Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Semantic Challenges to Realism

First published Thu Jan 11, 2001; substantive revision Thu Nov 18, 2004

According to metaphysical realism, the world is as it is independently of how humans take it to be. The objects the world contains, together with their properties and the relations they enter into, fix the world's nature and these objects exist independently of our ability to discover they do. Unless this is so, realists argue, none of our beliefs about our world could be objectively true since true beliefs tell us how things are and beliefs are objective when true or false independently of what anyone might think. The issue of objectivity affects all of us deeply — when we think the State has an obligation to provide adequate health care to all its citizens we mean to be describing what the State's obligations really are, independently of what anyone might think about the matter. If someone disagrees with us over this matter, we think they've got it wrong — are mistaken about how things are as regards the State and its obligations. If there can be no objectivity without a mind-independent world, as realists claim, then there had better be a mind-independent world.

Henceforth, by ‘realism’ I shall mean metaphysical realism unless otherwise stated. Many philosophers believe realism is just plain common sense. Others believe it to be a direct implication of modern science which paints humans as fallible creatures adrift in an inhospitable world not of their making. Nonetheless, realism is controversial. There are epistemological problems connected with it — how can we obtain knowledge of a mind-independent world? There are also prior semantic problems — how are the links between our beliefs and the mind-independent states of affairs they allegedly represent set up? This is the Representation Problem.

Anti-realists deny the world is mind-independent. Believing the Representation Problem to be insoluble for realists, they conclude realism must be false. In this article I review a number of anti-realist semantic challenges to realism all based on the Representation Problem: (i) The Manifestation Challenge claims the cognitive and linguistic behaviour of an agent provides no evidence that realist mind/world links exist. (ii) The Language Acquisition Challenge claims that if such links were to exist language learning would be impossible. (iii) The Brain in a Vat Challenge holds that realism entails both that we could be massively deluded ("Brains in a Vat") and that if we were we could not even form the belief that we were. (iv) The Conceptual Relativity Challenge alleges it is senseless to ask what the world contains independently of how we conceive of it. The objects that exist depend on the conceptual scheme used to classify them. (v) The Model-Theoretic Challenge contends realist must either hold that an ideal theory passing every conceivable test could be false or that perfectly determinate terms like ‘cat’ are massively indeterminate. Both alternatives are absurd according to anti-realists.

I proceed by first defining realism, illustrating its distinctive mind-independence claim with some examples and distinguishing it from a doctrine with which it is often confused, factualism. I then outline the Representation Problem, saying why it is a problem for realism before presenting the anti-realist's semantic challenges to realism which are all based on it. I discuss realist responses to these challenges, indicating how the debates have proceeded, suggesting various alternatives on the way and countenancing anti-realist replies. I finish with my own evaluation of the problems facing realists and anti-realists and prospects for resolution.

1. What is Realism

Realism is the thesis that the objects, properties and relations the world contains exist independently of our thoughts about them or our perceptions of them. Anti-realists either doubt or deny the existence of the entities the realist believes in or else doubt or deny their independence from our conceptions of them.

Some of the metaphysical issues over which realism and anti-realism have locked horns are the following: Are there moral values? Are there abstract objects like numbers or points or spaces or symphonies or jokes? What about selves or souls or minds? Are there colours? What of after-images, pains and other sensations? Is the past real? What of the future? Are fictional characters real? Do muons and quarks and other theoretical entities exist?

These represent only a small sample of current realist/anti-realist debates about the existence of certain sorts of entities or properties. Similar questions could be and have been raised about the mind-independence of the disputed entities or properties.

For example, many think that colours are mind-dependent. That is, whilst they do not dispute the existence of things that are red, green, blue etc., they think that if no sentient creatures had ever evolved nothing would have been coloured. The tomato's redness is, if not in the eye of the perceiver, non-existent without it. Others deem moral values mind-dependent. Once more, they do not doubt the existence of moral values but instead question their independence from the mind, believing them instead to be psychological or social constructs of some sort or other.

An obvious problem with this characterization of realism is that it seems to make anti-realism about minds or experience obligatory! For the existence of minds is surely ‘mind-dependent’ and indeed it is in the sense that if there were no minds there'd be no minds and there'd be no experiences either.

This is not what is intended by the ‘mind-independence’ formulation, however. A realist about mental states or conscious experiences is one who holds that our world is a world containing creatures who are sometimes in states of believing, desiring, remembering, perceiving, etc. and that the world's containing (creatures who enjoy) such states is in no way dependent upon the ability of those creatures themselves to determine, either conceptually or perceptually, that it does. The world is as it is independently of what we think about it.

This characterization of realism is not universally accepted. Some anti-realists maintain that realism is committed to a distinctive (and tendentious) conception of truth [Compare Putnam 1981, 1985, 1992] or, more radically, that realism just is a thesis about the nature of truth - that truth can transcend the possibility of verification [Compare Dummett 1978, 1991, 1993].

These semantic formulations of realism are unacceptable to realists who are deflationists about truth [see the entry truth: deflationary theory of] however with the unfortunate consequence that many such realists tend to simply ignore the anti-realist's legitimate semantic challenges to their position. For deflationary theories of truth deny that truth is a substantive notion which can be used to characterise alternative metaphysical views.

