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Historicist Theories of Rationality

First published Mon Aug 12, 1996; substantive revision Thu Jan 24, 2008

Of those philosophers who have attempted to characterize scientific rationality, most have attended in some way to the history of science. Even Karl Popper, who is hardly a historicist by anyone's standards, frequently employs the history of science as an illustrative and polemical device. However, relatively few theorists have offered theories according to which data drawn from the history of science somehow constitute or are evidential for the concept of rationality. Let us call such theories historicist theories.

Roughly put, the idea behind historicist theories of rationality is that a good theory of rationality should somehow fit the history of science. According to a minimal reading of “fit”, a good theory of rationality will label as rational most of the major episodes in the history of science. A more demanding reading asserts that the best theory of rationality is the one that maximizes the number of rational episodes in the history of science (subject to some filtering out of sociologically infected episodes). However, it is unclear whether (i) historicism is a conceptual claim according to which it is an analytic or at least necessary truth that rationality fit history, or (ii) whether historicism is an epistemological claim according to which the best way to find out about rationality is to consult the history of science. Historicism (i) seems unmotivated, while historicism (ii) might descend into triviality. For instance, in the case of instrumental rules which tell us the best way to achieve certain goals, philosophers of all stripes would say that looking at historical attempts to achieve those goals will help us evaluate our current proposals for achieving them. Another ambiguity in historicism concerns its scope. Does historicism become a good idea only once one has established that science is basically successful, or should historicism be endorsed within every scientific community and possible world?

In order to understand historicism, one must also understand the distinction between methodology and meta-methodology. In the parlance of the history and philosophy of science, a methodology for scientific rationality is a theory of rationality: it tells us what is rational and what is not in specific cases. Thus, the rule “Always accept the theory with the greatest degree of confirmation” would count as (part of) a methodology. On the other hand, a meta-methodology provides us with the standards by which we evaluate the theories of rationality that constitute our methodologies. To be a historicist about rationality is to accept a meta-methodological claim: a good theory of rationality must fit the history of science. Thus although historicists might agree on a general meta-methodology, they can and do vary widely in the sort of theory that they produce using that meta- methodology. To acquire a feel for the general approach, let us first review the work of the three major historicists, Thomas Kuhn, Imre Lakatos and Larry Laudan.

1. Paradigms: consensus

Historicism in the philosophy of science is a fairly recent development. It can perhaps be dated to the publication of Kuhn's influential The Structure of Scientific Revolutions in 1962. Before that point, the two dominant theories of rationality were confirmationism (scientists should accept theories that are probably true, given the evidence) and falsificationism (scientists should reject theories that make false predictions about observables and replace them with theories that conform to all available evidence). Each of these theories springs from purely logical roots, confirmationism from Carnap's work on inductive logic, and falsificationism from Popper's rejection of inductive logic coupled with his assertion that universals can be falsified by a single counter-instance. Neither of these theories was accountable to the history of science in the following important sense: If it turned out that the history of science exemplified few or no decisions in accordance with, say, Carnap's confirmationism, then so much the worse for the history of science. Such a discovery would merely show that scientists were largely irrational. It would not challenge confirmationism. Rather, confirmationism was mainly challenged on conceptual, ahistorical grounds, such as its inability to generate plausible yet non-arbitrary levels of confirmation for moderately sized samples, the difficulties encountered in devising a suitable criterion for evidential relevance, and so on.

Kuhn's work effected three major transformations in the study of scientific rationality. First, and most importantly, it brought history to the fore. The implicit (if not explicit) message of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions is that a respectable theory of rational scientific procedure must conform to the greater part of actual scientific procedure. Second, instead of assuming that scientific theories were the units of rational evaluation, Structure was based on a unit that could persist through minor theoretical changes. Therefore, it could distinguish between revisions and wholesale rejection. Kuhn called this unit “the paradigm”, and its ancestors live on as the research programme, the research tradition, the global theoretical unit, and so on. Third, Kuhn's work highlighted the real problems that historically aware accounts of rationality face: when all is said and done, there may be no trans-historical rule for rational scientific procedure.

