some sense a set of properties of spacetime points — and so the quantization of such raises real problems for ontology.

In the loop quantum gravity program, the area and volume operators have discrete spectra. Thus, like spins, they can only take certain values. This suggests (but does not imply) that space itself has a discrete nature, and perhaps time as well (depending on how one resolves the problem of time). This in turn suggests that space does not have the structure of a differential manifold, but rather that it only approximates such a manifold on large scales, or at low energies.

5.3 Status of quantum theory

Whether or not spacetime is discrete, the quantization of spacetime entails that our ordinary notion of the physical world, that of matter distributed in space and time, is at best an approximation. This in turn implies that ordinary quantum theory, in which one calculates probabilities for events to occur in a given world, is inadequate as a fundamental theory. As suggested in the Introduction, this may present us with a vicious circle. At the very least, one must almost certainly generalize the framework of quantum theory. This is an important driving force behind much of the effort in quantum cosmology to provide a well-defined version of the many-worlds or relative-state interpretations. Much work in this area has adopted the so-called ‘decoherent histories’ or ‘consistent histories’ formalism, whereby quantum theories are understood to make probabilistic predictions about entire (coarse-grained) ‘histories’. Almost all of this work to date construes histories to be histories of spatiotemporal events, and thus presupposes a background spacetime; however, the incorporation of a dynamical, quantized spacetime clearly drives much of the cosmology-inspired work in this area.

More generally, one might step outside the framework of canonical, loop quantum gravity, and ask why one should only quantize the metric. As pointed out by Isham (1994, 2002), it may well be that the extension of quantum theory to general relativity requires one to quantize, in some sense, not only the metric but also the underlying differential structure and topology. This is somewhat unnatural from the standpoint where one begins with classical, canonical general relativity and proceeds to “quantize” (since the topological structure, unlike the metric structure, is not represented by a classical variable). But one might well think that one should start with the more fundamental, quantum theory, and then investigate under which circumstances one gets something that looks like a classical spacetime.

5.4 Methodology

The nature of the enterprise, in particular its seeming remoteness from experiment, gives rise to significant methodological and epistemological questions as well, focusing on the problem of how to construct or discover a scientific theory for phenomena which are so remote from observation. Are beauty and consistency either necessary or sufficient? The pronounced split between the string theory community and the loop quantum gravity community has nothing to do with empirical success or lack thereof, but much to do with factors which might normally play a role only on the periphery of the scientific enterprise. The history of the enterprise of quantum gravity might well be worth historico-philosophical scrutiny, much as the history of cosmology has been, cosmology having also been rather data-starved until recently. (See Kragh (1999) for an excellent account of the big-bang/steady-state controversy.)

6. Conclusion

In the author's opinion, it is unlikely that a final theory of quantum gravity — if indeed there is one — will look much like any of the current candidate theories, be they string theory, canonical gravity, or other approaches. However, the philosophical and conceptual study of quantum gravity is useful insofar as it prompts one to consider questions which are surely raised by this almost quixotic undertaking, questions which will ultimately require some unknown combination of philosophical, physical, and mathematical insight to answer.


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Popper, Karl | quantum mechanics | quantum mechanics: Everett's relative-state formulation of | quantum mechanics: many-worlds interpretation of | space and time: the hole argument | Uncertainty Principle