Some examples may help to illustrate the mind-independence characterization. Most of us are realists about elephants. We believe the world contains elephants and that its containing them is in no way dependent upon our having perceived them or thought about them.

What about Yeti? Yeti realism is nowhere near as persuasive as pachyderm realism. Yes, there are lots of stories about large woolly ape-men hiding in the recesses of the Himalayas and occasionally interacting with humans (scaring them, mainly), but we're not sure what status to accord those stories. May be they are veridical observations of some enormous rare ape mistaken for an ‘ape- man’ or may be just erroneous observations of sociopaths in Yak coats? Alternatively, these supposed ‘sightings’ might simply be stories Tibetans tell their children.

If Yeti reports were to prove credible as reports and definite enough we might decide that we knew what it would take for a creature to be a Yeti and, after an exhaustive search, that the world contained no such creatures or admit, in the absence of any such search, that the world might well contain Yeti, and that whether it does or doesn't in no way depends upon our speculations on the matter.

We would be Eliminativists about Yeti if we decided that the world contained none, adopting an Error Theory towards the reports of Yeti, alleging some perceptual or other type of error behind them. We would be agnostic about Yeti if we decided that though the reports may be veridical and there may well be such creatures, there was as of now no good reason to believe there are any.

Suppose, on the other hand, that all we ever will have are the vague Yeti legends we now have. In that circumstance we might wonder whether the ‘sightings’ were even supposed to be reports. Perhaps the Yeti stories are like Santa Claus stories — not intended to be taken literally? Their function might be to chasten obstreperous Tibetan children just as Santa Claus stories function to reward good Western children — even though, naturally, both stories can only discharge their roles if the children mistakenly believe they are factual. If this was our assessment, we'd be taking a Non-Factualist attitude to Yeti stories. The function of such stories is not to describe reality.

Most of us are Eliminativists about Yeti. We think there aren't any. This is because we either think that the reports are erroneous or that the ‘sightings’ are not meant to be taken literally. Those who are agnostic about Yeti take a more charitable attitude to the reports — they think that the world may well contain the sort of creature described therein. This sounds pretty unlikely to most ears. That's why we're Yeti Eliminativists for the most part and not Yeti Agnostics.

One thing we don't think is that it would never be rational to believe any report of a Yeti. To the contrary. The discovery of some huge new hairy ape by a team of reputable scientists in roughly the right vicinity should certainly lead us to reassess our Non-Factualist attitudes to Yeti reports. Given the indeterminacy of our ‘Yeti specifications’, such a discovery would still leave it open whether the creature was a Yeti. A more temperate conclusion would be that it had spawned the (rather fanciful)Yeti stories.

What of a new hairy hominid? This could very plausibly be a Yeti since the stories all agree that the Yeti is an ape-man. Still we would need further information before rushing to claim it was. Perhaps this hominid had never been seen before its discovery by the scientists and the legends were all based on perceptual errors of the sort canvassed above? It would just be a fluke that this creature fitted the descriptions. Homo Himalayus might then be called ‘Yeti’ by the scientists as a way of paying deference to the legends, rather than vindicating their authenticity.

This provides a contrast with the anti-realist views to be discussed below. They do think that it would never be rational to believe in the existence of the mind-independent entities the realist believes in. No evidence could convince us that some entity existed mind-independently because the very idea of mind-independent existence is incoherent.

We should note, though, that metaphysical realism and scientific realism are distinct. That the world's constituents exist mind-independently does not entail that its constituents are as science portrays them to be. One might adopt an instrumentalist attitude to the theoretical entities posited by science, believing that whatever entities the world actually contains exist independently of our conceptions and perceptions of them.

2. Realism and Factualism

It is often claimed that realism is a thesis about discourses or theories — that the sentences in some discourse or theory are to be construed literally as fact-stating ones. This is factualism. It is often added that what these sentences state is largely true, although this is not a requirement of factualism per se.

It is a mistake to identify realism with factualism, however. The anti-realist views to be discussed below are factualist about the discourses describing certain contentious domains. What they contest is that the entities in these domains exist mind-independently as they find the notion of mind-independent existence incoherent.

Amongst views that generally accept the notion of mind-independent existence, a selective realism about Fs vies with selective eliminativism and agnosticism as answers to the question “Does the world contain Fs?” The realist says “Yes”, the eliminativist says “No”, the agnostic says “We can't say”. All three views agree that the existence of Fs in no way depends upon our ability to determine that they exist.

Some anti-realists agree that there are Fs but deny that anything could exist mind-independently. Unlike eliminativists and agnostics who accept it, they reject the notion of mind-independent existence. They are factualists about F discourse and anti-realist about Fs. However, such anti-realists differ from realists in their understanding of ‘Fs exist’ and, as a result, their interpretation of F discourse in general varies from that of the realist's.

Clearly, adopting a non-factualist or error-theoretic interpretation of discourse about Fs commits one to anti-realism about Fs. If we think Yeti reports are systematically mistaken or that such reports are not meant to be taken literally in the first place, we will deny that the world contains any Yetis. This means factualism is a necessary condition for realism.

It is not a sufficient condition though. Verificationists who reject the idea that something might exist even though we might never be able to confirm that it did, can be factualists about F discourse. Still, they are anti-realist about Fs since they deny that Fs could exist mind-independently.