Before dealing with specifics, it is important to stress that one should approach the exegetical details of Kuhn's account with great trepidation. Many different interpretations exist, perhaps because the internal consistency of Kuhn's positions still stands in some doubt. Thus what follows is no doubt too quick and would be regarded by some as fundamentally inaccurate. Those who are especially interested in Kuhnian hermeneutics are encouraged to consult Hoyningen-Huene (1993). As an example of the exegetical problems which confront the reader at every turn, there is considerable disagreement over the proper interpretation of the word “paradigm”. At one extreme is a very narrow interpretation according to which a paradigm consists of a set of exemplars, where an exemplar can be a famous solved problem, a textbook, or a famous experiment. At the other extreme a paradigm consists of an entire theoretical worldview, represented by an ontology, a set of laws, a list of methodological prescriptions, and a set of fundamental values for science. According to a third reading, which is orthogonal to the others, a paradigm is a fundamentally sociological entity, individuated and constituted by patterns of education and alliances. To maximize the sense of the following account, it is best to choose a fairly wide sense of the term.

According to Kuhn, scientific practice is divided into two phases, called normal science and revolutionary science. During normal science, the dominant paradigm is neither questioned nor seriously tested. Rather, the members of the scientific community employ the paradigm as a tool for solving outstanding problems. Occasionally, the community will encounter especially resistant problems, or anomalies, but if a paradigm encounters only a few anomalies there is little reason for anxiety among its proponents. Only as the anomalies accumulate will the community pass into a state of crisis, which may in turn push the community into the phase of revolutionary science.

During a period of revolutionary science, the scientific community actively debates the underlying principles of the dominant paradigm and its rivals. Thus, the business- as-usual of routine problem solving is suspended until a new paradigm (or perhaps the old one) establishes dominance. The way in which dominance is established is perhaps the most important locus of disagreement concerning Kuhn's work. The most influential interpretation (one which Kuhn has spent much time disavowing) paints Kuhn as an arationalist. This interpretation makes much of Kuhn's use of the theory-ladenness of observation and various sorts of incommensurability. The supposed result of these features is that the proponents of different paradigms will often be unable to communicate with each other, and that, even when they can communicate, their standards of assessment will always favor their own paradigms. Thus, there is no rational basis for choosing between paradigms: the switch from one worldview to another is not so much a reasoned matter as the scientific equivalent of a perceptual gestalt shift. On this view, the transition between paradigms is best explained sociologically, in terms of institutional might, polemics and perhaps generational replacement.

The previous argument requires possibly unrealistically strong senses of incommensurability and theory-ladenness. According to a more moderate view of incommensurability, revolutionary science does not presuppose that proponents of one paradigm can't understand what the proponents of another are saying. However, it does retain incommensurability about values. On this view, according to which there is no principled way to evaluate the choices and weightings of values employed by different paradigms. Rationality can no longer be procedurally flow-charted. Rationality may only be saved by apparently ad hoc claims such as the claim that scientists are trained to reach a rational consensus in the absence of rules for doing so. This interpretation of Kuhn is often coupled with the claim that science has progressed in light of its increasing ability to solve problems. Again, though, there is an important qualification: while we can claim that, e.g., the Newtonian paradigm solved more problems than the Aristotelian one, we cannot claim that Aristotelian set of solved problems is included in the Newtonian one. The transition from one paradigm to another involves some losses as well as gains, but on balance, there is a net gain in problem solving ability.

Although this interpretation of Kuhn paints him as a rationalist, it posits a form of rationalism that rejects two claims that many rationalists had thought essential to their enterprise: (i) that rationality is a rule-governed process, and (ii) that scientific progress is cumulative. The reasons for these two claims are not so much historical as conceptual. For instance, if we suppose that the choice between paradigms is made in the absence of rules, and that we should trust it as rational simply because the people making the choices are properly trained, then might we not wonder whether a purely sociological explanation is in order? Similarly, if one paradigm is held to solve more problems than another, even in the presence of important problems solved by the second paradigm but not by the first, then might we not wonder whether the apparent progress is no more than a case of history re-written by the victors? What solid philosophical grounds are there for holding that the gains achieved by the victorious paradigm outweigh the losses? Among others, Brown (1985) addresses the first worry and Laudan (1977) the second (as will be discussed later in this entry), but, to date there has been no satisfactory answer to any of these questions. Thus, Kuhn the rationalist seems to stand on shaky conceptual ground.