Realism about a given class of entities may entail that discourse about them is factual but it certainly does not entail that most of our assertions concerning them are true. To the contrary, all our claims about the relevant domain could be mistaken. Consider mediaeval discourse about the cosmos. The mediaevals surely did believe that the cosmos was as it was, independently of what anyone thought about it. They were realists about the cosmos. Yet most of their beliefs were false, not true.

3. The Problem of Representation

Realism is a metaphysical thesis about what the world is like, what it contains. It is not a semantic thesis concerned with how humans represent the world in thought or language. How can it then be vulnerable to semantic challenge?

Quite simply. If the world is as resolutely mind-independent as the realist makes out, there is a problem about how we get to know about it in the first place. On what grounds can we trust our theories if they could all be radically mistaken? Wouldn't a truly mind-independent world make any representation of it in thought or language unreliable or even impossible? These are precisely the questions anti-realist urge in their various semantic challenges to realism.

Realists do think, in the main, that we are able to represent the world reliably. Scientific realists think science is the best representation that we have of what the world is like and that its representations correspond pretty closely to the way things actually are. Yet it is crucial to their position that even our best scientific theories — General Relativity, Quantum Theory, Theory of Evolution etc. — could be radically mistaken. Be that as it may, when scientists talk about muons and quarks, gravitational constants, entropy, quantum fluctuations, the curvature of space-time etc. they are not just exploiting some useful linguistic devices for organizing their observational data, they are telling us what the world contains, independently of what anyone might think it contains, according to scientific realists.

For the scientist's representations of the world to be reliable, there must be a correlation between these representations and the states of affairs which they portray. So the cosmologist who utters the statement ‘The entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low’ has uttered a truth if and only if the entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low.

A natural question to ask is how the correlation between the statement and the mind-independent state of affairs which makes it true is supposed to be set up. How does it come about that the word ‘entropy’ refers to the amount of disorder in a system, that the descriptive name ‘The Big Bang’ refers to the event with which the Universe began? Is it that the shock waves of that cataclysmic event continue to reverberate some sixteen billion years later in human minds, dislodging a mental symbol as if it were a loose tooth, and that this mental symbol refers to whatever it was that shook it free? Clearly not. How then does that mental symbol get to refer to the Big Bang?

The only plausible answer has to do with us as cognitive beings. It is something about the way we use our words or deploy our mental symbols in thought and action which effects this correlation between mental symbol and worldly referent.

Suppose this is not so. Assume instead that God or Nature has solved this problem for us. God or Nature has set up just the right connections between our mental symbols and the bits of the world which we take ourselves to be referring to in thought.

Still we face the problem not only of finding evidence that this has occurred, but also, and more importantly, of how this has come to be. Yet it seems the relevant evidence will be just what it was if God or Nature had not been so obliging — linguistically, it will be the use speakers make of their words, the statements they endorse and the statements they dissent from, the rationalizations they provide for their actions, their defence and explanations of their views and criticisms of opposing views etc.; cognitively, it will be the functional role of mental symbols in thought, perception, language learning etc.

4. The Semantic Challenges to Realism

4.1 Manifestation

The first anti-realist challenge to consider focuses on the use we make of our words and sentences. The challenge is simply this: what aspect of our linguistic use could provide the necessary evidence for the realist's correlation between sentences and mind-independent states of affairs? Which aspects of our semantic behaviour manifest our grasp of these correlations, assuming they do hold?

When we look at how speakers actually do use their sentences, anti-realists claim, we see them responding not to states of affairs that they cannot in general detect but rather to agreed upon conditions for asserting these sentences. Scientists assert ‘The entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low’ because they all concur that the conditions justifying this assertion have been met.

What prompts us to use our sentences in the way that we do are the public justification conditions associated with those sentences, justification conditions forged in linguistic practices which imbue these sentences with meaning.

The realist believes we are able to mentally represent mind-independent states of affairs. But what of cases where everything that we know about the world leaves it unsettled whether the relevant state of affairs obtains? Did Socrates sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock or did he not? How could we possibly find out? Yet realists hold that the sentence ‘Socrates sneezed in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock’ will be true if Socrates did sneeze then and false if he did not and that this is a significant semantic fact.

The Manifestation challenge to realism is to isolate some feature of the use agents make of their words or their mental symbols which effects the link between mind-independent states of affairs and the thoughts and sentences that represent them. Nothing in the thinker's linguistic behaviour, according to the anti-realist, provides evidence that this link has been forged since linguistic use is keyed to public assertibility conditions, not undetectable truth- conditions. In those cases, such as the Socrates one, where we cannot find out whether the truth-condition is satisfied or not, it is simply gratuitous to believe that there is anything we can think or say or do which could provide evidence that the link has been set up in the first place. So the anti-realist claims. [Compare Dummett 1978, 1991, 1993 Tennant 1997; Wright 1993.]

Why should we expect the evidence to be behavioural rather than, say, neurophysiological? The reason anti-realists give is that the meanings of our word and (derivatively for them) the contents of our thoughts are essentially communicable and thus must be open for all speakers and thinkers to see [Dummett 1978, 1993]

An interesting question arises as to whether our linguistic dispositions suffice to determine what we mean by our words. Saul Kripke has argued, on behalf of Wittgenstein, that the answer to this is ‘No’ — that there are simply no facts that correspond to one's meaning Yeti by the word ‘Yeti’ irrespective of whether these facts are restricted to the behavioural. The resultant meaning scepticism has been argued by some to lead to a very radical global anti-realism which is dubiously coherent [Boghossian 1989, Wright 1984].

4.2 Language Acquisition

The second challenge to be considered concerns our acquisition of language. Suppose God had linked our mental representations to just the right states of affairs in the way required by the realist. If so, this is a semantically significant fact. Anyone learning their native language would have to grasp these correspondences between sentences and states of affairs. How can they do this if even the competent speakers whom they seek to emulate cannot detect when these correspondences hold? In short, competence in one's language would be impossible to acquire if realism were true. [Compare Dummett 1978, 1993; Wright 1993.]

4.3 Brains in a Vat?

States of affairs that are truly mind-independent go hand in glove with radical scepticism. The sceptic contends that for all we could tell we could be Brains in a Vat — brains kept alive in a bath of nutrients by mad alien scientists. All our thoughts, all our experience, all that passed for science would be systematically mistaken if we were. We'd have no bodies although we thought we did, the world would contain no physical objects, yet it would seem to us that it did, there'd be no Earth, no Sun, no vast universe, only the brain's deluded representations of such. At least this could be the case if our representations derived even part of their content from links with mind-independent objects and states of affairs. Since realism implies such an absurd possibility could hold without our being able to detect it, it has to be rejected according to anti- realists.

A much stronger anti-realist argument uses the Brain in a Vat hypothesis to show that realism is internally incoherent rather than, as before, simply false. A crucial assumption of the argument is Semantic Externalism — the thesis that the reference of our words and mental symbols is partially determined by contingent relations between thinkers and the world. This is a semantic assumption many realists independently endorse.

Given Semantic Externalism, the argument proceeds by claiming that if we were brains in a vat we could not possibly have the thought that we were. For, if we were so envatted, we could not possibly mean by ‘brain’ and ‘vat’ what unenvatted folk mean by these words since our words would be connected only to neural impulses or images in our brains where the unenvatteds' words are connected to real-life brains and real-life vats. Similarly the thought we pondered whenever we posed the question ‘Am I a Brain in a Vat?’ could not possibly be the thought unenvatted folk pose when they ask themselves the same- sounding question in English. But realism entails that we could indeed be Brains in a Vat. As we have just shown that were we to be so, we could not even entertain this as a possibility, realism is incoherent. [Compare Putnam 1981.]

4.4 Conceptual Relativity

If the notion of mind-independent existence is incoherent, as anti-realists contend, what should we put in its stead? Berkeley famously answered “Mind-dependent existence!” where the Mind in question, for the good Bishop, was, of course, the Mind of God. Modern anti-realists tend not to be theists and tend not to relativize existence to any single mind. Instead of God they posit conceptual schemes as that on which the notion of existence depends. To that extent they follow Kant rather than Berkeley, though unlike Kant they tend to be pluralists — it is conceptual schemes which they endorse rather than The One Conceptual Scheme which Kant held to be obligatory for all rational creatures.

According to this view, there can no more be an answer to the question “What objects and properties does the world contain?” outside of some scheme for classifying entities than there can be an answer to the question of whether two events A and B are simultaneous outside of some inertial frame for dating those events. The objects which exist are the objects some conceptual scheme says exists. ‘mesons exist’ really means ‘mesons exist relative to the conceptual scheme of current physics’.

Realists think there is a unitary sense of ‘object’, ‘property’ etc. for which the question ‘What objects and properties does the world contain?’ makes sense. Any answer which succeeded in listing all the objects, properties, events etc. which the world contains would comprise a privileged description of that totality. Anti-realists reject this. For them ‘object’, ‘property’ etc. shift their senses as we move from one conceptual scheme to another. Some anti-realists argue that there cannot be a totality of all the objects the world contains since the notion of ‘object’ is indefinitely extensible and so, trivially, there cannot be a privileged description of any such totality.

How does the anti-realist defend conceptual relativity? By arguing that there can be two complete theories of the world which are descriptively equivalent yet logically incompatible from the realist's point of view. For example theories of space-time can be formulated in one of two mathematically equivalent ways: either with an ontology of points, spatiotemporal regions being defined as sets of points or with an ontology of regions, points being defined as convergent sets of regions. Such theories are descriptively equivalent since mathematically equivalent and yet are logically incompatible from the realist's point of view, anti-realists contend. [Compare Putnam 1985, 1990.]

4.5 The Model-Theoretic Argument

This is the most technical of the arguments we have so far considered although we shall not reproduce the technicalities here - the central ideas can be conveyed informally, although some technical concepts will be mentioned where necessary. The argument purports to show that the Problem of Representation introduced before is insoluble for realists. That problem, to recall, was to explain how our mental symbols and words get hooked up to mind-independent objects and how our sentences and thoughts target mind-independent states of affairs.

According to the Model-Theoretic Argument, there are simply too many ways in which our mental symbols can be mapped onto items in the world. A consequence of this is that realists must either accept massive indeterminacy in what our symbols refer to or insist dogmatically that even an ideal theory, whose terms and predicates can demonstrably be mapped onto objects and properties of some sort in the world so as to make its theses come out true might still be false, i.e. that such a mapping might not be the right one, the one ‘intended’.