Specific worries aside, Kuhn is unsatisfactory for our purposes because he provides us with neither a specific account of rationality nor an explicit account of historicist meta- methodology. Because they are specific where Kuhn is not, Kuhn's main successors, Imre Lakatos and Larry Laudan deserve our special attention.

2. Research Programmes: novel predictions

Lakatos's theory of rationality is based on the idea of the research programme, which is a sequence of theories characterized by a hard-core (the features of the theories that are essential for membership in the research programme), the protective belt (the features that may be altered), the negative heuristic (an injunction not to change the hard core), and the positive heuristic (a plan for modifying the protective belt). The protective belt is altered for two reasons. In its early stages, a research programme will make unrealistic assumptions (i.e. Newton's early assumption that the sun and the earth are point masses). The protective belt is altered in order to make the programme more realistic. It becomes testable only when it has achieved a sufficient degree of realism. Once the programme has reached the phase of testability, the protective belt is altered when the programme makes false experimental predictions.

However, not all alterations to the protective belt are equal. If an alteration not only fixes the problem at hand but also allows the research programme to make a novel prediction, then the alteration is said to be progressive. If the alteration is no more than an ad hoc manoeuvre, that is, if it does not lead to any novel predictions, then it is regarded as degenerate. Initially Lakatos classifies a prediction as novel if and only if the phenomenon being predicted has never been observed prior to the prediction. Later Lakatos (Lakatos and Zahar, 1976) extends the definition to cover phenomena that may have been observed before the time of prediction but which were not among the problems which the alteration was designed to solve.

A research programme is in good health as long as a sufficient number of the alterations to it are progressive. Its troubles multiply to the extent that these alterations are degenerate. Once a research programme is sufficiently degenerate, and once there is a progressive research programme to take its place, the degenerate programme should be jettisoned. However, Lakatos does not provide us with details concerning ways to measure degeneracy, nor does he locate the point at which degeneracy can prove fatal to a research programme.

Lakatos's meta-methodology is interesting precisely because it matches his methodology: a meta-methodological research programme in the philosophy of science is progressive as long as it continues to make novel predictions. This may seem puzzling. What predictions can a theory of rationality make? Lakatos's answer is that the predictions concern basic value judgments made by scientists at the time concerning the rationality and irrationality of certain episodes. To see this, suppose that, according to Lakatos's theory, a certain research programme in the past became unacceptably degenerate at a certain time. Subsequent historical investigation might uncover documents which attest to the attitudes of the scientific community at the time. Suppose that these documents show that the community was preparing to reject the research programme in question. In this case, we would say that Lakatos's theory had made a successful novel prediction.

One could easily question the weight that Lakatos places on novel predictions, both at the methodological and meta-methodological levels. Lakatos faces the following dilemma. The attainment of novel predictions is either valuable in and of itself or it is valuable as a way of achieving some other goal. If Lakatos claims that novel predictions are especially valuable in and of themselves then he faces a quite justified charge of arbitrariness. If he says that they are valuable for their use in achieving other goals then he must say what those goals are and demonstrate that novel predictions are especially useful in achieving them. For instance, suppose Lakatos were to say that the pursuit of novel predictions provides us with the best and fastest way of increasing the observable content of our theories. Were he to say this he would need to provide us with a viable notion of and metric for observable content. In particular he would have to tell us what it is for one theory to have more observable content than another. If he presupposes some sort of cumulativity principle (i.e. that the better theory says everything true about observables that the worse one did plus a little bit more) than his theory is historically implausible. If he denies cumulativity, then the problem he faces, i.e. that of providing a sound basis for observational content, has foiled all who have tried to solve it.

3. Research Traditions: solved problems

In Progress and Its Problems, Larry Laudan presents both an explicit meta-methodology and a normative theory of rationality. According to his meta-methodology, a successful theory of rationality should respect “our preferred pre-analytic intuitions about scientific rationality”. (Laudan 1977, 160) These intuitions consist of judgments of the rationality of certain explicit cases, (e.g., “it was rational to accept Newtonian mechanics and to reject Aristotelian mechanics by, say, 1800”, and “it was irrational after 1830 to accept the biblical chronology as a literal account of earth history”). Thus, although not every episode in the history of science is represented in Laudan's meta-methodology, a subset of it is, where this subset consists of the “obvious” cases.