Neither alternative can be defended, according to anti-realists. Massive indeterminacy in perfectly determinate terms is absurd, whilst for realists to contend that even an ideal theory could be false is to resort to dogmatism, since on their own admission we cannot tell which mapping the world has set up for us. Such dogmatism leaves the realist with no answer to a scepticism which undermines any capacity to reliably represent the world, anti-realists maintain.

Why can't an ideal theory be false? To admit that this is possible is to admit that there is a gap between what is true and what is ideally warranted by our best theory, something no anti-realist can afford to do. But an argument is needed to show this is not possible.

Anti-realists have one in the Model-Theoretic Argument. It proceeds thus: We imagine that we have an ideal theory T which passes every observational and theoretical test we can conceive of. Assume we can formalize T in first order logic. Assume also that the world is infinite in size and that our formal theory T is consistent. Then by the Completeness Theorem for first order logic, T will have a model M of the same size as the world (since by that theorem T will have models of every infinite size). Match up the objects in the model M one to one with the objects the world contains and use this mapping to define the relations of M directly in the world. We now have a correspondence between the expressions of the language L in which T is expressed and (sets of) objects in the world. T will then be true if ‘true’ just means ‘true-in-M’.

If T is not guaranteed true by this procedure it can only be because M is not the intended model. Yet all our observation sentences come out true according to M and the theoretical constraints must be satisfied because T's theses all come out true in M also. So the realist owes us an explanation of what constraints a model has to satisfy for it to be ‘intended’ over and above its satisfying every observational and theoretical constraint we can conceive of. Suppose on the other hand that the realist is able to somehow specify the intended model. Call this model M*. Then nothing the realist can do can possibly distinguish M* from a permuted variant P which can be specified following Putnam 1994b, 356-357:

We define properties of being a cat* and being a mat* such that:
  1. In the actual world cherries are cats* and trees are mats*
  2. In every possible world the two sentences “A cat is on a mat” and “A cat* is on a mat*” have precisely the same truth value.

Instead of considering two sentences “A cat is on a mat” and “A cat* is on a mat*” now consider only the one "A cat is on a mat", allowing its interpretation to change by first adopting the standard interpretation for it and then adopting the non-standard interpretation in which the set of cats* are assigned to ’cat’ in every possible world and the set of mats* are assigned to ’mat’ in every possible world. The result will be the truth-value of “A cat is on a mat” will not change and will be exactly the same as before in every possible world. Similar non-standard reference assignments could be constructed for all the predicates of a language. [Compare Putnam 1985, 1994b.]

5. Realist Responses

We now turn to some realist responses to these challenges. The Manifestation and Language Acquisition challenges allege there is nothing in an agent's cognitive or linguistic behaviour that could provide evidence that they had grasped what it was for a sentence to be true in the realist's sense of ‘true’. How can you manifest a grasp of a notion which can apply or fail to apply without you being able to tell which? How could you ever learn to use such a concept?

One possible realist response is that the concept of truth is actually a very simple one and the demand that one always be able to determine whether a concept applies or fails to apply spurious. As to the first part, it is often argued that all there is to the notion of truth is what is given by the formula “‘p’ is true if and only if p”. The function of the truth-predicate is to disquote sentences in the sense of undoing the effects of quotation — thus all that one is saying in calling the sentence ‘Yeti are vicious’ true is that Yeti are vicious.

It is not clear that this response really addresses the anti-realist's worry, however. It may well be that there is a simple algorithm for learning the meaning of ‘true’ and that, consequently, there is no special difficulty in learning to apply the concept. But that by itself does not tell us whether the predicate ‘true’ applies to cases where we cannot ascertain that it does. All the algorithm tells us, in effect, is that if it is legitimate to assert p it is legitimate to assert that ‘p ‘ is true. So are we entitled to assert ‘Either Socrates did or did not sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock’ or are we not? Presumably that will depend on what we mean by the sentence, whether we mean to be adverting to two states of affairs neither of which we have any prospect of ever confirming.

Anti-realists follow verificationists in rejecting the intelligibility of such states of affairs and tend to model their rules for assertion on intuitionistic logic which rejects the universal applicability of the Law of Bivalence, the principle that every statement is either true or false. This law is a foundational semantic principle for classical logic.

As to the analogy with vagueness, this is a little more involved. If one accepts the Epistemic conception of vagueness then one will hold that a ‘penumbral’ case of red could indeed be red even though we could not in principle determine that it was. Since this is precisely how the realist thinks of truth, as applying or not independently of our capacity to determine this, the analogy would be apt. But the Epistemic theory of vagueness is highly controversial and other theories of vagueness deny that borderline red surfaces must either be red or not. Perhaps the realist could then link the two theories, claiming that since there is no incoherence in the Epistemic interpretation of vagueness, there is no incoherence in the realist notion of truth? Predictably, though, the anti- realist will reply that if these two theories really must stand or fall together, then they fall together.