The theory of rationality supposedly generated by Laudan's methodology is centered on the notion of the research tradition. Laudan's research traditions somewhat resemble Kuhn's paradigms and Lakatos's research programmes. Like Kuhn's paradigms (on the wider reading of the term) research traditions contain both metaphysical and methodological elements. However, Laudan downplays the sociological and pedagogical elements (e.g. training networks and exemplars) that are so important to Kuhn. Like Lakatos's paradigms, the theories generated by a research tradition will change through time, but, where Lakatos's research programmes are defined as a sequence of theories, the theories do not themselves constitute the research tradition. Laudan also claims that the research tradition is a much less rigid concept than the Lakatosian research programme, which is based on an inflexible hard-core.

However, Laudan radically differentiates himself from Kuhn and Lakatos in his accounts of scientific progress and rationality. He claims that there are two sorts of problems that face every research tradition: empirical problems (akin to Kuhnian anomalies); and conceptual problems (i.e. problems of consistency, either internal or with dominant traditions in other fields). We should accept the research tradition that has solved the most problems and pursue the tradition that is currently solving problems at the greatest rate. Science progresses by solving more problems. However, Laudan does not presume cumulativity: although a given current research tradition will have solved more problems than its predecessors, there may be particular problems that have become “unsolved” by the current tradition. Thus, unlike Kuhn, Laudan believes that there is a simple concept which serves as a basis for both progress and rationality. Unlike Lakatos, Laudan (i) rejects both the idea of empirical content and the cumulative growth of theories and (ii) places no extra value on the concept of a novel prediction, and no great disvalue on ad hocness.

As appealing as it may seem, Laudan's theory of rationality faces some potentially fatal criticisms. First, how do we determine which research tradition has solved the most problems. Is the “problem of the planets” to be counted as one problem or eight? There is reason to believe that the enumeration and/or weighting of problems is relative to a research tradition. Without a common scheme of enumeration and/or weighting Laudan's theory may lead to ambiguous results, according to which the rational tradition to pursue depends on who is doing the counting. Second, although Laudan takes some pains to differentiate research traditions from paradigms and research programmes, the notion of a research tradition is still somewhat fuzzy. As with paradigms and programmes, the fuzziness is especially apparent at the level of historical application.

An independent set of problems concerns Laudan's meta-methodology and its link to his theory of rationality. First, since Laudan takes his theory of rationality to apply to all spheres of intellectual endeavor, including the philosophy of science, we should expect his meta-methodology (which regulates the rational choice of a theory of scientific rationality) to be identical with his theory of rationality. Yet the two are very different. His meta-methodology is a foundational fit-the-data affair, while the ground-level criterion rejects the existence of data in a foundationalist sense. Now, Laudan could retract the claim that his theory of rationality has applicability outside of science, but as we shall see later, that would lead him into serious problems. Second, Laudan's list of 7 pre-analytic intuitions is fairly uncontroversial. But, we may ask why we believe it to be uncontroversial. Is it because we have all been socially conditioned in the same way? Or, is it because we have a prior criterion of rationality, according to which we judge the “intuitive” cases? If the former, then there is no reason to privilege our pre-analytic intuitions. If the latter, then, rather than consulting the history of science, we should merely try to explicate our prior criterion. Either way, an approach based on intuitions faces severe difficulties. Third, even if we could provide a firm philosophical basis for this approach, we would have very little data to go on. Laudan cites only seven data points. Without doubt, many theories of rationality, some plausible and some not, would fit these data points. For instance, consider the following criterion:

An episode in the history of science is rational if and only if it is one of the following episodes: {here follows the list of paradigmatically rational episodes}; and an episode in the history of science is irrational if and only if it is one of the following episodes: {here follows the list of paradigmatically irrational episodes}. All other episodes are neither rational nor irrational.

Clearly this is a silly criterion, but it meets Laudan's meta-methodological constraints. Laudan differentiates his methodology from his meta-methodology in order to avoid circular and/or self- supporting means of testing a methodology. Circularity is probably not a worry. Laudan probably would do better by equating his methodology with his meta-methodology. At any rate, Laudan himself has disavowed historicism (e.g., Laudan 1986), although for somewhat suspect reasons.