A more direct realist response to the Manifestation challenge points to the prevalence in our linguistic practices of realist-inspired beliefs which we give expression to in what we say and do. The fact is that we do assert things like ‘Elephants exist independently of what anyone believes’ and all our actions and other assertions confirm that we really do believe this. For example, we all agree that even if humans had never evolved on this planet the world could still have contained elephants. Furthermore, the overwhelming acceptance of classical logic by mathematicians and scientists and their rejection of intuitionistic logic for the purposes of mainstream science provides very good evidence for the coherence and usefulness of a distinctively realist understanding of truth.

Anti-realists reject this reply. They argue that all we make manifest by asserting things like ‘Either Socrates sneezed in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock or else he didn't’ is our pervasive misunderstanding of the notion of truth. They apply the same diagnosis to our belief in the mind- independence of elephants and to the counterfactual above which expresses this belief. We overgeneralize the notion of truth, believing that it applies in cases where it does not. A consequence of their view is that reality is indeterminate in surprising ways — we have no grounds for asserting that Socrates did sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock and no grounds for asserting that he did not and no prospect of ever finding out which. Does this mean that for anti-realist the world contains no such fact as the fact that Socrates did one or the other of these two things? Not necessarily. For anti-realists who subscribe to intuitionistic principles of reasoning, the most that can be said is that there is no present warrant to assert that Socrates either did or did not sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock.

Perhaps anti-realists are right about all this. But if so, they need to explain how a practice based on a pervasive illusion can be as successful as modern science is. The fact is that anti-realists perturbed by the manifestability of realist truth are revisionists about parts of our linguistic practice and the consequence of this revisionist stance is that mathematics and science require extensive and non-trivial revision.

Much could be and has been said by anti-realists in response to this point. Standing back from the debate between the two sides is not always easy but at least this point should be made. Nothing said so far solves the Representation Problem, the problem of how our mental symbols get to target mind-independent entities in the first place, let alone the right ones. Some natural mechanism for effecting the right links must be at work for it cannot just be a primitive inexplicable fact that ‘The Big Bang’ refers to the Big Bang. If this problem could be solved, the Manifestation and Acquisition challenges would, presumably, be answered. It is, of course, the burden of the other anti-realist challenges to show that the realist cannot solve the Representation Problem.

5.1 Brains in a Vat

Realists who are naturalistic in their thinking are perhaps better placed than others to respond to this particular challenge. Recall that the Brain in a Vat argument purports to show that realism is incoherent on the grounds that it is both committed to the genuine possibility of our being Brains in a Vat and yet entails something inconsistent with this: namely, that were we to be so envatted we could not possibly have the thought that we were!

Realists have two obvious responses. They may either forswear commitment to Brains in a Vat or else deny the Semantic Externalism which allegedly implies we could not think that we were Brains in a Vat were we to be so.

Naturalistic realists do question the coherence of the very idea of our being Brains in a Vat. For them there is no external vantage point from which one can assess our best overall theory and yet the sceptic's hypothesis feigns to occupy just such a vantage point. How so? By using terms which derive their meaning from successful theory to pose a problem which, if intelligible, would rob those very terms of meaning. In a similar vein some naturalistic realists have claimed that the mad scientists face an insoluble problem of combinatorial explosion the moment they give you any significant exploratory and volitional powers in the virtual world in which you are imprisoned.

As to the latter, it may be that the clever alien scientists have generated a convincing illusion of significant exploratory and volitional powers in the mind of the poor envatted Brain. Whether the sceptic's prospect is intelligible only at the cost of robbing the very terms in which it is framed of meaning is much more difficult to assess, however.

What of denying Semantic Externalism? Is this really a live option for realists? The answer is ‘Yes’. There are many realists who think the Representation Problem is just a pseudo-problem. When we say things like “’cat’ refers to cats” or “’quark’ refers to quarks” we are simply registering our dispositions to call everything we consider sufficiently cat-like/quark-like, ‘cat’/’quark’. According to these Semantic Deflationists, it is just a confusion to ask how the link was set up between our use of ‘The Big Bang’ and the event of that name which occurred some sixteen billion years ago. Some naturalistic story can, presumably, be told about how creatures like us developed the linguistic dispositions we did, in the telling of which it will emerge how we come to assert things like ‘The entropy of the Big Bang was very low’.

It is a moot question whether Semantic Deflationism really dissolves the Representation Problem or merely refuses to face up to it, though. However the story about the origins of our linguistic dispositions is told, it had better be that our utterances of ‘The entropy of the Big Bang was very low’ somehow end up evincing just the right sort of differential sensitivity to the Big Bang's having low entropy. For if all there is to the story are our linguistic dispositions and the conditions to which they are presently attuned, the case has effectively been ceded to the anti-realist who denies it is possible to set up a correlation between our utterances or thoughts and the mind-independent states of affairs which uniquely make them true.

A different response questions the implementation of Externalist constraints in the argument. It may well be that if we were Brains in a Vat we could not express the thought the unenvatted express when they say ‘we might be Brains in a Vat’ but this does not prove this thought is inexpressible tout court for such a Brain. Perhaps the Brain can contemplate the possibility of its own incarceration using some sophisticated indirect theoretical reasoning?

Realists in general see it as a fatal weakness of anti-realism that it does not permit fallible, finite creatures to be radically mistaken in the beliefs they form about the world. Many realists favourably disposed to Semanic Externalism do wish to hold both that we could indeed be Brains in a Vat and that even so we could form the conjecture that we were. Of course the burden of proof is then placed on the realist to show how, compatibly with Externalism, the Brains can become aware of the possibility that they are envatted.

Realists influenced by Saul Kripke's views on metaphysics and epistemology might wish to argue that we do in fact know a priori that we are not brains in a vat. However, this is not because it is incoherent to suppose that we are. To the contrary, since we could have been brains in a vat the speculation that we in fact are is perfectly coherent. It is simply false. That we are not brains in a vat is thus a contingent a priori truth for such realists who see the brain-in-the-vat argument as conflating epistemological questions of what can be known a priori with metaphysical questions as to what is and is not genuinely possible. This response is all well and good provided we really can know a priori that we are not brains in a vat. Yet it is difficult to shake the doubt that we can know any such thing a priori - isn't it merely a better explanation of the actual course of our experience that we are not envatted?

At least this should be said. The anti-realists who reject the sceptic's thesis as unintelligible are not alone in doing this. Naturalistic realists often do as well. However, a demonstration that anti-realism alone can justifiably reject scepticism would be a very powerful point in its favour.

Yet it has to be said that the reasons anti-realists have so far offered for thinking they alone can confute the sceptic are not fully convincing. Either they give the hypothesis that I am a Brain in a Vat the same short shrift some naturalistic realists do, though for different reasons (having to do with the lack of assertibility conditions for the sentence ‘I am a Brain in a Vat’) or else they attempt to show that if I were a Brain in a Vat I'd be able to deduce that I am not since my utterances of ‘I am a Brain in a Vat’ would come out uniformly untrue. In the latter case, even if the conclusion is sustained by the reasoning (which is highly debatable) it is open to the realist to endorse it. So there is no ground at present for thinking that anti-realism alone can stave off radical scepticism as unintelligible.

Of course, anti-realists do not need to reject radical scepticism as unintelligible. They might join Kripkean realists in claiming that we know a priori that the brain-in-the-vat hypothesis is false.

5.2 Conceptual Relativity

To the extent that it seems to make the existence of all things relative to the classificatory skills of minds, the thesis of conceptual relativity looks highly counter-intuitive. Whilst it may be quite plausible to think that colours or moral values might disappear with the extinction of sentient life on Earth, it is not at all plausible to think that pachyderms and Yetis (if there are any) let alone trees, rocks and microbes would follow in their train! If our intuitions are anything to go by, then, the idea of conceptual relativity looks highly suspect.

Kant had a story to tell about why these intuitions were unreliable. This had to do with his distinction between empirical realism and transcendental idealism. According to the latter, our knowledge of what exists is nothing other than knowledge of how various objects appear to us. Of necessity, the knowing mind cannot reach behind those appearances to how things are in themselves.

Dividing Kant's One True Conceptual Scheme into The Many suggested by modern anti-realists need not alter the basic distinction between how things are and how knowing minds represent them — unless, of course, that distinction is itself questionable. In fact, many anti-realists do reject any such division, finding the whole idea of our being able to factor our knowledge of the world into separable contributions made by representational scheme and represented reality, quite objectionable. To them, Kant's problem with ‘noumena’ stems from a lingering, unrecognized attachment to realist metaphysics.

To the realist who complains that elephants would not cease to exist if humans vanished from the planet, the anti-realist should reply “Of course not!” To the contrary we accept a theory which licenses us to assert ‘Elephants exist’ and also licenses us to assert ‘If humans were to disappear from this planet, elephants need not follow in their train’ since the theory assures us that the existence of elephants in no way causally depends on the existence of humans. For the anti-realist the true picture is that our well-founded practices of assertion ground at one and the same time our conception of the world and our conception of humanity's place within it.

Realists are unlikely to be satisfied with this response, however. The worry is not so much that elephants might disappear, along with the rest of the mind- dependent world, with some plague that wiped out humanity but rather that whether there are to be any pachyderms in the first place apparently depends upon the conceptual schemes humans happen to chance upon! The relativity of existence to conceptual scheme is, in this respect, quite unlike the relativity of simultaneity to frame of reference.

Still, we have actual instances of conceptual schemes which explain the same phenomena equally well yet which are logically incompatible from the realist's point of view, anti-realists maintain. The earlier example of competing theories of space-time was a case in point. Recall that according to the first theory space-time consists of unextended spatiotemporal points and regions of space- time were to be explained as sets of these points whilst according to the second space-time consists of extended spatiotemporal regions and points were merely logical constructions, identifiable with convergent sets of regions.

In order to assess such examples we need a criterion of descriptive equivalence. Anti-realists have suggested that two theories are descriptively equivalent if each theory can be interpreted in the other and both theories explain the same phenomena.

Realists reject the anti-realist claim that there are two descriptively equivalent logically incompatible theories in cases such as the space-time one. Within the context of the relative interpretation of the one theory within the other, all the two alternative constructions of points in terms of regions and regions in terms of points actually show, the realist will say, is that there is a systematic way of assigning a point space to a region space and vice versa.

Anti-realist respond that the two theories really are incompatible since the region theory denies that points are physical entities. It is very hard to see how the region theory and the point theory can be both descriptively equivalent and logically incompatible, however. For if we restrict ourselves to the topology of space-time the punctate and the region theory are descriptively equivanlent in the sense that each can be translated into the other: points as convergent sets of regions, regions as sets of points. So it is hard to see how the two theories can be logically incompatible topologically.