4. General Criticisms

Specifics aside, there are a number of important issues that have yet to be satisfactorily addressed by historicist theories of rationality. (1) What precisely is a historicist theory of rationality supposed to accomplish? According to Lakatos, one is rational as long as one avoids ad hocness as much as possible; according to Laudan, one is rational as long as one accepts the research tradition that has solved the most problems and pursues the one that is solving them at the greatest rate. Yet neither writer stipulates that rational agents must have the avoidance of ad hocness or the maximization of solved problems in mind as they go about their scientific business. As long as their theoretical behavior is in accord with the Lakatosian/Laudanian dicta, they are rational, regardless of their conscious motivations.

Let us call theories of rationality which evaluate agents on the basis of their theoretical choices and not on the basis of the reasons for the choices externalist theories. Externalist theories are wider than internalist (motive based) ones in an important way: the right choice made for the wrong reasons is rational according to externalism. Since Lakatos and Laudan want their theories of rationality to cover most of the history of science, and since the conscious motivations of scientists do seem to have changed over time — and have often not centered on the considerations deemed to be central by either Lakatos or Laudan — it seems that Lakatos and Laudan are locked into externalism.

However, upon further examination, externalist theories of rationality are very puzzling. Let us compare them with another form of epistemic externalism, an externalist theory of perception. According to such theories, whether one is justified depends only on whether one's perceptual belief was produced by a reliable mechanism or process. One need not be conscious of a description or justification of that process. Now, in the perceptual case, we have a general idea of the nature of the process and every reason to trust in its reliability (dreamer arguments aside). The problem with externalist theories of rationality, on the other hand, is that we have no idea of the mechanism that would make a scientist, act in such a way that she minimized ad hocness even though her actual intentions were directed towards some other cognitive goal. Where externalist theories of perception depend on tangible information provided by the psychology of perception, externalist theories of rationality depend on a very mysterious invisible hand. Until the workings of that hand are made visible, we should be very suspicious of externalist theories of rationality.

(2) Historicist theories of rationality are also much more difficult to apply than their proponents let on. Because the historicist unit of exchange (the paradigm, research programme, research tradition) has much looser conditions of individuation than the single theory, the question of how to group theories into their respective paradigms, etc. can be a difficult one. For instance, Copernicus's theory shared much of Aristotle's physics, Aristotle's commitment to spherical motion and his use of aethereal spheres, Kepler's geo-centrism (almost) and Ptolemy's use of epicycles. In grouping Copernicus with Kepler and Newton, we say that his geocentrism is more important than his beliefs about the way in which things in the heaven moved. There may be reasons for deciding upon this grouping, but the choice is not an automatic one. Since the actual scientists at the time did not think in terms of paradigms, etc., we are not going to be able to make the choice on the basis of historical information. More needs to be said about the standards for individuating large-scale theoretical units.

A related problem concerns the notion of the acceptance of a paradigm, research programme or research tradition. Does the acceptance of a programme involve the literal belief in its truth by every single person in the scientific community? Does it require a general belief in its usefulness? These questions have practical correlates. Was the Copernican system accepted by the time that most astronomers used the Copernican tables, despite their explicit allegiance to an Aristotelian/Ptolemaic cosmology, or by when it was widely taught in universities? Is quantum mechanics now accepted despite the fact that very few physicists think that it can paint an accurate picture of micro-reality? The question of acceptance has two dimensions. The first concerns what it is for a single person to accept a paradigm, etc. The second concerns the weight of individual acceptance required for community acceptance. Since the data for historicist theories consists of matters of acceptance and rejection at the community level, historicists must provide a great deal more information here before their theories can be applied to the historical record.

(3) What motivates us to adopt a historicist theory? One possible motivation comes from our faith in science. To reject historicism is “to claim…, that it is entirely possible that all actual scientific practice, past and present, is irrational and ‘unscientific’, which is in turn to accept the (I think) absurd further consequence that scientists might be bad at doing science”. (Brown 1989, 98) However, there are several problems with this motivation. First, our faith in the rationality of science may be more an a posteriori matter than an a priori one. That is, our faith in science is not blind. We have faith in our science because we have seen what it has accomplished: given our evidence from the history of science, it would be absurd to conclude that science was not rational. Here, we see that the history of science is rational because it meets our (proto) criteria for progress and rationality. However, in other, counterfactual cases, we would not immediately conclude that scientific practice was rational. For instance, it is not true at every possible world that there is a conceptual link between scientific practice and scientific rationality. Thus, on this view, the history of science is illustrative (and not constitutive) of rationality.

The faith-in-science motivation faces the additional problem of being much too weak for many forms of historicism. Our faith in science might lead us to believe that science is not completely irrational, or that it is more rational than not. However, some historicist theories (e.g., some readings of Lakatos, Brown (1989)) claim that the best theory of rationality is the one that, subject to certain conditions, maximizes the number of rational episodes in the history of science. General faith in science cannot prop up these maximizing theories.

The second motivation for historicism is due to a form of naturalism. If we reject the idea that epistemology is an a priori enterprise and accept that it is merely a form of science, as naturalists tend to do, then historicism might seem tempting. Scientific theories succeed insofar as they fit the data. The data for a scientific theory of scientific rationality, if it is to be found anywhere, should be drawn from the history of science. Hence historicism. Leave aside the sloppiness of the preceding argument. Even taken on its own terms, it depends on a simplistic view of the role of theoretical concepts within naturalism. Suppose we endorse naturalism. We can consequently treat rationality as a theoretical posit, much like electrons, viruses and the other theoretical posits of science. The electron posit et al do not acquire their justification from a simple fit-the- data approach. It's difficult to see how they could even play such a role. Rather, they are accepted because they are essential parts of our theoretically intricate best explanations for relevant phenomena. We accept the existence of electrons because our best theories of the observable phenomena associated with electricity and atomic structure crucially depend on the hypothesis that there are electrons. Similarly if our overall goal is to explain the history and practice of science, our best theory of rationality is the one that, along with other theoretical posits, plays a relevant and crucial role in our overall explanation of the history and practice of science. As such, we should leave aside simple presuppositions such as the claim that the best theory of rationality is the one that maximizes the number of rational episodes in the history of science. In the end, it may turn out that our best concept of rationality does maximize the number of rational episodes, but such a result should count as an empirically based bonus rather than as a desideratum.

However, if we take this explanationist approach to rationality, then most existing historicist theories seem irrelevant, because their role seems more purely descriptive than explanatory. Furthermore, the Strong Programme (Bloor 1976) in the sociology of knowledge has argued that rationality plays no explanatory role whatsoever. No doubt, the arguments of the Strong Programme are at least slightly overblown, but they do show that once one moves to an explanationist viewpoint, there is no guaranteed role for rationality within naturalism. In the end, one might be left with no more than the kernel of instrumental rationality.

Finally, very few new results on the topic of historicist theories of rationality have been generated in the last decade. Friedman (2002) is a notable exception. He argues that we can make rational sense of the transitions between apparently incommensurable theories by positing a tripartite distinction between (a) empirical laws of nature, (b) constitutively a priori principles, which basically play the role of paradigms, and (c) philosophical meta-frameworks, which help guide scientists from one set of a priori principles to the next. Transitions between sets of meta-frameworks involve increasingly general mathematical structures, which in turn create an expansion of the space of epistemic possibilities. Clearly, Friedman does not offer a theory of rationality according to which rationality is historically constituted so much as an independently generated set of principles that can make sense of the history of science. Still, his theory can provide rationality with an explanatory role in our best account of the history and practice of science.

The lack of a significant recent body of work on the general topic requires explanation, especially since questions concerning rationality were major framing devices in the initial stages of the history and philosophy of science as a field. Here are some very tentative explanatory hypotheses. First, as the field has matured, the history and philosophy of science has placed ever greater demands on its workers for accurate and well-supported historical research, with the result that the field has shifted much of its energy from general theories of science to the production of histories of particular episodes. Kuhnian and Lakatosian general claims about the nature of science, although they remain both visionary and exciting, would be very hard to justify in today's climate of enhanced historical rigor. In addition, the proliferation of narrowly focused historical accounts has multiplied the sheer amount of data to be covered by a global historicist theory. Taken together these two considerations entail that the job of constructing and justifying a descriptively adequate historicist theory of scientific rationality has become intimidatingly difficult, both from the point of view of assembling the relevant data and from the point of view of synthesizing it into a unified and compelling theory which manages to accommodate the data. Even if such a theory is possible, the cost-effectiveness of pursuing it may be prohibitive in today's climate.


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