Differences do emerge over the contents of space-time: the properties, relations and functions definable on space or time. For punctate theories may contain details that are not duplicated in the region theories: at the stroke of midnight Cinderella's carriage changes into a pumpkin - it is a carriage up to midnight, a pumpkin thereafter. According to the region-based theory which takes temporal intervals as its primitives, that's all there is to it. But if there are temporal points, instants, there is a further fact left undecided by the story so far - viz, at the moment of midnight is the carriage still a carriage or is it a pumpkin?

So does the region-based theory fail to recognize certain facts or are these putative facts merely artefacts of the punctate theory's descriptive resources, reflecting nothing in reality? We cannot declare the two theories descriptively equivalent until we resolve this question at least.

In general, then, realists either dismiss cases of apparent logical incompatibility between two descriptively equivalent rival theories as merely apparent or question the descriptive equivalence of the two theories. It is worth noting that there is an interesting parallel between realist/anti-realist debates about the nature of conceptual norms and factualist/non-factualist debates in meta-ethics about the nature of moral norms (see Khlentzos 2004).

5.3 The Model Theoretic Argument

If realism is to be tenable at all, it must be possible for even our best theories to be mistaken. So realists must reject the Model-Theoretic Argument which purports to show that this is not possible. Realists have responded to the argument by rejecting the claim that a model M of the hypothetical ideal theory T passes every theoretical constraint simply because all of the theory's theses come out true in it. For there is no guarantee, they claim, that terms stand in the right relation of reference to the objects to which M links them. To be sure, if we impose a ‘right reference constraint’ as another theoretical constraint, M (or some model based on it) can interpret this constraint in such a way as to make it come out true. But there is a difference between a model's making some description of a constraint come out true and its actually conforming to that constraint, realists insist.

For their part, anti-realists have taken realist's insistence on a right reference constraint to be ‘just more theory’. This is understandable since from their point of view what it is for a model to conform to a constraint C is for us to be justified in asserting that it does. Unfortunately, this has led to something of a stand-off. Realists think that anti-realists are refusing to acknowledge a clear and important distinction. Anti-realists think that realists are simply falling back on dogmatism at a crucial point in the argument.

Many have concluded from the apparent stalemate that this particular debate is dialectically intractable — one either sides with the realists or the anti- realists, depending on whether one thinks of truth as the realist does or as the anti-realist does. This conclusion, which would put the argument beyond the pale of rational appraisal, is a little premature, though. There are ways of explaining and illustrating the crucial issues concerning constraint satisfaction that are intelligible to anti-realists, ways which do not appeal to any verification-transcendent notions.

The Permutation Argument presents a genuine challenge to any realist who believes in determinate reference. But it does not refute realism unless realism is committed to determinate reference in the first place and it is not at all obvious that a belief in the mind-independence of reality does commit the realist to determinate reference. Realist responses to this argument vary widely. At one extreme are the ‘determinatists’, those who believe that Nature has set up significant, determinate referential connections between our mental symbols and items in the world. They contend that all the argument shows is that the distribution of truth-values across possible worlds is not sufficient to determine reference.

At another extreme are ‘indeterminatists’, realists who concede the conclusion, agreeing that it demonstrates that word-world reference is massively indeterminate or ‘inscrutable’. Some infer from this that reference could not possibly consist in correspondences between mental symbols and objects in the world. For them all that makes ‘elephant’ refer to elephants is that our language contains the word ‘elephant’. This is Deflationism about reference.

In between these two extremes are those prepared to concede the argument establishes the real possibility of significant and surprising indeterminacy in the reference of our mental symbols but who take it to be an open question whether other constraints can be found which pare down the range of reference assignments to just the intuitively acceptable ones. On this view ‘elephant’ may partially refer to elephants according to one acceptable reference assignment and may partially refer to elephant-stages or undetached elephant parts according to other such assignments, but not refer, even partially, to quolls or quarks.

6. Summary

We have considered a number of semantic challenges to realism, the thesis that the objects and properties that the world contains exist independently of our conception or perception of them. On all fronts, debate between realists and their anti-realist opponents is still very much open (see Khlentzos 2004). If realists could provide a plausible theory about how correspondences between mental symbols and the items in the world to which they refer might be set up, many of these challenges could be met. Alternatively, if they could explain how, consistently with our knowledge of a mind-independent world, no such correspondences are required to begin with, many of the anti-realist objections would fall away as irrelevant. In the absence of such explanations it is still entirely reasonable for realists to believe that the correspondences are in place, however, and there can, indeed, be very good evidence for believing this. Ignorance of Nature's reference-fixing mechanism is no reason for denying it exists.

For their part, anti-realists themselves need to say more than they have so far said about how mental and semantic content is grounded in linguistic and cognitive practice. It is not obvious that they have any satisfactory answer to their own Representation Problem — how are correlations between mental symbols and mind-dependent objects set up? Merely gesturing in the direction of accepted practices for asserting sentences is no satisfactory answer to this question if it is simply assumed that the asserted sentences have determinate meanings. How does human intervention succeed where Nature fails?


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

mental representation | truth | truth: coherence theory of | truth: deflationary theory of


Thanks to Peter Forrest, Peter Roeper and a subject editor for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.